Supplement to Richard Mervyn Hare

Hare’s “An Essay in Monism”

While on leave in 1940, Hare wrote twenty pages setting out “my philosophy”. When Singapore fell, he looted a ledger from Changi jail, and started writing a monograph called “An Essay in Monism”. He carried this on his back during the march, and completed it just before being released. He typed it out, making multiple copies, once he was free. He later dismissed it as “containing mostly rubbish” (Seanor & Fotion 1988: 201); even its Preface says it is “based, I know, on insufficient reading imperfectly remembered”. There are detectable influences from Alfred North Whitehead, Arthur Eddington, and—indirectly—Bertrand Russell’s neutral monism); yet it is already characteristic in its clarity, consistency, lucidity, and self-confidence. It remains very little known (but see John E. Hare 2007: 200–7), and is of interest both in itself, and for points of connection with his mature thinking. As it is only accessible within the archives of Balliol College, Oxford: it may be apt to supply a density of quotation.

A central notion, initially put to work in relating mind and matter without dualism, is rhythm, which is an activity that unites a thing with its causes and effects. The metaphysics that emerges is one of process rather than substance. The identity of a “rhythm” extends into its effects:

A rhythm is a series of occurrences which includes every effect caused by that rhythm; that is to say, a thing’s effects, or the energy which it gives off, are just as much a part of that thing’s entity as what we erroneously call its “matter”. (ch. 4, p. 28)

As Hare recognizes, “This is nonsense if we are thinking of a ‘thing’ as ‘a piece of matter’” (ch. 4, p. 30); but this changes if a “thing” is analyzable as a series of occurrences, for there is then “nothing to prevent the same occurrence being part of several different series” (ch. 4, p. 31). The reality (as on certain contemporary views of personal identity) is that a “thing” possesses not a definite boundary, but an indefinite periphery:

Within one rhythm certain occurrences are more remote (or more immediate) causes (or effects) than others. That is to say, the coherence is stronger and more obvious at the centre than on the fringe. The more remote causes of a rhythm count for less in the entity of that rhythm than the more immediate causes, and the same is true of effects. That is why in our everyday consideration of rhythms we are content to ignore its fringes and to grasp at the central part. (ch. 4, p. 33)

Descartes’ inference from the experience of thinking to the existence of a thing that thinks is rejected as importing an unreal stasis:

The fact is the cognition, not the thing cognised … The “facts” of the world are not substantial objects, but events or occurrences. In the grammar of existence, verbs are the vital words, not subjects or objects. (ch. 9, p. 82)

It is an upshot that “things” extend into one another in a way that might be represented by overlapping sets of concentric circles:

If two rhythms exist side by side in the same universe, rhythm A will in a certain degree be affected by rhythm B, and will in a certain degree affect rhythm BA’s sphere of influence extends within the boundaries of B, and the influence is not uniform, but decreases as it gets further from its source. To describe this concept we may borrow a term of Whitehead’s, “prehension”: B’s sphere of influence within the limits of A is called A’s “prehension” of B, and vice versa (ch. 7, p. 53).

This may either enhance A’s individuality or constrict it, depending on the manner in which A acts upon B:

When two rhythms prehend one another, their relations can be either friendly or antagonistic. If A influences B in such a way as to fit in with B’s rhythm, the two rhythms may be said to be in sympathy. In this case the two rhythms are united in a combined rhythm without losing their rhythmic individuality. (ch. 7, p. 54)

One corollary of this is the adoption of an externalist view of perception:

To isolate the body as something separate from our environment, is to regard perception as beginning suddenly when our bodies take part in it. But, as we have seen, cognition is a process extending right from the object to ourselves; and whatever in this process is consciously cognised by us, is cognition … Our cognition extends outside our bodies into our environment; or we may say that our bodies are merely a part of our environment; or better, that both bodies and environment are rightfully parts of our rhythms. (ch. 10, pp. 91–2)

Into this context Hare introduces talk of “value” which is not easy to interpret, especially in light of his later views. He distinguishes value from substance as he has distinguished substance from rhythm, but how rhythm and value relate is less clear:

