Hermann von Helmholtz

First published Mon Feb 18, 2008; substantive revision Sat May 27, 2023

Hermann von Helmholtz (1821–1894) participated in two of the most significant developments in physics and in the philosophy of science in the 19th century: the proof that Euclidean geometry does not describe the only possible visualizable and physical space, and the shift from physics based on actions between particles at a distance to the field theory. Helmholtz achieved a staggering number of scientific results, including the formulation of energy conservation, the vortex equations for fluid dynamics, the notion of free energy in thermodynamics, and the invention of the ophthalmoscope. His constant interest in the epistemology of science guarantees his enduring significance for philosophy.

1. Biographical note and selective timeline

The definitive biography of Hermann von Helmholtz (1821–1894) is by his friend and associate, the mathematician Leo Königsberger. Königsberger’s biography is available in toto from Google Books, since it is in the public domain. While Königsberger’s treatment of scientific subjects can be dated somewhat, for biographical information his account is unrivaled.

Selective Timeline

1845 Joins Berlin Physical Society
1847 “On the Conservation of Force,” pamphlet
1849–1855 Professor of Physiology at Königsberg
1850 Description of an Opthalmoscope for the Investigation of the Retina in the Living Eye, Berlin: Verlag von A. Förster
1855–1858 Professor of Physiology and Anatomy at Bonn
1856–1867 Handbook of Physiological Optics, Leipzig: Leopold Voss
1858 “On Integrals of the Hydrodynamic Equations which Express Vortex-Motions,” Crelle’s Journal für die reine und angewandte Mathematik, Vol. 55
1858–1871 Professor of Physiology at Heidelberg
1863 On the Sensations of Tone as a Physiological Basis for the Theory of Music, Braunschweig: Verlag von Fr. Vieweg und Sohn
1867 Riemann’s Habilitationsrede, given 10 June 1854, “On the Hypotheses Underlying Geometry,” published posthumously by Dedekind, Abhandlungen der Königlichen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Göttingen, volume 13
1868 “On the Factual Foundations of Geometry,” Lecture in Heidelberg, published in the Verhandlungen des naturhistorisch-medicinischen Vereins zu Heidelberg.
1868 “On the Facts Underlying Geometry,” 15th volume of the Abhandlungen der Königlichen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Göttingen
1869 Correspondence with Beltrami
1870–1874 “On the Theory of Electrodynamics,” Crelle’s Journal für die reine und angewandte Mathematik, Part I, Vol. 72 (1870); Part II, Vol. 75 (1873); Part III, Vol. 78 (1874)
1871–1877 Professor of Physics, University of Berlin
1871 “The Velocity of Propagation of Electrodynamic Effects,” Berliner Akademie
1877–1887 Professor of Physics, Military Institute for Medicine and Surgery, Berlin
1878 “The Facts in Perception,” address delivered on the Foundation Day of the University of Berlin
1886 “On the Physical Significance of the Principle of Least Action,” Crelle’s Journal für die reine und angewandte Mathematik, Vol. 100
1887–1894 Founding president of the Physicalisch-Technische Reichsanstalt in Berlin
1893 “Consequences of Maxwell’s Theory Concerning the Motions of the Pure Ether,” Berliner Akademie

2. Theory of Perception

Helmholtz’s earliest study of physiology was with Johannes Müller. Müller (1801–1858) was a keen experimenter and naturalist along the lines of Ernst Haeckel and Alexander von Humboldt, sailing to the tropics to find specimens for his studies (Otis 2007, 6–14). Early in his career, Müller was also a proponent of Schelling’s Naturphilosophie. Naturphilosophie took its cue from what Schelling took to be Kant’s assertion that, while each part of an organism supported the whole, the only purpose of a living organism was itself. “Müller’s enormously influential Handbook of Human Physiology, written and rewritten between 1833 and 1844, shows his simultaneous commitments to vitalism, philosophy, and rigorous science” (Otis 2007, 21).

According to the “projection” theory of the physiology of perception, a stimulus causes its response directly. That is, our nerves are malleable, like wax, and the objects “project” signals onto the nerves directly, like a key pressed into the wax. Based on experiments in his laboratory, and on the phenomena of binocular vision revealed by the stereoscope Charles Wheatstone invented in the 1830s, Müller observed that several phenomena of the physiology of perception contradict the projection theory. One such phenomenon is stereoscopic binocular vision, in which the two images on our retinas are resolved into one image, the image we see. If images are projected directly onto the sense nerves, Müller asked, then how is stereoscopic vision possible? Müller also cited the fact that images from objects are projected onto the retina upside down, but we see them as right side up. The projection theory has no explanation of these effects.

