Early Philosophical Interpretations of General Relativity

First published Wed Nov 28, 2001; substantive revision Wed Mar 7, 2018

Early philosophical interpretations of the general theory of relativity selected distinct aspects of that theory for favored recognition. Followers of Mach initially lauded Einstein’s attempt to implement a “relativization of inertia” in the general theory, but ultimately were more comfortable with Einstein’s operationalist treatment of the concept of distant simultaneity in the special theory. Kantians and neo-Kantians, if freed from strict fealty to the doctrines of the Transcendental Aesthetic and Transcendental Analytic, pointed to the surpassing importance of certain synthetic “intellectual forms” in the general theory, above all, the principle of general covariance. To an emerging logical empiricism, the philosophical significance of relativity theory was above all methodological, that conventions must first be laid down in order to express the empirical content of a physical theory. In a more far reaching development, already by its completion in November 1915, attempts were made to extend general relativity’s geometrization of gravitational force to non-gravitational interactions, in particular, to electromagnetism. Among these, that of Weyl, and shortly thereafter of Eddington, may be distinguished from others, in particular from Einstein’s many subsequent proposals. Weyl and Eddington aimed not only at a unified field theory, in the sense of a classical field theory in which all fundamental interactions are described by objects of spacetime geometry, but also at reconstructing gravitation and electromagnetism from the epistemological standpoint of a refurbished transcendental idealism.

1. The Search for Philosophical Novelty

Extraordinary public clamor greeted an announcement of the joint meeting of the Royal Society of London and the Royal Astronomical Society on the sixth of November 1919. Astronomical observations made by a British team during the solar eclipse on May 29 comprised the first empirical test of Einstein’s general theory of relativity. Lengthy data analysis of the observations over the summer had shown that within acceptable margin of error, light from distant stars passing near the solar surface was displaced by the tiny amount (1.75 arcseconds, corresponding to the angle of a right triangle of height 1 inch and base nearly 2 miles in length) predicted by Einstein’s gravitational theory of curved spacetime. By dint of having “overthrown” such a permanent fixture of the cognitive landscape as Newtonian gravitational theory, the general theory of relativity at once became a principal focus of philosophical interest and inquiry. Although some physicists and philosophers initially opposed it, mostly on non-physical grounds, surveyed here are the principal philosophical interpretations of those accepting the theory as a revolutionary advance in physical knowledge. Even so, these include positions ill-informed as to the mathematics and physics of the theory. Further lack of clarity stemmed from the scientific literati who provided differing, and at times, conflicting mathematical or physical accounts of the theory’s fundamental principles. These are (see below): the principles of equivalence and of what Einstein misleadingly termed “general relativity” (i.e., general covariance), and finally one he baptized as Mach’s Principle, of the complete relativization of inertia. In one or another form, these controversies have largely continued into the present literature of physics and philosophy of physics (see, e.g., Stachel 1980; Friedman 1983; Norton 1993; Barbour & Pfister 1995; Ohanian 2008; Janssen 2014; Ryckman 2017). This is not unusual: physical theories, if sufficiently robust, are rarely, if ever, without unambiguous or unproblematic aspects, and are often taken to say different things at different stages of development. But the very fluidity of physical and mathematical meaning lent interpretative latitude for inherently antagonistic philosophical viewpoints seeking vindication, confirmation or illumination by the revolutionary new theory. Perhaps only semi-facetiously, Bertrand Russell observed that

There has been a tendency, not uncommon in the case of a new scientific theory, for every philosopher to interpret the work of Einstein in accordance with his own metaphysical system, and to suggest that the outcome is a great accession of strength to the views which the philosopher in question previously held. This cannot be true in all cases; and it may be hoped that it is true in none. It would be disappointing if so fundamental a change as Einstein has introduced involved no philosophical novelty. (1926: 331)

It cannot be denied that general relativity proved a considerable stimulus to philosophical novelty. But then the question whether it particularly supported any one line of philosophical interpretation over another must take into account the fact that schools of interpretation in turn evolved to accommodate what were regarded as general relativity’s philosophically salient features. A classic instance is the assertion, to become a cornerstone of logical empiricism, that relativity theory had shown the untenability of any “philosophy of the synthetic a priori”, despite the fact that early works on relativity theory by both Hans Reichenbach and Rudolf Carnap were written from within that broad perspective. It will be seen that, however ideologically useful, the claim by no means follows from relativity theory although, as physicist Max von Laue noted in his early text on general relativity (1921: 42), “not every sentence of The Critique of Pure Reason” might still be held intact. What does follow from scrutiny of the various philosophical appropriations of general relativity is a consummate illustration that, due to the evolution and mutual interplay of physical, mathematical and philosophical understandings of a revolutionary physical theory, philosophical interpretations often are works in progress, extending over many years.

2. Machian Positivism

2.1 In the Early Einstein

Most of Einstein’s early papers (1902–1911) prior to his nearly exclusive concentration on a relativitistic theory of gravitation (1909–1915) are devoted not to the theory of relativity but with problems posed to classical physics by Planck’s discovery of his eponymous energy constant in 1900. These early works reveal Einstein to be a strong supporter of Ludwig Boltzmann rather than Ernst Mach in the debate over atomism at the turn of the century (Ryckman 2017: chapter 3). Yet in 1912, Einstein’s name together with those of Göttingen mathematicians David Hilbert and Felix Klein, was prominently displayed (in the Naturwissenschaftliche Rundschau 27: 336) among those joining Mach’s in a call for the formation of a “Society for Positivist Philosophy”. Citing the pressing need of science “but also of our age in general” for a “comprehensive world view based on the material facts accumulated in the individual sciences”, the appeal appears above all to have been an orchestrated attempt to buttress Mach’s positivist conception of science in the face of recent criticisms by Max Planck, then Germany’s leading theoretical physicist. More a declaration of allegiance than an act of scholarly neutrality, it provides evidence of Einstein’s youthful enthusiasm for at least certain of Mach’s writings. Late in life (1949a: 21), Einstein wrote of the “profound influence” that Mach’s Science of Mechanics (1883) exercised upon him as a student as well as of the very great influence in his younger years of “Mach’s epistemological position”. Already in the special theory of relativity (1905), Einstein’s operational definition of the “simultaneity” of distantly separated events, whereby distant clocks are synchronized by sending and receiving light signals, is closely modeled on the operational definition of mass in Mach’s Mechanics. Moreover, occasional epistemological and methodological pronouncements seem to indicate agreement with core parts of Mach’s positivist doctrine of meaningfulness, e.g., “The concept does not exist for the physicist until he has the possibility of discovering whether or not it is fulfilled in an actual case” (1917a [1955: 22]). Thus the general theory of relativity might be seen as fully compliant with Mach’s characterization of theoretical concepts as merely economical shorthand for concrete observations or operations.

2.2 A “Relativization of Inertia”?

Machian influences specific to the general theory of relativity appeared even more extensive. Mach’s idée fixe, that a body’s inertial mass and motion result from the influence of all other surrounding masses (thus eliminating the “monstrous” Newtonian concept of absolute space), was perhaps the strongest motivation guiding Einstein’s pursuit of a relativistic theory of gravity. In papers leading up to the definitive presentation of the general theory of relativity in 1916, Einstein made no secret of the fact that Mach was the inspiration for an epistemologically mandated attempt to generalize the principle of relativity. Holding, with Mach, that no observable facts could be associated with the notions of absolute acceleration or absolute inertia (i.e., resistance to acceleration), the generalization required that the laws of nature be completely independent of the state of motion of any chosen reference system. In fact, in striving to completely relativize inertia, Einstein conflated a valid principle of form invariance of the laws of nature (general covariance, see below) with a spurious “principle of general relativity”, according to which accelerated motions like rotations would be relative to an observer’s state of motion. In a warm obituary of Mach written within a few days of completing the definitive 1916 presentation of his theory, Einstein, quoting extensively from the famous passages in Mach’s Mechanics critical of Newton’s “absolute” concepts of space, time and motion, generously avowed that Mach’s understanding of the principles of mechanics had brought him very close to demanding a general theory of relativity a half-century earlier (1916b: 102–3). No doubt with this reference in mind, physicist Phillip Frank, later to be associated with the Vienna Circle, observed that

it is universally known today that Einstein’s general theory of relativity grew immediately out of the positivistic doctrine of space and motion. (1917 [1949: 68])

But, as noted above, there are both genuine and specious aspects connected with Einstein’s “principle of general relativity”, a mixture complicated by Einstein’s own puzzling remarks regarding the principle of general covariance.

