Harriet Taylor Mill
Were I but capable of interpreting to the world one half the great thoughts and noble feelings which are buried in her grave, I should be the medium of a greater benefit to it, than is ever likely to arise from anything that I can write, unprompted and unassisted by her all but unrivaled wisdom.
—J. S. Mill (1977, 216)
Harriet Taylor Mill (1807–1858) poses a unique set of problems for an encyclopedist. The usual approach to writing an entry on a historical figure, namely presenting a straightforward summary of her major works and then offering a few words of appraisal, cannot be carried out in her case. This is because she worked in such close collaboration with John Stuart Mill that it is exceedingly difficult to disentangle her contributions to the products of their joint effort from his, and the few pieces that we can declare without fear of contradiction to have been written primarily by her—some of which are published, some not—are philosophically slight. In attempting to assess Taylor Mill's philosophical career, one encounters sharply conflicting reports about her intellect from people who knew her, contradictory evidence about what if any important philosophical works belong to her corpus as an author, and widely varying judgments about how much influence she exerted on Mill's thought and work.
- 1. Biographical Sketch
- 2. Contemporaries' Accounts of Harriet Taylor Mill
- 3. Taylor Mill as Author
- 4. Taylor Mill's Influence on Mill
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The woman who is today most commonly known as Harriet Taylor or Harriet Taylor Mill was born Harriet Hardy in London in October 1807. She married the pharmaceuticals wholesaler John Taylor on 14 March 1826; she was eighteen, and he was thirty nine. The couple had three children: Herbert, born in 1827; Algernon (“Haji”), born in 1830; and Helen (“Lily”), born in 1831. John Taylor died of rectal cancer in 1849, and in the spring of 1851 Harriet was married again, this time to John Stuart Mill. She suffered from various health problems affecting her nervous and respiratory systems. In 1841, for instance, she lost much of the use of her legs for an extended period (J. S. Mill 1963, 486–7). A tuberculosis sufferer, as was John—it is possible that she caught “consumption” from him (see Packe 1954, 360)—she died of a respiratory failure on 3 November 1858.
Harriet Taylor and John Stuart Mill met for the first time in 1830. Their meeting was arranged by the leader of Harriet's Unitarian congregation, the Reverend W. J. Fox. The two young people very quickly fell in love. Their conduct during the long period in which Harriet was married to John Taylor would be scandalous by contemporary standards, let alone Victorian ones. Early on, John Mill made almost nightly visits to the Taylors' home, visits that John Taylor would facilitate by going to his club. On the whole, John Taylor was remarkably tolerant of the fact that his wife was on such intimate terms with another man, but his tolerance did have some limits. In 1833, at his insistence, Harriet established a separate residence, and she lived apart from her husband for most of the rest of his life, seeing John at her convenience (Helen lived with her, Herbert and Haji with their father). In 1848, John Taylor refused to allow John Mill to dedicate The Principles of Political Economy to Harriet, although the dedication was nonetheless inserted into special copies of the book that they distributed to friends. In 1849, John Taylor began to suffer from the disease that would eventually take his life, and he asked Harriet to return home to care for him. She declined, on the grounds that her first duty was to John Mill, who at the time was suffering himself from an injured hip and temporary near-blindness. While John Mill eventually mended, John Taylor's condition only worsened, and at the end Harriet did dedicate herself to caring for her husband. In fact, she rebuked John Mill very sharply for having failed, while visiting her, to ask about her husband's health. She upbraided him even more severely for having suggested that she might write to him during an “odd time” when she might find a “change of subject of thought a relief”: “Good God, sh[oul]d you think it a relief to think of something else some acquaintance or what not while I was dying?” (H. T. Mill 1998, 360).
After John Taylor's death and their marriage, the Mills spent most of their time in their Blackheath Park home, with just Haji and Helen Taylor for company. They had already largely withdrawn from society, perhaps due to the gossip that their relationship generated. Real or perceived slights toward Taylor Mill by Mill's mother and some of his siblings after their wedding resulted in his estrangement from much of his family (on this see Packe 1954, 349–57; Jacobs 2002, 117). The Mills did sometimes interrupt their reclusion to travel, separately or together, to the south of England or to the Continent in pursuit of a more healthful climate. In late 1858, after Mill's retirement from the East India Company, they set out for Montpellier, but Taylor Mill's fragile health gave out in Avignon. Mill bought a small house there, next to the cemetery in which she was buried, where he spent a considerable portion of the remainder of his life. (He died and was buried in Avignon in 1873.)
