Notes to Heaven and Hell in Christian Thought

1. Our set of three propositions is thus inconsistent in the same sense that contraries are inconsistent. Even though it is possible that all three propositions are false, it is not possible that all three of them should be true.

2. Precisely because our loving mother in this example loves both of her squabbling children equally, she will likewise try to resolve their squabble as equitably as possible, or try to compensate in some way the one who loses out, or perhaps even take away the toy from both of them in order to teach a valuable lesson. In the case of beloved children whom we love equally, we often appeal to some notion of fairness or non-retributive justice when we find ourselves unable to satisfy all of their incompatible interests.

3. For the sake of accuracy, the word “not” in Albert C. Outler’s translation has been repositioned. The original translation reads as follows: “not even if a single member of the race were saved from it, no one could rail against God’s justice.”

4. Some in the Augustinian tradition have allowed that God might in fact save all who die in infancy—not, however, because they are innocent or deserve something from God and certainly not because God owes it to them to do something on their behalf. To the contrary, dying in infancy, no less than someone’s performing good works, is merely an indication, according to these Augustinian theologians, that someone is to be numbered among the elect. Accordingly, God could justly have condemned those who die in infancy, so they claim, even if, fortunately for them, God in fact chooses not to do so.

5. Popular arguments over the issue of capital punishment illustrate the point nicely. Opponents of capital punishment often point out, quite rightly, that the execution of a murderer does nothing to bring the victim of murder back to life and, in that sense, does nothing to restore a just order. On the other side, a proponent of capital punishment might retort that society should not permit murderers to gain an unfair advantage over their victims through an act of murder; so even though we humans have no power to achieve perfect justice in this matter, we can at least prevent this additional injustice and, in addition, even the score a bit. But whatever position one takes on this issue, it seems obvious that we humans have no power to achieve perfect justice in a case of murder, because neither the murderer nor society at large has the power to resurrect the victim of murder or to repair all of the harm that a murder brings into the lives of people.

6. Interesting enough, Augustine’s understanding of justice and mercy, as we encounter it in his later writings, appears flatly to contradict his earlier commitment to the philosophical doctrine of divine simplicity: the difficult to understand idea that each attribute of God is identical not only with God, but with every other attribute of God as well. For if those in hell are the object of God’s justice but not of God’s mercy, then justice and mercy are distinct and very different attributes of God.

7. An important clarification is perhaps in order at this point. For not all who have traditionally identified themselves as Arminians are fully committed to the idea that God’s love is both unconditional in its character and unlimited in its scope. Unlike Roman Catholics, whose understanding of purgatory provides them with a good deal more flexibility on the point, many of these traditional Arminians hold that, for unrepentant sinners anyway, God’s love has a built in time limit, namely, the moment of a person’s physical death; they therefore reject the idea that God will continue striving to save sinners after this deadline has passed. Some traditional Arminians are therefore no more committed than the Augustinians are to God’s inexhaustible love for all sinners. They insist instead, even as Jonathan Edwards did, that any sinners who fail to repent before they die will discover that God’s conditional and limited love has instantaneously turned to wrath and to hatred without love. Such a view at least clarifies why the damned never repent and never vacate hell; they simply have no choice in the matter. Once God rejects them with finality, they will never again have any opportunity to repent. So in that respect, at least, these traditional Arminians no more regard hell as a freely embraced condition than the Augustinians do. More recently, however, a number of those working within a basically Arminian framework—call them free-will theists—have tried to formulate a more consistent free-will theodicy of hell, and their work also reflects a more consistent commitment to God’s inexhaustible love for all created persons.

8. It sometimes comes as a surprise to Christians that the term “final judgment” never appears anywhere in the New Testament; that is, no Greek word properly translated into English as “final judgment” ever appears there. But Buckareff and Plug also appear to be at cross-purposes with themselves when they concede the following in a footnote: “it is possible that an agent’s character may become settled [irrevocably so?] after a while. If so, the agent may find it psychologically impossible properly to respond to God’s prevenient grace” (54, n.21). As Benjamin Matheson points out, however, “this seems problematic for escapism” because the whole point of a genuine open door policy with respect to those in hell rests “on the claim that it is psychologically possible for persons in Hell to leave” (Matheson 2014, 204). If taken seriously, then, the Buckareff and Plug concession in their footnote appears to collapse their own view back into the view that Walls, Swinburne, and Manis have defended. We can nonetheless maintain the distinctiveness of our second answer simply by maintaining that, according to it, those in hell never lose forever the ability to continue sinning freely and hence never lose forever the ability to repent freely either. For an excellent statement of this view, see VanArragon 2010, 41–42.