The “factor” which determines a rhythm from another rhythm is not a factor of substance but a factor of value. A rhythm is an interpretation of the universe according to its own standard of value; that is to say, it regards the events of the universe quoad itself, and as turning towards or cohering to itself, while turning away or being distinct from other rhythms … The same occurrence may have greater value from the point of view of one rhythm, less value from the point of view of another. (ch. 4, p. 33)

This connects with the use of the word “I”, which should not be interpreted as referring to a substance:

I am not setting up an “Ego” which is something distinct from the cognition, something which would exist, even if the cognition did not take place. Things are their actions; the action is the thing. Therefore the cognition is part of me, and I do not exist apart from my experiences. By saying that this cognition has reference to something called “I”, I mean that this event called a cognition coheres in a certain direction; it has a certain value … “Cognovi” implies, not a subject and a verb, but an event cohering in a certain direction, possessing a certain value. “I” am that direction and that value. I do not exist apart from my cognitions, any more than any Rhythm exists apart from its constituent events (ch. 9, p. 83).

John Hare suggests (2007: 203 n.) that this anticipates Hare’s much later proposal (on which see § 4 above) that there is a prescriptive aspect to the meaning of “I”. It may be consistent with this that the perspective within which a rhythm identifies itself is also, and ipso facto, one within which there appear unequal values whose degree depends upon the centrality or marginality of some cognition to the process of which it is a part. Hare can never have meant to imply a freedom whereby a man might relegate an event to the margins of his life, or even expel it beyond its borders, by adopting towards it a voluntary attitude of detachment.

We meet anticipations of the later dichotomy between fact and value, cognition and volition, that links Hare to David Hume. Goodness is internally related to persons: “Goodness is Rhythm willed from within by a Person”; beauty is “Rhythm viewed from without by a Person through the exercise of sympathy” (ch. 17, p. 38). Hare already adopts the dichotomy, fundamental to his later philosophy, between cognition and will:

We say that a man cognises something when he is consciously affected by it; we say that he wills something when he consciously causes it … Cognition is the passive, will the active function of personality. (ch. 8, pp. 63–4)

A person, therefore, is “the passage of a coherent system of cognition into a coherent system of will” (ch. 8, p. 72). However, he also recognizes that will presupposes cognition:

Will is so absolutely dependent on foreknowledge, that it is hard to imagine any effective act of will without some knowledge of the future. Consider for example the act of stretching out a hand; we could not will this, unless we were conscious that our hand would obey the behest of our will … Foreknowledge therefore, although logically distinct from will, is always a constituent of any act of will. (ch. 15, pp. 22–3)

This anticipates Hare’s later insistence that a decision between alternative acts is ipso facto one between different sets of consequences:

It is the effects which determine what I should be doing; it is between the two sets of effects that I am deciding. The whole point about a decision is that it makes a difference to what happens; and this difference is the difference between the effects of deciding one way, and the effects of deciding the other. (1952: 56–7).

Hare has applied Whitehead’s term “prehension” to the overflowing of one man’s activity into the life of another. He also envisages an exercise of love and sympathy that gives him entry into another life:

The meaning of love is that two persons “get inside” one another, so that the feelings of each become the feelings of both. By Love we see through another’s eyes, hear through his ears, run with his feet, handle with his hands; and he does the same with ours … Thus it is through Love that the greatest and fullest extension of our person can be achieved, namely extension into the person of another. (ch. 20, p. 70)

Much later (see his 1978, reprinted with second thoughts in 1989a), it was to become a question for Hare whether fully entering into the mind of another is sufficient to necessitate wishing for him what he wishes for himself, or only for forming wishes for what should happen to oneself were one in his shoes.

Very much later he was to regret his inability to convey more than “feebly and aridly” supplementary reflections such as these:

The quality of mutual love and affection between people, without which our life would have few joys, cannot be had without the right dispositions; and these dispositions, therefore, are the condition of both happiness and morality. (1981: vii)

Here, within a chapter on “sin”, he is happy to follow Plato:

Successful tyrants—that is, those who use other people solely as means to their own selfish ends—have been few in history, and it is open to question whether any of them have been happy. For no man can be truly happy by himself; most human happiness is a function of our association with other men … Such association is barred to the man who has made other men hate him. The person of a tyrant is inevitably stunted. (ch. 18, p. 52)

Copyright © 2019 by
Anthony Price <>

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