Had Taylor Mill produced a substantial body of philosophical work that could uncontroversially be called her own, we would not need to concern ourselves with what her contemporaries had to say about her abilities; we could make our own assessment. Because she lacks such a corpus, however, and because questions about what she might have written that was philosophically significant or how much influence she might have had on Mill's intellectual career are so difficult to answer on purely textual grounds, the estimates of her intellectual powers formed by people who knew her must be taken into account.
Taylor Mill's contemporaries offer radically different impressions of her. Mill's view is already fairly clear from the lines from the dedication to On Liberty that were quoted above, but the description of her in his Autobiography is worth quoting in its entirety.
Although it was years after my introduction to Mrs. Taylor before my acquaintance with her became at all intimate or confidential, I very soon felt her to be the most admirable person I had ever known. It is not to be supposed that she was, or that any one, at the age at which I first saw her, could be, all that she afterwards became. Least of all could this be true of her, with whom self-improvement, progress in the highest and in all senses, was a law of her nature; a necessity equally from the ardour with which she sought it, and from the spontaneous tendency of faculties which could not receive an impression or an experience without making it the source or the occasion of an accession of wisdom. Up to the time when I first saw her, her rich and powerful nature had chiefly unfolded itself according to the received type of feminine genius. To her outer circle she was a beauty and a wit, with an air of natural distinction, felt by all who approached her: to the inner, a woman of deep and strong feeling, of penetrating and intuitive intelligence, and of an eminently meditative and poetic nature. Married at a very early age, to a most upright, brave, and honourable man, of liberal opinions and good education, but without the intellectual or artistic tastes which would have made him a companion for her, though a steady and affectionate friend, for whom she had true esteem and the strongest affection through life, and whom she most deeply lamented when dead; shut out by the social disabilities of women from any adequate exercise of her highest faculties in action on the world without; her life was one of inward meditation, varied by familiar intercourse with a small circle of friends, of whom one only (long since deceased) was a person of genius, or of capacities of feeling or intellect kindred with her own, but all had more or less of alliance with her in sentiments and opinions. Into this circle I had the good fortune to be admitted, and I soon perceived that she possessed in combination, the qualities which in all other persons whom I had known I had been only too happy to find singly. In her, complete emancipation from every kind of superstition (including that which attributes a pretended perfection to the order of nature and the universe), and an earnest protest against many things which are still part of the established constitution of society, resulted not from the hard intellect, but from strength of noble and elevated feeling, and co-existed with a highly reverential nature. In general spiritual characteristics, as well as in temperament and organisation, I have often compared her, as she was at this time, to Shelley: but in thought and intellect, Shelley, so far as his powers were developed in his short life, was but a child compared with what she ultimately became. Alike in the highest regions of speculation and in the smaller practical concerns of daily life, her mind was the same perfect instrument, piercing to the very heart and marrow of the matter; always seizing the essential idea or principle. The same exactness and rapidity of operation, pervading as it did her sensitive as well as her mental faculties, would, with her gifts of feeling and imagination, have fitted her to be a consummate artist, as her fiery and tender soul and her vigorous eloquence would certainly have made her a great orator, and her profound knowledge of human nature and discernment and sagacity in practical life, would, in the times when such a carrière was open to women, have made her eminent among the rulers of mankind. Her intellectual gifts did but minister to a moral character at once the noblest and the best balanced which I have ever met with in life. Her unselfishness was not that of a taught system of duties, but of a heart which thoroughly identified itself with the feelings of others, and often went to excess in consideration for them by imaginatively investing their feelings with the intensity of its own. The passion of justice might have been thought to be her strongest feeling, but for her boundless generosity, and a lovingness ever ready to pour itself forth upon any or all human beings who were capable of giving the smallest feeling in return. The rest of her moral characteristics were such as naturally accompany these qualities of mind and heart: the most genuine modesty combined with the loftiest pride; a simplicity and sincerity which were absolute, towards all who were fit to receive them; the utmost scorn of whatever was mean and cowardly, and a burning indignation at everything brutal or tyrannical, faithless or dishonourable in conduct and character, while making the broadest distinction between mala in se and mere mala prohibita—between acts giving evidence of intrinsic badness in feeling and character, and those which are only violations of conventions either good or bad, violations which whether in themselves right or wrong, are capable of being committed by persons in every other respect lovable or admirable. (J. S. Mill 1981, 193–7)
Measured praise this is not. Not for nothing does Richard Reeves describe Mill as having a “lifelong mission to deify Harriet” (2007, 206–7).