2.3 Positivism and the “Hole Argument”

A passage from §3 of Einstein’s first complete exposition of the general theory of relativity (1916a) appeared to provide further grist for the mill of Machian positivism. There Einstein grandly declared that his requirement of general covariance for the gravitational field equations (i.e., that they remain unchanged under arbitrary, but suitably continuous, transformation of the spacetime coordinates), “takes away from space and time the last remnant of physical objectivity”. An accompanying heuristic reflection on the reasoning behind this claim seemed nothing less than an endorsement of Mach’s phenomenalism. “All our space-time verifications”, Einstein wrote, “invariably amount to a determination of space-time coincidences…”. This is because, Einstein presumed, all results of physical measurement ultimately amount to verifications of such coincidences, such as the observation of the coincidence of the second hand of a clock with a mark on its dial, or the point-like mark of a particle made on a detection screen. Observing that such (topological) relations alone are preserved under arbitrary coordinate transformation, Einstein concluded that “all our physical experience can ultimately be reduced to such coincidences”. To Mach’s followers, Einstein’s illustrative reflection was nothing less than an explicit avowal of the centerpiece of Mach’s phenomenalist epistemology, that sensations (Empfindungen), directly experienced sensory perceptions, alone are real and knowable. Thus Josef Petzoldt, a Machian philosopher and editor of the 8th edition of Mach’s Mechanics , the first to appear after the general theory of relativity, noted that Einstein’s remarks meant that the theory “rests, in the end, on the perception of the coincidence of sensations” and so “is fully in accord with Mach’s world-view, which is best characterized as relativistic positivism” (1921: 516).

However, contemporary scholarship has shown that Einstein’s remarks here were but elliptical references to an argument (the so-called “Hole Argument”) that has only fully been reconstructed from his private correspondence. Its conclusion is that, if a theory is generally covariant, the bare points of the spacetime manifold can have no inherent primitive identity (inherited say, from the manifold’s underlying topology), and so no reality independent of, in particular, the value of the metrical field associated with each point by a particular solution of the Einstein field equations (Stachel 1980; Norton 1984, 1993). Thus for a generally covariant theory, no physical reality accrues to “empty space” in the absence of any physical fields. In Einstein’s rhetorical embellishment, general covariance “takes away from space and time the last remnant of physical objectivity”; what he should have said is that spacetime coordinates are nothing more than arbitrary labels or parameters for the identification of physical events [see entry on the hole argument]. Hence this passage is not really an endorsement of positivist phenomenalism.

2.4 “Mach’s Principle”

For a number of years Einstein expressed the ambition of the general theory of relativity to fully implement Mach’s program for the relativization of all inertial effects, even appending the so-called cosmological constant in an attempt to obtain a fully Machian global solution to his field equations (1917b) for this purpose. This genuine point of contact of Mach’s influence was clearly identified only in 1918, when Einstein distinguished what he baptized as Mach’s Principle —(too) strongly stated as the requirement that the metric field (responsible for gravitational-inertial properties of bodies) on the left hand side of his field equation, is completely determined by the energy-momentum tensor on the right hand side—from the principle of general relativity which he misleadingly interpreted as the principle of general covariance. Taken together with the principle of the equivalence, Einstein asserted that the three principles, were three pillars on which his theory rested, even if they could not be thought completely independent of one another. Despite Einstein’s intent, there is considerable disagreement about the extent to which, if at all, the general theory of relativity could conform to anything like Mach’s Principle. The Dutch astronomer Willem De Sitter had immediately shown in 1917 that the Einstein field equations, even as augmented with the new cosmological constant, permitted matter-free solutions. Machians still have some room for maneuver due to vagaries regarding just what such a principle actually requires. On the other hand, it remains difficult to comprehend just what physical process or mechanism might implement the principle, however interpreted. How, for instance, might a given body’s inertial mass be accounted due to the influence of all other masses in the universe? (See the discussions in Barbour & Pfister 1995.)

2.5 Emerging Anti-Positivism

As Einstein’s principal research activity turned, after 1919, to the pursuit of a geometrical theory unifying gravitation and electromagnetism, his philosophical pronouncements increasingly took on a more realist or at least anti-positivist coloration. Lecturing at the Sorbonne in April 1922 (1922: 28), Einstein pronounced Mach “un bon mécanicien” (probably a reference to Mach’s views of the relativity of inertia) but “un déplorable philosophe”. Increasingly, Einstein’s retrospective portrayals of the genesis of general relativity centered almost entirely on the success of a strategy emphasizing mathematical aesthetics (see Norton 2000, Ryckman 2014, and §5). Positivists and operationalists alike continued to point to the Einstein analysis of simultaneity as relativity theory’s fundamental methodological feature. One, ruefully noting the difficulty of giving an operationalist analysis of the general theory, even suggested that the requirement of general covariance “conceals the possibility of disaster” (Bridgman 1949: 354). Finally there was, for Einstein, an understandable awkwardness in learning of Mach’s surprising disavowal of any role as forerunner to relativity theory in the Preface, dated 1913, to Mach’s posthumous book (1921) on physical optics. Though Einstein died without knowing differently, a recent investigation has built a strong case that this statement was forged after Mach’s death by his son Ludwig, under the influence of a rival guardian of Mach’s legacy and opponent of relativity theory, the philosopher Hugo Dingler (Wolters 1987).

3. Kantian and Neo-Kantian Interpretations

3.1 Neo-Kantians on Special Relativity

In the universities of Imperial and early Weimar Germany, the philosophy of Kant, particularly the various neo-Kantian schools, held pride of place. Of these, the Marburg School of Hermann Cohen and Paul Natorp, including Cohen’s student Ernst Cassirer, exhibited a special interest in the philosophy of the physical sciences and of mathematics. Yet prior to the general theory of relativity (1915–1916), Kantian philosophers accorded relativity theory only cursory attention. This may be seen in two leading Marburg works appearing in 1910, Cassirer’s Substanzbegriff und Funktionsbegriff and Natorp’s Die Logischen Grundlagen der Exakten Wissenschaften. Both books conform to the characteristic Marburg modification that greatly extended the scope of Kant’s Transcendental Logic, bringing under “pure thought” or “intellectual forms” what Kant had sharply separated in a distinction between the purely passive faculty of sensibility and the active faculties of understanding and reason. Of course, this revisionist tendency greatly transforms the meaning of Kant’s Transcendental Aesthetic and with it Kant’s conviction that space and time were forms of sensibility or pure intuitions a priori and so as well, his accounts of arithmetic and geometry. As will be seen, it enabled Cassirer, some ten years later, to view even the general theory of relativity as a striking confirmation of the fundamental tenets of transcendental idealism. In 1910, however, Cassirer’s brief but diffuse discussion of “the problem of relativity” mentions neither the principle of relativity nor the light postulate nor the names of Einstein, Lorentz or Minkowski. Rather it centers on the question of whether space and time are aggregates of sense impressions or “independent intellectual (gedankliche) forms”. Having decided in favor of the latter, Cassirer goes on to argue how and why these ideal mathematical presuppositions are necessarily related to measurable, empirical notions of space, time, and motion (1910: 228–9 [1923: 172–3]).

