#### Supplement to Kurt Gödel

## Did the Incompleteness Theorems Refute Hilbert's Program?

Did Gödel's theorems spell the end of Hilbert's program altogether? From one point of view, the answer would seem to be yes—what the theorems precisely show is that mathematics cannot be formally reconstructed strictly on the basis of concrete intuition of symbols.

Gödel himself remarked that it was largely Turing's work, in particular the “precise and unquestionably adequate definition of the notion of formal system” given in Turing 1937, which convinced him that his incompleteness theorems, being fully general, refuted the Hilbert program. (See the supplemental note to Gödel 1931 added in August 1963, p. 195 of Gödel 1986. See also Gödel's correspondence with Nagel, p. 145 and 147, Gödel 2003b. Gödel had informally convinced himself of this already in 1933, see p.52 of his *1933o.) However there are many subtleties here involving various salient features of formalizations of the notion of computability. For example, Sieg has pointed out (2006) that Gödel's identification of the general notion of formal system with Turing machines is problematic, resting as it does on an absolute notion of computable function. This is because the notion of formal system is to be defined in terms of the notion of absolute computability, whereas the notion of formal system seems to be needed in order to prove the absoluteness of the notion of computability.

In connection with the impact of the Second Incompleteness Theorem on the Hilbert program, although this is mostly taken for granted, some have questioned whether Gödel's second theorem establishes its claim in full generality. As Bernays noted in Hilbert and Bernays 1934, the theorem permits generalizations in two directions: first, the class of theories to which the theorem applies can be broadened to a wider class of theories. Secondly, a more general notion of consistency could be introduced, than what was indicated by Gödel in his 1931 paper. That is, the theorem could be extended to any formula expressing the consistency of the relevant theory.

The latter type of generalization brought to the fore the question
of the *intensional adequacy* of a theory's proof concept. We
take a moment to describe what this means. As Feferman noted in his
(1960) (following Bernays) there is an important distinction between
the two incompleteness theorems. As we have seen, Gödel's First
Incompleteness Theorem exhibits a
sentence G in the language of the
relevant theory, which is undecided by the theory. Nothing about the
correctness of the claim that e.g. Peano arithmetic is incomplete,
turns on the meaning of
G, however the term
“meaning” is construed. Feferman points out that this is
not the case with the second theorem, where the general claim, namely
that any sufficiently strong theory cannot prove “its own
consistency,” must depend on the meaning of the consistency
statement *as read by the theory*. That is, we should grant
the meta-theoretical claim that a theory *T* cannot prove its own
consistency only when there is a sentence both which *T*
“recognizes” as a consistency statement, and
which *T* cannot prove. This is not to question the legitimacy
of Gödel's second theorem of course, but rather to point to
possible limitations on its range of application—an observation
Gödel himself made in his 1931 paper, as we have
noted.

The criteria for a theory *T*'s “recognizing” its
consistency statement as such are met just in case it can be proved
in *T* that its proof predicate satisfies the three Hilbert-Bernays
derivability conditions as given in Hilbert and Bernays 1934. The
concept of provability in *T*, and thus the concept of T's consistency,
is then said to be “intensionally adequate,” that is fully
expressive of the notion of consistency involved.

In his paper Feferman treats the problem, how to show
that the derivability conditions are satisfied in relevant cases. In
particular, Feferman pointed to intensional problems connected to the
notion of axiomhood by exhibiting a non-standard though extensionally
(i.e., numerically) correct binumeration of the arithmetic
theory *T* under consideration, for which the (intensionally
incorrect) consistency statement can be proved by *T*. He then
went on to give a systematic, general treatment which ruled out such
pathological examples.

Detlefsen offered (1986) a different critique of intensional
adequacy, drawing more emphatically the distinction between the
Second Incompleteness Theorem itself, as a mathematical theorem, and
the wider, proto-philosophical claim that “every set of
propositions sufficient to make a formula of *T* a fit expression
of *T*'s consistency is also sufficient to make that formula
unprovable in *T* (if *T* is consistent).” In
Detlefsen's view, particularly the third derivability condition is
problematic and not fully justified.

Subsequent developments focused on weak arithmetic theories, that is,
the issue whether intensionally correct versions of Gödel's
Second Incompleteness Theorem exist not only for Peano arithmetic but
for weaker arithmetic theories as well, i.e., theories for which a
case can more easily be made, that they are genuinely
finitary.^{[1]}

Intensional adequacy aside, from other perspectives it would appear that the Hilbert program was not unfeasible, if a wider notion of finitary is admitted. For some those relativizations represent too radical a departure from the program in its original formulation. The reader is referred to the contemporary discussion of these matters. In particular, for a discussion of relativised Hilbert programs the reader is referred to Feferman 1988.

We end this consideration of the Second Incompleteness Theorem by
noting that there are semantic proofs of consistency of course. In
this connection a simple semantic proof of the Second Incompleteness
Theorem, which Kripke attributes to Kuratowski, might be worth
mentioning. The Kuratowski argument is the following: Set theory
cannot prove that set theory is consistent in the strong sense that
some *V*_{α} is a model of set theory. For suppose
it does. Then there is α such that *V*_{α}
is a model of set theory. Hence there is also
in *V*_{α} some β<α such that
*V*_{β} is a model of set theory. Continuing in this
way we get an infinite descending sequence of ordinals, a
contradiction. See Kripke 2009.

For further discussion, see the entry on Hilbert's Program.