No one else who knew Taylor Mill personally spoke of her in anything like these terms, as far as we know, and indeed several of her acquaintances held her in low estimation. The Carlyles were admirers initially, but they soon had changes of heart. Jane says that Harriet was “a peculiarly affected body” who “was not easy unless she startled you with unexpected sayings” and was even “somewhat of a humbug” (quoted in Packe 1954, 325–6). Thomas comments that “She was full of unwise intellect, asking and re-asking stupid questions” (quoted in Packe 1954, 315). Harold Laski relates that “Morley told me that Louis Blanc told him that he once sat for an hour with her and that she repeated to him what afterwards turned out to be an article that Mill had just finished for the Edinburgh…. If she was what he thought, someone at least should have given us indications” (quoted in Stillinger 1961, 24–5).
Those who argue that Taylor Mill was something less than what Mill took her to be must explain how he was so misled. There is a tradition of thinking that, in essence, he was psychologically unable to resist her charms. According to Bain,it was commonly held among their contemporaries that “she imbibed all his views, and gave them back in her own form, by which he was flattered and pleased” (1882, 173). Ruth Borchard says that “Accustomed by training and experience to the acceptance of ascetic, masculine values, he was completely overpowered by her intensely feminine atmosphere” (1957, 46). And Laski speculates: “I should guess that she was a comfortable and sympathetic person and that Mill, brought up to fight Austin, Praed, Macaulay and Grote, had never met a really soft cushion before.” (op. cit.). Some writers have even advanced the idea that after the death of his domineering father James, Mill felt a need to invent another parental authority in order that he might submit to it (e.g., Trilling 1952, 118; Mazlish 1975, 286–91).
There is a vast middle territory between these extremes, and more likely than not the truth about Taylor Mill lies somewhere within it. We certainly do not want to make the mistake of uncritically accepting the views of Carlyles, of whom Rupert Christiansen writes that “however enraged they were with each other there was always the prospect of laughing together at somebody else later” (2002). But at the same time, we can hardly accept Mill's descriptions at face value, either. A loving spouse's objectivity must always be in question, and especially so in this case, considering how much his characterizations of her strain credulity and the absence of any corroborating reports.
Taylor Mill was not often described in judicious or balanced terms, but John's brother George, who knew her reasonably well, did relate to John's friend and biographer Alexander Bain that “Mrs. Taylor was a clever and remarkable woman, but nothing like what John took her to be” (Bain 1882, 166). Given the long history of bias against women in philosophy, one cannot feel entirely easy about endorsing an appraisal of any female philosopher that rates her as less gifted than did anyone who knew her well, but it is hard to resist the conclusion that Taylor Mill in fact fell somewhere in the middle ground. Of course, because Mill's praise for Taylor Mill is so extravagant, to suggest that she was less talented, noble, or generally admirable than he took her to be is not necessarily to denigrate her. It is perfectly consistent with her having been a singular person in every respect.
Philosophical reputations are usually forged through producing a body of written work. This section will discuss various works of which Taylor Mill is or might be the author or at least a co-author, including three significant works in whose generation Mill credits Taylor Mill with playing a major role: The Principles of Political Economy, On Liberty, and “The Enfranchisement of Women.”
The works of which it is possible to describe Taylor Mill as an author or co-author with little fear of contradiction are all of limited philosophical import. A handful of published pieces, such as some poems, book reviews, and an essay on the aesthetic appreciation of the seasons that were published in the Monthly Repository in the early 1830s, when Fox was its editor, have minimal philosophical content. The Complete Works of Harriet Taylor Mill, edited by Jo Ellen Jacobs, contains various drafts of unpublished essays that are in Taylor Mill's hand on ethics and social philosophy; these discuss topics that are treated in well-known works that are commonly attributed to Mill, including defenses of women's rights and tolerance and criticisms of religion (Jacobs 1998). But while at points suggestive, these pieces are also brief and indeed most are incomplete fragments. Although these drafts share thematic similarities with essays such as On Liberty and “The Utility of Religion,” they do not correspond closely with particular stretches of text in these published works. Nor are they always entirely cogent (a point also noted by Bruce Kinzer 2007, 94).
In a bibliography that he compiled of his writings, Mill describes a number of newspaper articles that appeared from the middle of the 1840s to the early 1850s—most comment on recent criminal trials—as having been co-authored by himself and Taylor Mill (MacMinn et al. 1945, 59—76). Frequently, he adds that very little of the article was his. In a like manner, he says in the entry for an 1853 pamphlet examining a proposed domestic violence bill. “In this I acted chiefly as an amanuensis to my wife” (MacMinn et al. 1945, 79). One thread that runs through many of these newspaper articles and this pamphlet is the suggestion that the law is excessively harsh where the security of property is concerned yet excessively lax when dealing with those who do violence to other persons, especially women and children. These brief but rhetorically powerful occasional pieces could not be called unphilosophical, yet by their very nature they are not the sorts of works in which one encounters philosophical discussions of any great depth or rigor.