Natorp’s treatment, though scarcely six pages is more detailed (1910: 399–404). In revisionist fashion, the “Minkowski (sic) principle of relativity” was welcomed as a more consistent (as avoiding Newtonian absolutism) carrying through of the distinction between transcendentally ideal, purely mathematical, concepts of space and time and the relative physical measures of space and time. The relativization of time measurements, in particular, showed that Kant, once shorn of the psychologistic error of pure intuition, correctly maintained that time is not an object of perception. Natorp further alleged that from this relativization it followed that events are ordered, not in relation to an absolute time, but only as lawfully determined phenomena in mutual temporal relation to one another, a version of Leibnizian relationism. Similarly, the light postulate had a two-fold significance within the Marburg conception of natural science. On the one hand, the uniformity of the velocity of light, deemed an empirical presupposition of all space- and time-measurements, reminded that absolute determinations of these measures, unattainable in empirical natural science, would require a correspondingly absolute bound. Furthermore, as an upper limiting velocity for physical processes, including gravitational force, the light postulate eliminated the “mysterious absolutism” of Newtonian action-at-a-distance. Natorp regarded the requirement of invariance of laws of nature with respect to the Lorentz transformations as “perhaps the most important result of Minkowski’s investigation”. However, little more is said about this, and there is some confusion regarding these transformations and the Galilean ones they supersede; the former are seen as a

broadening (Erweiterung) of the old supposition of the invariance of Newtonian mechanics for a translatory or circular (zirkuläre, emphasis added) motion of the world coordinates. (1910: 403)

He concluded with an observation that the appearance of non-Euclidean and multi-dimensional geometries in physics and mathematics are to be understood only as “valuable tools in the treatment of special problems”. In themselves, they furnish no new insight into the (transcendental) logical meaning and ground of the transcendental and purely mathematically determined concepts of space and time; still less do they require the abandonment of these concepts.

3.2 Immunizing Strategies

Following the experimental confirmation of the general theory in 1919, few Kantians attempted to retain, unadulterated, all of the components of Kant’s epistemological views. Several examples will suffice to indicate characteristic “immunizing strategies” (Hentschel 1990). The Habilitationsschrift of E. Sellien (1919), read by Einstein in view of his criticism expressed in an October 1919 letter to Moritz Schlick (Howard 1984: 625), declared that Kant’s views on space and time pertained solely to intuitive space; as such Kant’s views were impervious to the measurable spaces and times of Einstein’s empirical theory. The work of another young Kantian philosopher, Ilse Schneider, personally known to Einstein, affirmed that Kant merely had held that the space of three-dimensional Euclidean geometry is the space in which Newton’s gravitational law is valid, thus no objections to Kant could be marshalled from the four-dimensional variably curved spacetimes of general relativity. Furthermore, Einstein’s cosmology (1917b) of a finite but unbounded universe was regarded as in complete accord with the “transcendental solution” to the First Antinomy in the Second Book of the Transcendental Dialectic. Her verdict was that apparent contradictions between relativity theory and Kantian philosophy disappear on closer examination of both doctrines (Schneider 1921: 71–75).

3.3 Rejecting or Refurbishing the Transcendental Aesthetic

In fact many Kantian philosophers did not attempt to immunize Kant from an apparent empirical refutation by the general theory. Rather, their concern was to establish how far-reaching the necessary modifications of Kant must be and whether, on implementation, anything distinctively Kantian remained. Certainly, most at risk appeared to be the claim, in the Transcendental Aesthetic, that all objects of outer intuition, and so all physical objects, conform to the space of Euclidean geometry. Since the general theory of relativity employed non-Euclidean (Riemannian) geometry for the characterization of physical phenomena, the conclusion seemed inevitable that any assertion of the necessarily Euclidean character of physical space in finite, if not infinitesimal, regions, is simply false.

Winternitz (1924), an example of this tendency, may be singled out on the grounds that it was deemed significant enough to be the subject of a rare book review by Einstein (1924). Winternitz argued that the Transcendental Aesthetic is inextricably connected to the claim of the necessarily Euclidean character of physical space and so stood in direct conflict with Einstein’s theory. It must accordingly be totally jettisoned as a confusing and unnecessary appendage of the more fundamental transcendental project of establishing the a priori logical presuppositions of physical knowledge. Indeed, these presuppositions have been confirmed by the general theory: They are spatiality and temporality as “unintuitive schema of order” in general (as distinct from any particular chronometrical relations), the law of causality and presupposition of continuity, the principle of sufficient reason, and the conservation laws. Remarkably, the necessity of each of these principles was, rightly or wrongly, soon to be challenged by the new quantum mechanics. (The ill-fated 1924 theory of Bohr, Kramers, and Slater attempting to unify the classical electromagnetic field with discontinuous quantum transitions in atoms is a period challenge to the law of conservation of energy.) According to Winternitz, the ne plus ultra of transcendental idealism lay in the claim that the world “is not given but posed (nicht gegeben, sondern aufgegeben) (as a problem)” out of the given material of sensation. Interestingly, Einstein, late in life, returns to this formulation as comprising the fundamental Kantian insight into the character of physical knowledge (1949b: 680; Ryckman 2017: chapter 10).

However, a number of neo-Kantian positions, of which that of Marburg was only the best known, did not take the core doctrine of the Transcendental Aesthetic à la lettre. Rather, resources broadly within it were sought for preserving an updated “critical idealism”. In this regard, Bollert (1921) merits mention for its technically adroit presentation of both the special and the general theory. Bollert argued that relativity theory had clarified the Kantian position in the Transcendental Aesthetic by demonstrating that not space and time, but spatiality (determinateness in positional ordering) and temporality (in order of succession) are a priori conditions of physical knowledge. In so doing, general relativity theory with its variably curved spacetime, brought a further advance in the steps or levels of “objectivation” lying at the basis of physics. In this process, corresponding with the growth of physical knowledge since Galileo, each higher level is obtained from the previous through elimination of subjective elements from the concept of physical object. This ever-augmented revision of the conditions of objectivity alone is central to critical idealism. For this reason, Bollert claimed it is “an error” to believe that “a contradiction exists between Kantian a priorism and relativity theory” (1921: 64). As will be seen, these conclusions are quite close to those of the much more widely known monograph of Cassirer (1921). It is worth noting, however, that Bollert’s interpretation of critical idealism was cited favorably later by Gödel (1946/9-B2: 240, n.24) during the course of research which led to his famous discovery of rotating universe solutions to Einstein’s gravitational field equations (1949). Gödel’s investigation had been prompted by curiosity concerning the similar denials, in relativity theory and in Kant, of an absolute time.

3.4 General Covariance: A Synthetic Principle of “Unity of Determination”

The most influential of all neo-Kantian interpretations of general relativity was Ernst Cassirer’s Zur Einsteinschen Relativitätstheorie (1921). Cassirer regarded the theory as a crucial test for Erkenntniskritik, the preferred term for the epistemology of the physical sciences of Marburg’s transcendental idealism. The question, posed right at the beginning, is whether the Transcendental Aesthetic offered a foundation “broad enough and strong enough” to bear the general theory of relativity. Recognizing the theory’s principal epistemological significance to lie in the requirement of general covariance (“that the general laws of nature are not changed in form by arbitrary changes of the space-time variables”), Cassirer directed his attention to Einstein’s remarks, cited in §2 above, that general covariance “takes away from space and time the last remnant of physical objectivity”. Cassirer correctly construed the gist of this passage to mean that in the general theory of relativity, space and time coordinates have no further importance than to be mere labels of events (“coincidences”), independent variables of the mathematical (field) functions characterizing physical state magnitudes. In particular, the requirement of general covariance had significantly improved upon Kant in bringing out far more clearly the exclusively methodological role of these conditions in empirical cognition, a role Kant misleadingly assigned to pure intuition. Not only has it has shown that space and time are not “things”, it has also clarified that they are “ideal principles of order” applying to the objects of the physical world as a necessary condition of their possible experience. According to Cassirer, Kant’s intention with regard to pure intuition was simply to express the methodological presupposition that certain “intellectual forms” (Denkformen), among which are the purely ideal concepts of coexistence and succession, enter into all physical knowledge. According to the development of physics since the 17th century already chronicled in Substanzbegriff und Funktionsbegriff, these forms have progressively lost their “fortuitous” (zufälligen) anthropomorphic features, and more and more take on the character of “systematic forms of unity”. From this vantage point, general covariance is but the most recent refinement of the methodological principle of “unity of determination” governing the constitution of objects of physical knowledge, notable in physics by the transition from concepts of substance into functional and relational concepts. In accord with central tenets of the Marburg Kant interpretation noted above, Cassirer maintained that the requirement of generally covariant laws was a vindication of the transcendental ideality of space and time, not, indeed, as “forms of intuition” but as “objectifying conditions” that further “de-anthropomorphized” the concept of object in physics, rendering it “purely symbolic”. The fundamental concept of object in physics no longer pertains to particular entities or processes propagating in space and time but rather to “the invariance of relations among (physical state) magnitudes” represented by generally covariant mathematical objects (tensors). For this reason, Cassirer concluded, the general theory of relativity exhibits “the most determinate application and carrying through within empirical science of the standpoint of critical idealism” (1921 [1957: 71; 1923: 412]).