9. One is, of course, free to stipulate in a given context any meaning for the term “freedom” that one pleases, so long as one continues to use it consistently in that context. Accordingly, one might proceed in either of two different ways at this point. One could, as recommended here, make a minimal degree of rationality an additional necessary condition of the relevant freedom. Or, one could, alternatively, identify freedom with some formulation of PAP, as Kvanvig seems to recommend, and concede that our schizophrenic young man is not morally responsible for all of his free choices and actions.

10. Some will no doubt find counterintuitive the idea that our immoral choices are sometimes more helpful than our morally proper choices are in producing a virtuous character. For libertarians often adopt, as a kind of unexamined metaphysical assumption, a picture similar to what Robert Kane sketches in the following passage:

The probabilities for strong- or weak-willed behavior are often the results of agents’ own past choices and actions, as Aristotle and other thinkers have insisted. Agents can be responsible for building their moral characters over time by their (moral or prudential) choices or actions, and the character building will be reflected by changes in the probabilities for strong- or weak-willed behavior in future situations. Each time the [alcoholic] engineer resists taking a drink in difficult circumstances, he may strengthen his will to resist in the future; and conversely, when he succumbs, his will to resist may lessen (or crumble altogether, as sometimes happens with alcoholics) (Kane 1998, 180).

Even though such a picture reflects accurately some of our experience in some contexts, there is surely another side to this particular story. Kane is right, of course, about this: one biochemical effect of alcohol on the brain, at least in the case of alcoholics, seems to be that it undermines the will to resist another drink. But alcoholism also illustrates how the desperation connected with plunging to the depths can also inspire someone to seek help, perhaps by joining Alcoholics Anonymous or in some other way. Alcoholics sometimes report, moreover, that the longer they resist temptation and keep making the right choice, the easier it is during times of stress to deceive themselves into believing that this time a couple of drinks will do no harm; and. alternatively, the more often they binge terribly and experience the destructive consequences of doing so, the easier it is to resist temptation in the future. So in that respect, their experience is just the opposite of what Kane has described.

Similarly, if there is such a thing as divine grace, then the destructive consequences of our worst choices may be the very thing that ultimately persuades us to seek whatever divine help might be available.

11. When Paul quoted the poet Epimenides of Crete in order to make the point that “in him [God] we live and move and have our being” (Acts 17:28), one might interpret this to imply that God is not only our moral and spiritual environment, but our physical environment as well. Given that interpretation, even our experience of the physical order would be an implicit experience of God.

12. Whereas modus ponens is an argument of the form: if p then q; p; therefore q, modus tollens is an argument of the form: if p then q; not q; therefore not p.

13. Although many Christians (Wesleyans, Catholics, and other Protestant Arminians) typically find Edwards’ view here nothing less than appalling, it is not without its contemporary defenders. Michael J. Hart thus writes:

… by God’s displaying eternal punishment the elect would become more grateful of their place in heaven. … The picture is this: I was just like so-and-so, yet I am exalted and they are debased, and the fact that they were just like me makes me happier than I would otherwise be at my exaltation. But why is this? One answer concerns likelihood: it is because the closer I was to them in nature and circumstances, the more likely it would be that I end up like them. So when I discover that my fate has been radically different and better than theirs, my joy over my fate enjoys greater intensity. … [Accordingly, by] reprobating a greater number to hell, the elect in heaven are permitted a great gratitude not otherwise available to them: a gratitude at being part of the few that are saved (Hart 2016, 258–259).

Like Jonathan Edwards, Hart is also a theological determinist and thus holds that God intended from the beginning to reprobate the non-elect and to bring each of them to a horrific end. Accordingly, a proponent of such a view must either deny that the elect have loved ones in hell, or deny that genuine love ties the interests of people together in the way described in section 4.1, or deny that God loves deeply even the elect in heaven. Those who believe that God’s deepest possible love extends equally to each member of the human race will also wonder how gratitude of the kind described in the above quotation is supposed to differ from human selfishness of a kind utterly inconsistent with genuine love.

Copyright © 2021 by
Thomas Talbott <>

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