Mill suggests that Taylor Mill was deeply involved in the composition of three works of far greater significance than those discussed above. The earliest is the Principles of Political Economy. The Principles' subtitle is With Some of their Applications to Social Philosophy. At least a third of the volume is concerned with topics that belong as much to philosophy as to economics, including the portion of the work that Harriet did the most to shape, a chapter titled “On the Probable Futurity of the Labouring Classes” (J. S. Mill 1965, 758–96). This chapter argues that when the laboring class has made sufficient moral and intellectual progress, its members will refuse to settle for mere wages any longer. They will instead insist first on profit-sharing and later on employee ownership of firms. They will even experiment with Socialist and Communist communities of the sorts depicted by Saint-Simon, Fourier, Blanc, and Owen. Mill's Autobiography states that
In the first draft of the book, that chapter did not exist. She pointed out the need of such a chapter, and the extreme imperfection of the book without it: she was the cause of my writing it; and the more general part of the chapter, the statement and discussion of the two opposite theories respecting the proper condition of the labouring classes, was wholly an exposition of her thoughts, often in words taken from her own lips. The purely scientific part of the Political Economy I did not learn from her; but it was chiefly her influence that gave to the book that general tone by which it is distinguished from all previous expositions of Political Economy that had any pretension to being scientific, and which has made it so useful in conciliating minds which those previous expositions had repelled…. The economic generalizations which depend, not on necessities of nature but on those combined with the existing arrangements of society, it deals with only as provisional, and as liable to be much altered by the progress of social improvement. I had indeed partially learnt this view of things from the thoughts awakened in me by the speculations of the St. Simonians; but it was made a living principle pervading and animating the book by my wife's promptings. (1981, 255–7)
As Jacobs reads this passage, Mill is declaring the chapter “to be written primarily by Taylor Mill” (2002, 207–8). This gloss, though, seems to overlook his statement that “she was the cause of my writing it.” Moreover, the aforementioned “forbidden dedication” of the volume refers without qualification to Mill as the author.
To Mrs. John Taylor, as the most eminently qualified of all persons known to the author either to originate or appreciate speculations on social improvement, this attempt to explain and diffuse ideas many of which were first learned from herself, is with the highest respect and regard, dedicated. (J. S. Mill 1965, 1026n2)
Even if the decision to put only Mill's name on the cover of the Principles could be explained as an expedient to win greater acceptance for the ideas within, there would have been little harm in describing her as its co-author in this dedication if she were such, especially once the decision was made only to paste it inside copies of the Principles given to personal friends. On the other hand, though, his annotated bibliography does describe the Principles as a “joint production with my wife” (MacMinn et al. 1945, 69). And Taylor Mill was actively involved in revising portions of the later editions of the Principles. For example, the second (1849) edition is considerably more favorable to Socialism and even Communism, and the impetus for this shift seems to have been a change in Taylor Mill's thinking. In a letter written to Taylor Mill early in 1849, Mill points out that she now “had marked dissent” from a passage in the first edition raising an objection to Communism that “was inserted on your proposition & very nearly in your own words.” He continues, though, that
This is probably only the progress we have always been making, & by thinking sufficiently I should probably come to think the same—as is almost always the case, I believe always when we think long enough. (J. S. Mill 1972, 8–9)
While one important chapter of the Principles would not exist if not for Taylor Mill, then, and while it is clear that she helped to edit other chapters, it is unclear whether her role in the volume's composition was substantial enough to merit calling her its co-author. It is not even entirely clear whether John thought of her as such, and if he did, whether this was true from the start or a retrospective judgment that he came to hold years later.
This brings us to On Liberty, the celebrated defense of individual freedom, which was published in the year after Taylor Mill's death. The dedication of this essay, a portion of which has already been quoted, says that “Like all that I have written for many years, it belongs as much to her as to me,” and in the Autobiography Mill elaborates on Taylor Mill's role in the essay's production.