4. Logical Empiricism

4.1 Lessons of Methodology?

Logical empiricism’s philosophy of science was conceived under the guiding star of Einstein’s two theories of relativity, as may be seen from the early writings of its founders, for purposes here, Moritz Schlick, Rudolf Carnap, and Hans Reichenbach. A small monograph of Schlick, Space and Time in Contemporary Physics, appearing in 1917 initially in successive issues of the scientific weekly Die Naturwissenschaften, served as prototype. One of the first of a host of philosophical examinations of the general theory of relativity, it was distinguished both by the lucidity of its largely non-technical physical exposition and by Einstein’s enthusiastic praise of its philosophical appraisal, favoring conventionalism à la Poincaré over both neo-Kantianism and Machian positivism. The transformation of the concept of space within the general theory of relativity was the subject of Rudolf Carnap’s dissertation at Jena in 1921. Appearing as a monograph in 1922, it also evinced a broadly conventionalist methodology combined with elements of Husserlian transcendental phenomenology. Distinguishing clearly between intuitive, physical and purely formal conceptions of space, Carnap argued that, subject to the necessary constraints of certain a priori phenomenological conditions of the topology of intuitive space, the purely formal and the physical aspects of theories of space, can be adjusted to one another so as to preserve any conventionally chosen aspect. In turn, Hans Reichenbach was one of five intrepid attendees of Einstein’s first seminar on general relativity given at Berlin University in the tumultuous winter of 1918–1919; his detailed notebooks survive. The general theory of relativity was the particular subject of Reichenbach’s neo-Kantian first book (1920), which is dedicated to Albert Einstein, as well as of his next two books (1924, 1928), and of numerous papers in the 1920s.

But Einstein’s theories of relativity provided far more than the subject matter for these philosophical examinations. Logical empiricist philosophy of science itself was fashioned by lessons allegedly drawn from relativity theory in correcting or rebutting both neo-Kantian and Machian perspectives on general methodological and epistemological questions of science. Several of the most characteristic doctrines of logical empiricist philosophy of science—the interpretation of a priori elements in physical theories as conventions, the treatment of the necessary role of conventions in linking theoretical concepts to observation, the insistence on observational language definition of theoretical terms—were taken to have been conclusively demonstrated by Einstein in fashioning his two theories of relativity. As mentioned above, Einstein’s 1905 analysis of the conventionality of simultaneity in the special theory of relativity became a methodological paradigm for logical empiricism; it prompted Reichenbach’s own method of “logical analysis” of physical theories into subjective (definitional, conventional) and objective (empirical) components. An overriding concern in the logical empiricist treatment of relativity theory was to draw broad lessons for scientific methodology and philosophy of science generally, although issues more specific to the philosophy of physics were also addressed. Only the former are considered here; for a discussion of the latter, see Ryckman 2007.

4.2 From the “Relativized A priori” to the “Relativity of Geometry”

A cornerstone of Reichenbach’s logical analysis of the theory of general relativity is the thesis of “the relativity of geometry”, that an arbitrary geometry may be ascribed to spacetime (holding constant the underlying topology) if the laws of physics are correspondingly modified through the introduction of “universal forces”. This particular argument for metric conventionalism has generated substantial controversy on its own, but is better understood through an account of its genesis in Reichenbach’s early neo-Kantianism. Independently of that genesis, the thesis becomes the paradigmatic illustration of Reichenbach’s broad methodological claim that conventional or definitional elements—“coordinative definitions” associating mathematical concepts of the physical theory with “elements of physical reality”—are a necessary condition for empirical cognition in the mathematical sciences of nature. At the same time, Reichenbach’s thesis of metrical conventionalism is part and parcel of an audacious program of epistemological reductionism regarding spacetime structures. This was first attempted in his “constructive axiomatization” (1924) of the theory of relativity on the basis of “elementary matters of fact” (Elementartatbestande) regarding the observable behavior of lights rays, and rods and clocks. Here, and in the more widely read treatment (1928), metrical properties of spacetime are deemed less fundamental than topological ones, while the latter are derived from the concept of time ordering. But time order in turn is reduced to that of causal order and so the whole edifice of structures of spacetime is considered epistemologically derivative, resting upon ultimately basic empirical facts about causal order and a prohibition against action-at-a-distance. The end point of Reichenbach’s epistemological analysis of the foundations of spacetime theory is then “the causal theory of time”, a type of relational theory of time that assumes the validity of the causal principle of action-by-contact (Nahewirkungsprinzip).

However, Reichenbach’s first monograph on relativity (1920) was written from within a neo-Kantian perspective. As Friedman (1994) and others (Ryckman 2005) have discussed in detail Reichenbach’s innovation, a modification of the Kantian conception of synthetic a priori principles, rejecting the sense of “valid for all time” while retaining that of “constitutive of the object (of knowledge)”, led to the conception of a theory-specific “relativized a priori”. According to Reichenbach, any physical theory presupposes the validity of systems of certain, quite general, principles which however may vary from theory to theory. These coordinating principles, as they are then termed, are indispensable for the ordering of perceptual data; they define the objects of knowledge within the theory. The epistemological significance of relativity theory, according to the early Reichenbach, is to have shown, contrary to Kant, that these systems may contain mutually inconsistent principles, and so require emendation to remove contradictions. Thus a “relativization” of the Kantian conception of synthetic a priori principles is the direct epistemological result of the theory of relativity. But this finding is also taken to signal a transformation in the method of epistemological investigation of science. In place of Kant’s “analysis of Reason”, “the method of analysis of science” (der wissenschaftsanalytische Methode) is proposed as “the only way that affords us an understanding of the contribution of our reason to knowledge” (1920: 71 [1965: 74]). The method’s raison d’être is to sharply distinguish between the subjective role of (coordinating) principles—“the contribution of Reason”—and the contribution of objective reality, represented by theory-specific empirical laws and regularities (“axioms of connection”) which in some sense have been “constituted” by the former. Relativity theory itself is a shining exemplar of this method for it has shown that the metric of spacetime describes an “objective property” of the world, once the subjective freedom to make coordinate transformations (the coordinating principle of general covariance) is recognized (1920: 86–7 [1965: 90]). The thesis of metric conventionalism had yet to appear.

But soon it did. Still in 1920, Schlick objected, both publicly and in private correspondence with Reichenbach, that “principles of coordination” were precisely statements of the kind that Poincaré had termed “conventions” (see Coffa 1991: 201ff.). Moreover, Einstein, in a lecture of January 1921, entitled “Geometry and Experience”, appeared to lend support to this view. Einstein argued that the question concerning the nature of spacetime geometry becomes an empirical question only on certain pro tem stipulations regarding the “practically rigid body” of measurement (pro tem in view of the inadmissibility in relativity theory of the concept “actually rigid body”). In any case, by 1922, the essential pieces of Reichenbach’s mature conventionalist view had emerged. The argument is canonically presented in §8 (entitled “The Relativity of Geometry”) of Der Philosophie der Raum-Zeit-Lehre (completed in 1926, published in 1928). In a move superficially similar to the argument of Einstein’s “Geometry and Experience”, Reichenbach maintained that questions concerning the empirical determination of the metric of spacetime must first confront the fact that only the whole theoretical edifice comprising both geometry and physics admits of observational test. Einstein’s gravitational theory is such a totality. However, unlike Einstein, Reichenbach’s “method of analysis of science”, later re-named “logical analysis of science”, is directed to the epistemological problem of factoring this totality into its conventional or definitional and its empirical components.