The “Liberty” was more directly and literally our joint production than anything else which bears my name, for there was not a sentence of it that was not several times gone through by us together, turned over in many ways, and carefully weeded of any faults, either in thought or expression, that we detected in it…. With regard to the thoughts, it is difficult to identify any particular part or element as being more hers than all the rest. The whole mode of thinking of which the book was the expression, was emphatically hers…. The “Liberty” is likely to survive longer than anything else that I have written (with the possible exception of the “Logic”), because the conjunction of her mind with mine has rendered it a kind of philosophic text-book of a single truth…. (1981, 257–9)
The entry for On Liberty in Mill's bibliography, though, makes no mention of Taylor Mill (MacMinn et al. 1945, 92). Since he used the term “joint product” in the bibliography for the Principles, it is somewhat curious that he does not use it there for On Liberty as well. Mill's letters to Taylor Mill and others also speak equivocally to the question of On Liberty's production. In January of 1855, Mill writes to Taylor Mill from Rome that he has decided that a volume on liberty would be “the best thing to write & publish at present” (J. S. Mill 1972, 294). He asks her to look at an essay on the subject that he had written in the preceding year to see if it could serve as the basis for one part of this volume, and says that if her answer is yes and if his health allows “I will try to write & publish it in 1856.” In this letter, he clearly suggests that he will be the one doing the writing. (On Liberty in fact appeared in 1859.) In a reference to this projected volume in a letter of the next month, though, he says that “We must cram into it as much as possible of what we wish not to leave unsaid” (J. S. Mill 1972, 332). In letters to others, he refers to the essay as his and to himself as the one writing it (J. S. Mill 1972, 539, 581).As with the Principles of Political Economy, then, the evidence regarding Taylor Mill's claim to be regarded as the co-author of On Liberty is equivocal.
“The Enfranchisement of Women,” published in The Westminster Review in 1851, is the best candidate for a significant philosophical work authored primarily or even solely by Taylor Mill (H. T. Mill 1998, 51–73). Occasioned by a series of feminist conventions in the United States, it makes a case not merely for giving women the ballot but for “equality in all rights, political, civil, and social, with the male citizens of the community” (H. T. Mill 1998, 51). This essay contains many of the same lines of argument as The Subjection of Women, written by Mill and published in 1869, although it expresses a somewhat more radical view of gender roles than the later essay (see Rossi 1970, 41–5). It maintains that the denial of political rights to women tends to restrict their interests to matters that directly impact the family, with the result that the influence of wives on their husbands tends to diminish the latter's willingness to act from public-spirited motives. Further, it contends that when women do not enjoy equal educational rights with men then wives will impede rather than encourage their husbands' moral and intellectual development. And it insists that competition for jobs will prevent most of the problems that admitting women into the workforce would putatively cause from materializing. All of these points are common to “The Enfranchisement” and The Subjection. The major point of difference between the two is that while the Subjection rather notoriously suggests that the best arrangement for most married couples will be for the wife to concentrate on the care of the house and the children (Mill 1984a, 297–8), a position that Mill also takes in an early essay on marriage written for Harriet (J. S. Mill 1984b, 43), the “Enfranchisement” instead argues for the desirability of married women's working outside the home.
Even if every woman, as matters now stand, had a claim on some man for support, how infinitely preferable is it that part of the income should be of the woman's earning, even if the aggregate sum were but little increased by it…. Even under the present laws respecting the property of women, a woman who contributes materially to the support of the family, cannot be treated in the same contemptuously tyrannical manner as one who, however she may toil as a domestic drudge, is a dependent on the man for subsistence (H. T. Mill 1998, 60–1).
This difference is an important piece of evidence in favor of attributing the essay to Taylor Mill (although Richard Krouse points out that the essay leaves unanswered the question it raises about who is to care for the home and the children (1982, 169)). Still, not all of the evidence is on this side. In 1849, Mill urges Taylor Mill to finish a pamphlet that she was writing on the subject of women (1972, 13). Yet soon thereafter, in correspondence with the Westminster's editor about the “Enfranchisement,” he speaks of the article as if he is its author, writing for instance that “If you are inclined for an article on the Emancipation of Women, … I have one nearly ready… ” (1972, 55–6, 65–6). In an 1854 letter, Mill rather ambiguously reminds Taylor Mill that when the “Enfranchisement” is published in a projected collection of his work it will be “preceded by a preface which will show that much of all my later articles, and all the best of that one, were, as they were, my Darling's” (1972, 190). If we can draw any implication from this, it seems to be that while several arguments in the article are due to Harriet, Mill was still the actual author. But the preface that actually appeared, in the collection of Mill's writings published in his lifetime (Dissertations and Discussions), suggests (albeit vaguely) that his contribution was somewhat smaller than this; there he describes the essay as “hers in a particular sense, my share in it being little more than that of an editor and amanuensis” (J. S. Mill 1882, 93–4). (He adds that the article's authorship was “known at the time, and publicly attributed to her.”) In an 1851 letter to William Lloyd and Helen Benson Garrison, Lucretia Coffin Mott writes that she had received a copy of the essay from Harriet's son Herbert and adds “The writer of it was a Mrs. Taylor a widow who has recently married J. S. Mill.… Part of it is from his pen. Indeed, she says, he wrote it—he says, she wrote it” (Mott 2002, p. 209).
Despite the conflicting evidence, today there seems to be a general consensus that Harriet is the article's primary author, and it was excluded from the University of Toronto's Collected Works of John Stuart Mill. Some commentators do dissent from this view, however (for example, Himmelfarb, 183–6).
Whatever conclusions we reach about Taylor Mill's authorship of the works discussed in the preceding section, she might also have made important contributions to philosophy through changing the direction of Mill's writing in consequential respects. This section discusses some of the evidence for and against the proposition that she did so.
Mill himself speaks to the difficulty of separating his and Taylor Mill's contributions to their collaboration in his Autobiography:
When two persons have their thoughts and speculations completely in common; when all subjects of intellectual or moral interest are discussed between them in daily life, and probed to much greater depths than are usually or conveniently sounded in writings intended for general readers; when they set out from the same principles, and arrive at their conclusions by processes pursued jointly, it is of little consequence in respect to the question of originality, which of them holds the pen; the one who contributes least to the composition may contribute most to the thought; the writings which result are the joint product of both, and it must often be impossible to disentangle their respective parts, and affirm that this belongs to one and that to the other. (J. S. Mill 1981, 251)
Here Mill implicitly acknowledges that his hand most often held the pen, but he also suggests that Taylor Mill contributed numerous ideas to works that he was solely or primarily responsible for composing. “In this wide sense,” he continues, “not only during the years of our married life, but during many of the years of confidential friendship which preceded it, all my published writings were as much my wife's work as mine; her share in them constantly increasing as years advanced” (1981, 251).
Mill does give some indication, though, of his and Taylor Mill's relative strengths:
With those who, like all the best and wisest of mankind, are dissatisfied with human life as it is, and whose feelings are wholly identified with its radical amendment, there are two main regions of thought. One is the region of ultimate aims; the constituent elements of the highest realizable ideal of human life. The other is that of the immediately useful and practically attainable. In both these departments, I have acquired more from her teaching, than from all other sources taken together. (1981, 197)
In contrast, Mill says that his own greatest powers to lie in “the uncertain and slippery intermediate region, that of theory, or moral and political science,” including “political economy, analytic psychology, logic, philosophy of history,” etc. Mill stresses both the reciprocity of their collaborative efforts and their different manners of reaching conclusions:
The benefit I received was far greater than any which I could hope to give; though to her, who had at first reached her opinions by the moral intuition of a character of strong feeling, there was doubtless help as well as encouragement to be derived from one who had arrived at many of the same results by study and reasoning: and in the rapidity of her intellectual growth, her mental activity, which converted everything into knowledge, doubtless drew from me, as it did from other sources, many of its materials. (1981, 197)
Mill acknowledges that Taylor Mill had very little to do with his first major work, A System of Logic (first published in 1843), or with his discussions of the more technical aspects of political economy. Her areas of interest, clearly, were moral and social-political philosophy. Within these areas, though, Mill almost seems to suggest that his entire project is that of systematizing Taylor Mill's insights and incorporating them within a utilitarian framework.
During the greater part of my literary life I have performed the office in relation to her, which from a rather early period I had considered as the most useful part that I was qualified to take in the domain of thought, that of an interpreter of original thinkers, and mediator between them and the public; for I had always a humble opinion of my own powers as an original thinker, except in abstract science … but thought myself much superior to most of my contemporaries in willingness and ability to learn from everybody…. I had, in consequence, marked out this as a sphere of usefulness in which I was under a special obligation to make myself active: the more so, as the acquaintance I had formed with the ideas of the Coleridgians, of the German thinkers, and of Carlyle, all of them fiercely opposed to the mode of thought in which I had been brought up, had convinced me that along with much error they possessed much truth…. Thus prepared, it will easily be believed that when I came into close intellectual communion with a person of the most eminent faculties, whose genius, as it grew and unfolded itself in thought, continually struck out truths far in advance of me, but in which I could not, as I had done in those others, detect any mixture of error, the greatest part of my mental growth consisted in the assimilation of those truths, and the most valuable part of my intellectual work was in building the bridges and clearing the paths which connected them with my general system of thought. (1981, pp. 251–3)
Just as the people who knew Taylor Mill formed wildly divergent conclusions about her abilities, so too have different interpreters reached wildly different conclusions about the scope and significance of her influence on Mill. Some of Mill's interpreters are skeptical that Taylor Mill really made much difference to his writings. H. O. Pappe, for example, concludes his monograph John Stuart Mill and the Harriet Taylor Myth by questioning whether Taylor Mill introduced any substantial alterations whatsoever into the pattern of Mill's thought.