This is done as follows. The empirical determination of the spacetime metric by measurement requires choice of some “metrical indicators”: this can only be done by laying down a coordinative definition stipulating, e.g., that the metrical notion of length is coordinated to some physical object or process. A standard choice coordinates lengths with “infinitesimal measuring rods” supposed rigid (e.g., Einstein’s “practically rigid body”). This however is only a convention, and other physical objects or processes might be chosen. (In Schlick’s fanciful example, the Dali Lama’s heartbeat could be chosen as the physical process to which units of time are coordinated.) Of course, the chosen metrical indicators must be corrected for certain distorting effects (temperature, magnetism, etc.) due to the presence of physical forces. Such forces are termed “differential forces” to indicate that they affect various materials differently. However, Reichenbach argued, the choice of a rigid rod as standard of length is tantamount to the claim that there are no non-differential—“universal”—distorting forces that affect all bodies in the same way and cannot be screened off. In the absence of “universal forces” the coordinative definition regarding rigid rods can be implemented and the nature of the spacetime metric empirically determined, for example, finding that paths of light rays through solar gravitational field are not Euclidean straight lines. Thus, the theory of general relativity, on adoption of the coordinative definition of rigid rods (“universal forces = 0”), affirms that the geometry of spacetime in a given region is of a non-euclidean kind. The point, however, is that this conclusion rests on the convention governing measuring rods. One could, alternately, maintain that the geometry of spacetime was Euclidean by adopting a different coordinative definition, for example, holding that measuring rods expanded or contracted depending on their location in spacetime, a choice tantamount to the supposition of “universal forces”. Then, consistent with all empirical phenomena, it could be maintained that Euclidean geometry was compatible with Einstein’s theory if only one allowed the existence of such forces. Thus whether general relativity affirms a Euclidean or a non-euclidean metric in the solar gravitational field rests upon a conventional choice regarding the existence of non-zero universal forces. Either hypothesis may be adopted since they are empirically equivalent descriptions; their joint possibility is referred to as “the relativity of geometry”. Just as with the choice of standard synchrony in Reichenbach’s analysis of the conventionality of simultaneity, a choice also held to be “logically arbitrary”, Reichenbach recommends the “descriptively simpler” alternative in which universal forces do not exist. To be sure, “ descriptive simplicity has nothing to do with truth”, i.e., has no bearing on the question of whether the spacetime metric really has a non-Euclidean structure (1928: 47 [1958: 35]).

4.3 Critique of Reichenbachian Metric Conventionalism

In retrospect, it is rather difficult to understand the significance that has been accorded this argument. Carnap, for example, in “Introductory Remarks” (Carnap 1956 [Reichenbach 1958: vii]) to the posthumous English translation of this work, singled it out on account of its “great interest for the methodology of physics”. Reichenbach himself deemed “the philosophical achievement of the theory of relativity” to lie in this methodological distinction between conventional and factual claims regarding spacetime geometry (1928: 24 [1958: 15]), and he boasted of his “philosophical theory of relativity” as an incontrovertible “philosophical result”:

the philosophical theory of relativity, i.e., the discovery of the definitional character of the metric in all its details, holds independently of experience.… a philosophical result not subject to the criticism of the individual sciences. (1928: 223 [1958: 177])

Yet this result is neither incontrovertible nor an untrammeled consequence of Einstein’s theory of gravitation. There is, first of all, the shadowy status accorded to universal forces. A sympathetic reading (e.g., Dieks 1987) suggests that the notion serves usefully in mediating between a traditional a priori commitment to Euclidean geometry and the view of modern geometrodynamics, where gravitational force is “geometrized away” (see §5). After all, as Reichenbach explicitly acknowledged, gravitation is itself a universal force, coupling to all bodies and affecting them in the same manner (1928: 294–6 [1958: 256–8]). Hence the choice recommended by descriptive simplicity is merely a stipulation that infinitesimal metrical appliances be considered as “differentially at rest” in an inertial system (1924: 115 [1969: 147]). This is a stipulation that spacetime measurements always take place in regions that are to be considered small Minkowski spacetimes (arenas of gravitation-free physics). By the same token, consistency then required an admission that “the transition from the special theory to the general one represents merely a renunciation of metrical characteristics” (1924: 115 [1969: 147]), or, even more pointedly, that “all the metrical properties of the spacetime continuum are destroyed by gravitational fields” where only topological properties remain (1928: 308 [1958: 268–9]). To be sure, these bizarre conclusions are supposed to be rendered more palatable in connection with the epistemological reduction of spacetime structures in the causal theory of time.

Despite the influence of this argument on the subsequent generation of philosophers of science, Reichenbach’s analysis of spacetime measurement is plainly inappropriate, manifesting a fallacious tendency to view the generically curved spacetimes of general relativity as stitched together from little bits of flat Minskowski spacetimes. Besides being mathematically inconsistent, this procedure offers no way of providing a non-metaphorical physical meaning for the fundamental metrical tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\), the central theoretical concept of general relativity, nor to the series of curvature tensors derivable from it and its associated affine connection. Since these sectional curvatures at a point of spacetime are empirically manifested and the curvature components can be measured, e.g., as the tidal forces of gravity, they can hardly be accounted as due to conventionally adopted “universal forces”. Furthermore, the concept of an infinitesimal rigid rod in general relativity cannot really be other than the interim stopgap Einstein recognized it to be. For it cannot actually be rigid due to these tidal forces; in fact, the concept of a rigid body is already forbidden in special relativity as allowing instantaneous causal actions. Moreover, such a rod must indeed be infinitesimal, i.e., a freely falling body of negligible thickness and of sufficiently short extension, so as to not be stressed by gravitational field inhomogeneities; just how short depending on strength of local curvatures and on measurement error (Torretti 1983: 239). But then, as Reichenbach appeared to have recognized in his comments about the “destruction” of the metric by gravitational fields, it cannot serve as a coordinately defined general standard for metrical relations. In fact, as Weyl was the first to point out, precisely which physical objects or structures are most suitable as measuring instruments should be decided on the basis of gravitational theory itself. From this enlightened perspective, measuring rods and clocks are structures that are far too physically complex. Rather, the metric in the region surrounding any observer O can be empirically determined from freely falling ideally small neutral test masses together with the paths of light rays. More precisely stated, the spacetime metric results from the affine-projective structure of the behavior of neutral test particles of negligible mass and from the conformal structure of light rays received and issued by the observer (Weyl 1921). Any purely conventional stipulation regarding the behavior of measuring rods as physically constitutive of metrical relations in general relativity is then otiose (Weyl 1923a; Ehlers, Pirani and Schild 1973; Geroch 1978). Alas, since Reichenbach reckoned the affine structure of the gravitational-inertial field to be just as conventional as its metrical structure, he was not able to recognize this method as other than an equivalent, but by no means necessarily preferable, account of the empirical determination of the metric through the use of rods and clocks (Coffa 1979; Ryckman 2005: chs. 2 & 4; Giovanelli 2013b).