[Taylor Mill's] early writings evince her dependence on Mill. For the later period of their partnership we have no valid evidence to show that Harriet turned Mill's mind toward new horizons or gave an unexpected significance to his thought…. Mill without Harriet would still have been Mill. Mill married to George Eliot (or to Mary Wollstonecraft—permitting the anachronism) might have been transformed. Mary Ann Evans might have given him something new by way of independent thought and deeper feeling. Yet, considering her equality of stature, there would have been no need for him in masochistic guilt to magnify her contribution. (1960, 47–8)
Similarly, Francis Mineka says that “Neither he nor his recent biographers have convinced us that she was the originating mind behind his work …” (1963, 306). More recently, Reeves writes that “There is no reason to think that Mill's views would have been substantially different had he ended up with, say, Lizzie [Eliza] Flower—although his life certainly would have been.” (2007, 86), and Kinzer states bluntly that Taylor Mill “did not decisively alter the course of” Mill's development (2007, 111).
While this may never have been made entirely explicit, the following line of reasoning may underlie this skepticism. We can be confident that Mill was possessed of a first-rate philosophical mind. His System of Logic alone is proof enough of this. We have to decide, then, whether there were two first-rate minds in their marriage or only one, and in the absence of decisive evidence for the former possibility, one might argue, parsimony favors the latter. This would imply that Taylor Mill contributed little of value to philosophical works that Mill authored. (Someone who holds this view might even conclude that even if Taylor Mill were responsible for putting some important insights in writing, such as in the “Enfranchisement,” it is more likely that those ideas originated with Mill than with her.)
Against this “minimalist” view about the value of Harriet's input into the Mills' collaboration, other commentators have inclined toward a “maximalist” stance. Chief among these is Jacobs, whose basic interpretative approach is to take Mill's characterizations of Taylor Mill and their collaboration at face value, although she departs from this practice when she believes that there is evidence that Mill may not have given Taylor Mill the full credit she was due. For example, in an unpublished essay Taylor Mill writes that
There seems to be this great distinction between physical and moral science; That while the degree of perfection the first has attained is marked by the progressive completeness and exactness of its rules, that of the latter is in the state most favourable to, and most showing healthfulness as it advances beyond all classification except on the widest and most universal principles. The science of morals should rather be called an art…. (H. T. Mill 1998, 141)
Jacobs takes this comment to establish that Taylor Mill is the originator of Mill's distinction between the logics of arts and sciences at the end of the System of Logic, and she accuses Mill of having in this case understated Taylor Mill's contribution to one of his works (Jacobs 2002, 203n27; J. S. Mill 1973, 943–52). And while Mill states that Taylor Mill learned almost as much from him as he from her, Jacobs appears to think otherwise. In toting up the advantages of the collaboration to each of them, she notes that “Harriet administered Mill's daily life, nursed his ego, and provided him with ideas.” In return, according to Jacobs, Mill gave Taylor Mill little more than Mary Ann Evans got for herself by becoming George Eliot: she merely “acquired the freedom to write provocative articles … and to be heard as a man, with seriousness and consideration” (Jacobs 2002, 129–31).
Conservative historian Gertrude Himmelfarb also credits Taylor Mill with having made a very significant difference to Mill's philosophical output, at least during one stage of his life, but, in contrast to Jacobs, she maintains that this influence was for the worse. She decries in particular Taylor Mill's effect on Mill's views on liberty, arguing that it was only when Harriet's influence on him was at its peak that Mill embraced a simplistic liberalism grounded on his sweeping and absolute liberty principle instead of a more nuanced political theory that treats liberty as an important value but one that can be limited by other values (Himmelfarb 1974, 208–72).
To feel entirely confident about any judgment about how far Taylor Mill influenced Mill, we would need not only access to her letters which were destroyed but recordings from inside their home at Blackheath. But as with the descriptions of Taylor Mill's character and ability discussed above, there is a wide middle ground between the minimalist and maximalist assessments, and it is hard to imagine that the truth does not lie somewhere within it. One intermediate view is that of Bain, who suggests that just as Mill's friend John Sterling “overflowed in suggestive talk, which Mill took up and improved in his own way,” so Taylor Mill might have done as well (1882, 173–4). It is possible, at least, that Taylor Mill's greatest contribution to the Mills' collaboration, apart from any writing that she did herself, was to turn Mill's attention to the defense of a set progressive ideals and causes to which she was passionately attached: Socialism, women's rights, individual liberty, and above all a “utopian” view of humanity's improvability. John Robson, the editor of Mill's Collected Works, comments that “[I]n what we have of her writings, Harriet constantly has her eye on the future, even when criticizing the present; she was a woman of dreams and aspirations, and she must constantly have breathed into Mill a hopeful and expansive view of human possibilities” (1966, 178). Mill had famously been raised to be a champion of radical causes, but Taylor Mill's agenda differed in many respects from James Mill's. We should certainly not imagine that she merely declared in favor of liberty, Socialism, etc., and Mill obediently sat down and churned out defenses of them. But perhaps she could only give the sorts of reasons for these positions that intelligent people without philosophical training can typically give for their fundamental normative views. With Taylor Mill's having done this much, Mill may then have asked himself whether fuller and more satisfying arguments could be given for her stances, and found to his satisfaction that they could. By his lights, at least, this would mean arguments that rest on the principle of utility and on a conception of human nature that incorporates both his father's associationist psychology and additional insights gleaned from numerous other thinkers (Taylor Mill included) and his own singular life. This hypothesis explains the sense in which his task was that of “building the bridges and clearing the paths that connected” Taylor Mill's “truths,” which she had first arrived at “by the moral intuition of a character of strong feeling,” with his “general system of thought.” This is not necessarily to say that he held these positions just because she did, which he explicitly tells us was not the case with women's rights (1981, 253n), but rather that her strong attachment to them might have been an important part of his motivation for thinking arguments for them through in detail and setting them on paper.
Mill's reputation as a moral theorist and social-political philosopher rests on the depth and rigor of the argumentation that is presented for the positions he advocates, which is to say for his ability to navigate the “the uncertain and slippery intermediate region … of theory.” The view of how Taylor Mill might have influenced him may give her less credit for those arguments than her more ardent partisans think she deserves. But even if her largest contribution to their intellectual partnership was to inspire Mill to see what could be done by way of making a case for the views that she had adopted, she must have been able to talk sensibly about her positions and to play an active role in help Mill to articulate his arguments in writing. Bain knew Mill extremely well, and even though he says that his friend was under “an extraordinary hallucination as to the personal qualities of his wife,” and “outraged all reasonable credibility in describing her matchless genius,” he is also adamant not only that Mill “was not such an egoist as to be captivated by the echo of his own opinions” but also that he would only have been stimulated by someone with “independent resources” who had a “good mutual understanding as to the proper conditions of the problem at issue” (1882, 173–4).
No firm conclusions have been reached here as to what if any important philosophical works Taylor Mill authored or co-authored, exactly how much influence she exercised over Mill's philosophical career, or whether in the final analysis she is a significant enough figure in the history of philosophy to merit inclusion in encyclopedias of this sort in her own right. All that has been attempted is to present the wide range of answers that have been given to these questions and to suggest that the more extreme opinions both pro and con are probably the least believable. Alice Rossi appropriately castigates earlier scholarship on Taylor Mill when she observes that “one senses in Mill scholars an unwitting desire to reject Harriet Taylor as contributing in any significant way to the vigor of Mill's analysis of political and social issues unless it included some tinge of sentiment or political thought the scholar disapproved of, in which case the disliked element was seen as Harriet's influence” (1970, 44 –5). The first challenge that one faces when thinking about Taylor Mill's place in the history of philosophy today is avoiding their mistake without uncritically falling under the sway of Mill's deification mission. The second is deciding precisely what philosophical contributions she made. The available evidence about, her writing, her influence over Mill, and even her intellect and personality may be too sparse and too contradictory for this challenge to be surmountable. Taylor Mill may therefore be destined to remain an essentially contested figure in the history of philosophy.
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- “On the Probable Futurity of the Working Class,” Principles of Political Economy, Bk. 4, Ch. 7
- Helen Taylor's essay “The Claim of Englishwomen to the Suffrage Constitutionally Considered” (1867)
- Harriet Taylor, Spartacus Educational page.
I gratefully acknowledge the assistance that I have received from Matthew Montoya, Ashley Acosta, and Kurt Gaubatz.