5. “Geometrization of Physics”: Platonism, Transcendental Idealism, Structuralism

5.1 Differing Motivations

In the decade or so following the appearance of the general theory of relativity, there was much talk of a reduction of physics to geometry (e.g., Hilbert 1917; Weyl 1918b, 1919; Haas 1920; Lodge 1921). While these discussions were largely, and understandably, confined to scientific circles, they nonetheless brought distinctly philosophical issues—of methodology, but also of epistemology and metaphysics—together with technical matters. Einstein’s mathematical representation of gravitational field potentials by the metric tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\) of a variably curved spacetime geometry was quickly termed a “geometrization of gravitational force”. Weyl and others acclaimed Einstein as reviving a geometrizing tendency essentially dormant within physics since the 17th century. In so doing, Einstein supposedly opened up the prospect of a complete geometrization of physical theory, the possibility of finding a unifying representation of all of known physical interactions within the frame of a unique metrical theory of the four-dimensional spacetime continuum. Einstein himself, as will be seen, turned out to be highly critical of the idea of “geometrizing physics” even as the general theory of relativity was its inspiration. This was certainly the case for the Göttingen mathematician David Hilbert (1915, 1917). In the very week in late November 1915 when Einstein presented his completed gravitational theory to the Berlin Academy (on Thursday), Hilbert (the previous Monday) proposed to the Göttingen Academy a schematic generally covariant axiomatization coupling Einstein’s gravitational theory with a relativistic electromagnetic theory of matter due to German physicist Gustav Mie. Hilbert’s theory could not possibly succeed (however, that matter is not fundamentally electromagnetic in nature was only shown in the 1930s by the quantum physics of the atomic nucleus). It is remembered today mostly for the so-called “Einstein-Hilbert action” in the usual variational formulation of Einstein’s theory. But at the time Hilbert viewed his theory as a triumph of his “axiomatic method” as well as a demonstration that

physics is a four-dimensional pseudogeometry [i.e., a geometry distinguishing spatial and temporal dimensions] whose metric determination \(g_{\mu\nu}\) is bound, according to the fundamental equations … of my first [1915] contribution, to the electromagnetic quantities, that is, to matter. (1917: 63, translation by the author)

However, this implied reduction of physics to geometry was crucially obtained within the epistemological frame of what Hilbert termed “the axiomatic method”; its intended significance is that of a proposed solution to the 6th (“the axiomatization of physics”) of the famous 23 mathematical problems posed by Hilbert at the 1900 International Congress of Mathematicians in Paris (Brading & Ryckman 2008). Others pursued a different path, seeking the reduction of physics to geometry by generalizing beyond the pseudo-Riemannian geometry (a Riemannian geometry distinguishing between space and time dimensions) of general relativity (Hermann Weyl, Arthur Stanley Eddington) or by employing Riemannian geometry in five dimensions (Theodore Kaluza). Whatever may have been Kaluza’s philosophical motivations (van Dongen 2010: 132–5), neither mathematical realism nor Platonism played a role in Weyl’s (1918a,b), and following Weyl, Eddington’s (1921) generalizations of Riemannian geometry. Their proposals were above all explicit attempts to comprehend the nature of fundamental physical theory in the light of general relativity, from systematic epistemological standpoints neither positivist nor realist. As such they comprise early philosophical interpretations of that theory, although they intertwine philosophy, geometry and physics in a manner unprecedented since Descartes.

After completing general relativity, Einstein long entertained hopes that matter might be described in geometrical terms by a theory unifying gravitation and electromagnetism. But he stoutly and repeatedly resisted proclamations of any reduction of physics to geometry (e.g., 1928: 254; Giovanelli 2013a). Theoretical unification was overriding goal; no special significance would accrue to any successful unifying theory whose physical objects, motions, and interactions are described in geometrical terms (Lehmkuhl 2014). Einstein nonetheless followed both approaches to theoretical unification, that of generalizing Riemannian geometry and by adding extra dimensions. By 1923, Einstein was the recognized leader of the unification program (Vizgin 1985 [1994: 265]) and by 1925 had devised his first “homegrown” geometrical “unified field theories” (Sauer 2014). The first phase of the geometrical unification program essentially ended with Einstein’s “distant parallelism” theory of 1928–1931 (e.g., 1929), an inadvertent public sensation (Fölsing 1993 [1997: 605]). Needless to say, none of these efforts met with success. In a lecture at the University of Vienna on October 14, 1931, Einstein forlornly referred to his failed attempts, each conceived on a distinct differential geometrical basis, as a “graveyard of dead hopes” (Einstein 1932). By this time, certainly, the viable prospects for the geometrical unification program had considerably waned. A consensus emerged among nearly all leading theoretical physicists that while unification of the gravitation and electromagnetic fields might be attained in formally distinct ways, the problem of matter, treated with undeniable empirical success by the new quantum theory, was not to be resolved solely within the confines of classical fields and spacetime geometry. In any event, from the early 1930s, prospects of any type of unification program appeared greatly premature in view of the wealth of data produced by the new physics of the nucleus.

Still, unsuccessful pursuit of the goal of geometrical unification absorbed Einstein and his various research assistants for more than three decades, up to Einstein’s death in 1955. In the course of it, Einstein’s research methodology underwent a dramatic change (Ryckman 2014; Ryckman 2017: chapters 9 and 10). In place of physically warranted principles to guide theoretical construction, such as the equivalence between inertial and gravitational mass that had set him on the path to his greatest success with general relativity, Einstein increasingly relied on considerations of mathematical aesthetics, of “logical simplicity”, and the inevitability of certain mathematical structures under various constraints, adopted essentially for philosophical reasons. In a talk entitled “On the Method of Theoretical Physics” at Oxford in 1933, the transformation was stated dramatically:

Experience remains, of course, the sole criterion of the physical utility of a mathematical construction. But the creative principle resides in mathematics. In a certain sense, therefore, I hold it true that pure thought can grasp reality, as the ancients dreamed. (1933: 274)

Even decades of accumulating empirical successes of the new quantum theory did not dislodge Einstein’s core metaphysical conception of physical reality as a continuous field (“total field”) where particles and the concept of motion are derived notions (e.g., 1950: 348).

5.2 The Initial Step: “Geometrizing” Gravity

The “geometrization of gravitational force” in 1915 gave the geometrization program its first, partial, realization as well as its subsequent impetus. In Einstein’s theory, the fundamental or “metric” tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\) of Riemannian geometry appears in a dual role which thoroughly fuses its geometrical and its physical meanings. As is apparent from the expression for the differential interval between neighboring spacetime events, \(\textit{ds}^{2}= g_{\mu\nu} \textit{dx}^{\mu} \textit{dx}^{\nu}\) (here, and below there is an implicit summation over repeated upper and lower indices), the metric tensor is at once the geometrical quantity underlying measurable metrical relations of lengths and times. In this role it ties a mathematical theory of events in four-dimensional curved spacetime to observations and measurements in space and time. But it is also the potential of the gravitational (or “metrical”) field whose value, at any point of spacetime arises as a solution of the Einstein Field Equations (see below) for given physical quantities of mass-momentum-stress in the immediate surrounding region. In the new view, the idea of strength of gravitational force is replaced by that of degree of spacetime curvature. This curvature is manifested, for example, by the tidal force of the Earth’s gravitational field that occasions two freely falling bodies, released at a certain height and at fixed separation, to approach one another. A freely falling body (ideally, an uncharged test particle of negligible mass) in a gravitational field follows a geodesic path (that is, a curve of extremal length in a generally curved pseudo-Riemannian spacetime). The body is no longer to be regarded as moving through space according to the pull of an attractive gravitational force, but simply as tracing out the laziest (longest or slowest possible) four-dimensional trajectory between two finitely separated spacetime events. In consequence, in general relativity the equation of motion of a free body is a geodesic equation according to which the body’s spacetime (four-) acceleration vanishes identically and its free fall becomes indistinguishable from inertial motion. According to this equation, a free body moves on a geodesic path in both the presence and absence of a gravitational field. This is possible because the equation contains a multi-index term (not a tensor) called a connection allowing a gravitational field to appear or not according to a given choice of spacetime coordinates. As a result, in general relativity there is no observer-independent (coordinate-free) way to partition the combined inertial-gravitational field into its separate components. The gross mechanical properties of bodies, comprising all gravitational-inertial phenomena, can be derived as the solution of a single linked system of ten generally covariant partial differential equations, the Einstein equations. According to these equations, spacetime and matter stand in dynamical interaction. One abbreviate way of characterizing the dual role of the \(g_{\mu\nu}\) is to say that in the general theory of relativity, gravitation, which includes mechanics, has become geometrized, i.e., incorporated into the geometry of spacetime. Yet Einstein objected to claims that in general relativity gravitation is reduced to geometry as that statement’s natural interpretation severs the unification of inertia and gravitation that to Einstein comprised the theory’s core achievement.

5.3 Extending Geometrization

In making spacetime curvature dependent on distributions of mass and energy, general relativity is indeed capable of encompassing all (non-quantum) physical fields. However, in classical general relativity there remains a fundamental asymmetry between gravitational and non-gravitational fields, in particular, electromagnetism, the only other fundamental physical interaction definitely known until the 1930s. This shows up visibly in one form of the Einstein field equations in which, on the left-hand side, a geometrical object (\(g_{\mu\nu}\), the Einstein tensor) built up from the uniquely compatible linear symmetric (“Levi-Civita”) connection associated with the metric tensor \(g_{\mu\nu}\), and representing the curvature of spacetime, is set identical to a tensorial but non-geometrical phenomenological representation of matter on the right-hand side.

\[ G_{\mu\nu} = k T_{\mu\nu}, \textrm{ where } G_{\mu\nu} \equiv R_{\mu\nu} - \frac{1}{2} g_{\mu\nu} R \]

The expression on the right side, introduced by a coupling term that contains Newton’s gravitational constant, mathematically represents the non-gravitational sources of the gravitational field in a region of spacetime in the form of a stress-energy-momentum tensor (an “omnium gatherum” in Eddington’s (1919: 63) pithy phrase). As the geometry of spacetime principally resides on the left-hand side, this situation seems unsatisfactory. Late in life, Einstein likened his famous equation to a building, one wing of which (the left) was built of “fine marble”, the other (the right) of “low grade wood” (1936: 311). In its classical form, general relativity accords only the gravitational field a direct geometrical significance; the other physical fields reside in spacetime; they are not of spacetime.

Einstein’s dissatisfaction with this asymmetrical state of affairs was palpable at an early stage and was expressed with increasing frequency beginning in the early 1920s. A particularly vivid declaration of the need for geometrical unification was made in his “Nobel lecture” of July 1923:

The mind striving after unification of the theory cannot be satisfied that two fields should exist which, by their nature, are quite independent. A mathematically unified field theory is sought in which the gravitational field and the electromagnetic field are interpreted as only different components or manifestations of the same uniform field,… The gravitational theory, considered in terms of mathematical formalism, i.e., Riemannian geometry, should be generalized so that it includes the laws of the electromagnetic field. (489)

It might be noted that the tacit assumption, evident here, that incorporation of electromagnetism into spacetime geometry requires a generalization of the Riemannian geometry of general relativity; though widely held at the time, it is not quite correct (Rainich 1925; Misner & Wheeler 1957; Geroch 1966).

5.4 “Pure Infinitesimal Geometry”

It wasn’t Einstein, but the mathematician Hermann Weyl who first addressed the asymmetry in 1918 in the course of reconstructing Einstein’s theory on the preferred epistemological basis of a “pure infinitesimal geometry” (Reine Infinitesimalgeometrie). Holding that direct—evident, in the sense of the Wesensschau of Husserlian phenomenoloy—comparisons of length or duration could be made at near-by points of spacetime, but not, as the Riemannian geometry of Einstein’s theory allowed, “at a distance”, Weyl discovered an expanded geometry with additional terms that, following Einstein’s example, he simply formally identified with the potentials of the electromagnetic field. From these, the electromagnetic field strengths can be immediately derived. Choosing an action integral to obtain both the homogeneous and the inhomogeneous Maxwell equations as well as Einstein’s gravitational theory, Weyl could express electromagnetism as well as gravitation solely within the confines of a spacetime geometry. As no other interactions were definitely known to occur, Weyl proudly declared that the concepts of geometry and physics were the same. Hence, everything in the physical world was a manifestation of spacetime geometry.

(The) distinction between geometry and physics is an error, physics extends not at all beyond geometry: the world is a \((3+1)\) dimensional metrical manifold, and all physical phenomena transpiring in it are only modes of expression of the metric field, …. (M)atter itself is dissolved in “metric” and is not something substantial that in addition exists “in” metric space. (1919: 115–116, translation by the author)

By the winter of 1919–1920, for both physical and philosophical reasons (the latter having to do with his largely positive reaction to Brouwer’s intuitionist views about the mathematical continuum, in particular, the continuum of spacetime—see Mancosu & Ryckman 2005), Weyl (1920) surrendered the belief, expressed here, that matter, with its corpuscular structure, might be derived within spacetime geometry. Thus he gave up the Holy Grail of the nascent unified field theory program almost before it had begun. Nonetheless, he actively defended his theory well into the 1920s, essentially on the grounds of Husserlian transcendental phenomenology, that his geometry and its central principle, “the epistemological principle of relativity of magnitude” comprised a superior epistemological framework for general relativity. Weyl’s postulate of a “pure infinitesimal” non-Riemannian metric for spacetime allowed the “gauge” (by which Weyl meant a scale of length; the term has a different meaning today) to vary at each spacetime point. But it met with intense criticism. No observation spoke in favor of it; to the contrary, Einstein pointed out that according to Weyl’s theory, the atomic spectra of the chemical elements should not be stable, as indeed they are observed to be. Although Weyl responded to this objection forcefully, and with some subtlety (Weyl 1923a), he was able to persuade neither Einstein, nor any other leading relativity physicist, with the exception of Eddington. However, the idea of requiring gauge invariance of fundamental physical laws was revived and vindicated by Weyl himself in a different form later on (Weyl 1929; see Ryckman 2005: chs. 5 & 6; O’Raifeartaigh 1997; Scholz 2001, 2004; Afriat 2017, Other Internet Resources).

5.5 Eddington’s World Geometry

Despite failure to win many friends for his theory, Weyl’s guiding example of unification launched the geometrical program of unified field theory, initiating a variety of efforts, all aimed at finding a suitable generalization of the Riemannian geometry of Einstein’s theory to encompass as well non-gravitational physics (Vizgin 1985 [1994: chapter 4]). In December 1921, the Berlin Academy published Theodore Kaluza’s novel proposal for unification of gravitation and electromagnetism upon the basis of a five-dimensional Riemannian geometry. But earlier that year, in February, came Arthur Stanley Eddington’s further generalization of Weyl’s four-dimensional geometry, wherein the sole primitive geometrical notion is the non-metrical comparison of direction or orientation at the same or neighboring points. In Weyl’s geometry the magnitude of vectors at the same point, but pointing in different directions, might be directly compared to one another; in Eddington’s, comparison was immediate only for vectors pointing in the same direction. His “theory of the affine field” encompassed both Weyl’s geometry and the semi-Riemannian geometry of Einstein’s general relativity as special cases. Little attention was paid however, to Eddington’s claim, prefacing his paper, that his objective had not been to “seek (the) unknown laws (of matter)” as befits a unified field theory. Rather it lay “in consolidating the known (field) laws” wherein “the whole scheme seems simplified, and new light is thrown on the origin of the fundamental laws of physics” (1921: 105).

Eddington was persuaded that Weyl’s “principle of relativity of length” was “an essential part of the relativistic conception”, a view he retained to the end of his life (e.g., 1939: 28). But he was also convinced that the largely antagonistic reception accorded Weyl’s theory was due to its confusing formulation. The flaw lay in Weyl’s failure to make transparently obvious that the locally scale invariant (“pure infinitesimal”) “world geometry” was not the physical geometry of actual spacetime, but an entirely mathematical construct inherently serving to specify the ideal of an observer-independent external world. To remedy this, Eddington devised a general method of deductive presentation of field physics in which “world geometry” is developed mathematically as conceptually separate from physics. A “world geometry” is a purely mathematical construction the derived objects of which possess only structural properties requisite to the ideal of a completely impersonal world; these are objects, as he wrote in Space, Time and Gravitation (1920), a semi-popular best-seller, represented “from the point of view of no one in particular”. Naturally, this ideal had changed with the progress of physical theory. In the light of relativity theory, such a world is indifferent to specification of reference frame and, after Weyl, of gauge of length (scale). A world geometry is not the physical theory of such a world but a framework or “graphical representation” within whose terms existing physical theory might be displayed, essentially through a purely formal identification of known tensors of the existing physical laws of gravitation and electromagnetism with those derived within the world geometry. Such a geometrical representation of physics cannot really be said to be right or wrong, for it only implements, if it can, current ideas governing the conception of objects and properties of an impersonal objective external world. But when existing physics, in particular, Einstein’s theory of gravitation, is set in the context of Eddington’s world geometry, it yields a surprising consequence: The Einstein law of gravitation appears as a definition! In the form \(R_{\mu\nu} = 0\) it defines what in the “world geometry” appears to the mind as “vacuum” while in the form of the Einstein field equation noted above, it defines what is to be encountered by the mind as “matter”. This result is what is meant by his stated claim of throwing “new light on the origin of the fundamental laws of physics” (see Ryckman 2005: chapters 7 & 8). Eddington’s notoriously difficult and opaque later works (1936, 1946), took their inspiration from this argumentation in attempting to carry out a similar, algebraic not geometric, program of deriving fundamental physical laws, and the constants occurring in them, from a priori epistemological principles.

5.6 Meyerson on “Pangeometrism”

Within physics the idealist currents lying behind the world geometries of Weyl and Eddington were largely ignored, whereas within philosophy, with the notable exception of Émile Meyerson’s La Déduction Relativiste (1925). Meyerson, who had no doubt concerning the basic realist impetus of science, carefully distinguished Einstein’s “rational deduction of the physical world” from the speculative geometrical unifications of gravitation and electromagnetism of Weyl and Eddington. These theories, as affirmations of a complete panmathematicism, or rather of a pangeometrism (1925: §§ 157–58), were compared to the rationalist deductions of Hegel’s Logic. That general relativity succeeded in partly realizing Descartes’ program of reducing the physical to the spatial through geometric deduction, is due to the fact that Einstein “followed in the footsteps” of Descartes, not Hegel (1925: §133). But pan-geometrism is also capable of overreaching itself and this is the transgression committed by both Weyl and Eddington. Weyl in particular is singled out for criticism for seemingly to have reverted to Hegel’s monistic idealism, and so to be subject to its fatal flaw. In regarding nature as completely intelligible, Weyl had abolished the thing-in-itself and so promoted the identity of self and non-self, the great error of the Naturphilosophien.

Though he had “all due respect to the writings of such distinguished scientists” as Weyl and Eddington, Meyerson took their overt affirmations of idealism to be misguided attempts “to associate themselves with a philosophical point of view that is in fact quite foreign to the relativistic doctrine” (1925: §150). That “point of view” is in fact two distinct species of transcendental idealism. It is above all “foreign” to relativity theory because Meyerson cannot see how it is possible to “reintegrate the four-dimensional world of relativity theory into the self”. After all, Kant’s own argument for Transcendental Idealism proceeded “in a single step”, in establishing the subjectivity of the space and time of “our naïve intuition”. But this still leaves “the four dimensional universe of relativity independent of the self”. Any attempt to “reintegrate” four-dimensional spacetime into the self would have to proceed at a “second stage” where, additionally, there would be no “solid foundation” such as spatial and temporal intuition furnished Kant at the first stage. Perhaps, Meyerson allowed, there is indeed “another intuition, purely mathematical in nature”, lying behind spatial and temporal intuition, and capable of “imagining the four-dimensional universe, to which, in turn, it makes reality conform”. This would make intuition a “two-stage mechanism”. While all of this is not “inconceivable”, it does appear, nonetheless, “rather complex and difficult if one reflects upon it”. In any case, this is likely to be unnecessary, for considering the matter “with an open mind”,

one would seem to be led to the position of those who believe that relativity theory tends to destroy the concept of Kantian intuition. (1925: §§ 151–2)

Meyerson had come right up to the threshold of grasping the Weyl-Eddington geometric unification schemes in something like the sense in which they were intended. The stumbling block for him, and for others, is the conviction that transcendental idealism can be supported only from an argument about the nature of intuition, and intuitive representation. To be sure, the geometric framework for Weyl’s construction of the objective four-dimensional world of relativity is based upon the Evidenz available in “essential insight”, which is limited to the simple linear relations and mappings in what is basically the tangent vector space \(T_P\) at a point P in a manifold. Thus in Weyl’s differential geometry there is a fundamental divide between integrable and non-integrable relations of comparison. The latter are primitive and epistemologically privileged, but nonetheless not justified until it is shown how the infinitesimal homogeneous spaces, corresponding to the “essence of space as a form of intuition”, are compatible with the large-scale inhomogeneous spaces (spacetimes) of general relativity. And this required not a philosophical argument about the nature of intuition, but one formulated in group-theoretic conceptual form (Weyl 1923a,b). Eddington, on the other hand, without the cultural context of Husserlian phenomenology or indeed of philosophy generally, jettisoned the intuitional basis of transcendental idealism altogether, as if unaware of its prominence. Thus he sought a superior and completely general conceptual basis for the objective four-dimensional world of relativity theory by constituting that world within a geometry (its “world structure” (1923)) based upon a non-metrical affine (i.e., linear and symmetric) connection. He was then free to find his own way to the empirically confirmed integrable metric relations of Einstein’s theory without being hampered by the conflict of a “pure infinitesimal” metric with the observed facts about atomic spectra.

5.7 “Structural Realism”?

It has been routinely assumed that all the attempts at a geometrization of physics in the early unified field theory program shared something of Einstein’s hubris concerning the ability of mathematics to grasp the fundamental structure of the external world. The geometrical unified field theory program thus appears to be inseparably stitched to a form of scientific realism, termed “structural realism”, with perhaps even an inspired turn toward Platonism. According to one (now termed “epistemic”) form of “structural realism”, whatever the intrinsic character or nature of the physical world, only its structure can be known, a structure of causal or other modal relations between events or other entities governed by the equations of the theory. The gist of this version of structural realism was first clearly articulated by Russell in his Tarner Lectures at Trinity College, Cambridge in 1926. As Russell admits, it was the general theory of relativity, particularly in the formulation given within Eddington’s world geometry, that led him to structuralism regarding cognition of physical reality (Russell 1927: 395). Russell, however, rested the epistemic limitation to knowledge of the structure of the physical world on the causal theory of perception. As such, structural features of relations between events not present in the percepts of these events could only be inferred according to general laws; hence, posits of unobserved structural features of the world are constrained by exigencies of inductive inference. Moreover, Russell’s structural realism quickly fell victim to a rather obvious objection lodged by the mathematical Max Newman (see entry on structural realism).

In its contemporary form, structural realism has both an epistemic and an “ontic” form, the latter holding essentially that current physical theories warrant that the structural features of the physical world alone are ontologically fundamental (Ladyman & Ross 2007). Both versions of structural realism subscribe to a view of theory change whereby the sole ontological continuity across changes in fundamental physical theory is continuity of structure, as in instances where the equations of an earlier theory can be derived, say as limiting cases, from those of the later. Geometrical unification theories seems tailored for this kind of realism. For if a geometrical theory is taken to give a true or approximately true representation of the physical world, it provides definite structure to relations posited as fundamental and presumably preserved in any subsequent geometrical generalization. It is therefore instructive to recall that for both Weyl and Eddington geometrical unification was not, nor could be, such a representation, for essentially the reasons articulated two decades before by Poincaré:

Does the harmony the human intelligence thinks it discovers in nature exist outside of this intelligence? No, beyond doubt, a reality completely independent of the mind which conceives it, sees or feels it, is an impossibility. A world as exterior as that, even if it existed, would for us be forever inaccessible. But what we call objective reality is, in the last analysis, what is common to many thinking beings, and could be common to all; this common part,…, can only be the harmony expressed by mathematical laws. It is this harmony then which is the sole objective reality…. (1906: 14)

In Weyl and Eddington, geometrical unification was an attempt to cast the harmony of the Einstein theory of gravitation in a new epistemological and so, explanatory, light, by displaying the field laws of gravitation and electromagnetism within the common frame of a geometrically represented observer-independent reality. Their unorthodox manner of philosophical argument, cloaked, perhaps necessarily, in the language of differential geometry, has tended to conceal or obscure conclusions about the significance of a geometrized physics that push in considerably different directions from either instrumentalism or scientific realism.

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