In response to experimental data, Müller constructed the “law of specific sense energies” [Sinnesenergien]. Müller argued that each nerve is configured to receive a specific range of signals, as a radio is tuned to receive sound on a certain wavelength (of course, Müller did not use this analogy). Müller called the configuration a “specific sense energy.” Müller explained stereoscopic vision by arguing that each retina is able to perceive itself, that is, to perceive a priori the manifold, or grid, of points that can be projected onto the retina. Müller hypothesized that there was an organic correlation between the left and the right retinas of the eye (Müller 1837–1840, 2: 351–385, see also Turner 1993, 159–160). Each point on the left retina is indexed to one and only one point on the right retina. Müller argues that for each point seen in stereoscopic vision, the two signals from the corresponding points on the two retinas are projected onto a single point.

Müller’s explanation appeals to an a priori perception of the retina by itself, and to the activity of projecting two points onto a theoretical projection surface a priori. Müller tries to use Kantian philosophy to support his theory, arguing that by the “manifold accessible to pure intuition” Kant meant, or could have meant, the a priori possible manifold of physical points that could be perceived by the retina. Robert DiSalle presents evidence that this view is not Kantian (DiSalle 1993, 502ff).

From 1838 to 1842, Helmholtz studied medicine under Müller. From 1842 to 1848, while working as an army surgeon in Potsdam, Helmholtz made many trips to Berlin to work in Gustav Magnus’s library. During these trips, Helmholtz stayed in contact with fellow students of Müller’s he had met while working in Müller’s laboratory, Emil du Bois-Reymond and Ernst Brücke. In 1845, Helmholtz joined the Berlin Physical Society, which was founded by du Bois-Reymond and also counted among its members Brücke and Werner von Siemens. Du Bois-Reymond founded the Physical Society to support experiment and to banish vitalism from scientific research. For more on Helmholtz’s early career and relationship with the Physical Society, see Sulloway 1992, 14ff and 65ff, and Cahan 2012.

While Helmholtz did not contradict Müller by name in his writings on physiology, Helmholtz’s research, in Müller’s and Magnus’s labs and later in his own labs in Bonn and Königsberg, is in conflict with the doctrine of specific sense energies (see Otis 2007, 129–130). Helmholtz proposes a “sign” theory, according to which sensations symbolize their stimuli, but are not direct copies of those stimuli. While Müller explains the correspondence between sensation and object by means of an innate configuration of sense nerves, Helmholtz argues that we construct that correspondence by means of a series of learned, “unconscious inferences.”

In his sign theory of perception as expressed in his early career (1848–1868), Helmholtz argues that the mind makes a series of mental adjustments, “unconscious inferences,” to construct a coherent picture of its experiences. Helmholtz argues that spatial position, often used as a criterion to individuate objects, is an interpretation of our sensations, and not their immediate result. Again, stereoscopic vision shows that what may appear, to us, as a single image is in fact two images resolved into one. Perspective can distort size, as when one puts a finger in front of the moon. Helmholtz believes that we learn how to interpret spatial concepts through experience, which means that he has what he calls an empirical theory of spatial perception. This theory coexists, in Helmholtz’s epistemology, with his above commitment to the sign theory, according to which spatial properties are only properties of representations. Helmholtz’s invention of the ophthalmoscope in 1850–1851 contributed to his understanding of the physiology of perception (Schett 1999; for images of the original Helmholtz ophthalmoscope see De Schweinitz and Randall 1899, 172ff). Philosophically, Helmholtz’s epistemology commits him to the view that representations arise in a physical process, but are signs and not copies of their objects.

Helmholtz was inspired by the theory of Hermann Lotze (1817–1881) in his explanation of these phenomena. For Lotze, Helmholtz observes, “to the sensations from spatially distinct nerve endings correspond various determinate Localzeichen [literally: place signs], whose spatial meaning is learned” (Helmholtz 1968 [1869], 57). My various sensations of my finger are originally unrelated, but I can relate them to each other by means of the concept “my finger,” which serves as a mental Localzeichen that contains the data of all the sensations. The space of perception is a general Localzeichen that relates all possible sensations to each other. The usefulness of Lotze’s theory is that all psychological sensations are mapped directly onto mental concepts, and even space becomes a tool for constructing an interpretation of sense-data, akin to a language.

According to Helmholtz’s explanations of the physiology of perception, the qualities of sensations “belong only to our nervous system,” and we acquire our knowledge of spatial ordering through perceiving an unchanging sequence of sense impressions of the same object:

It is easy to see that by moving our fingers over an object, we can learn the sequences in which impressions of it present themselves and that these sequences are unchanging, regardless which finger we use. It is thus that our knowledge of the spatial arrangement of objects is attained. Judgments concerning their size result from observations of the congruence of our hand with parts or points of an object’s surface, or from the congruence of the retina with parts or points of the retinal image. A strange consequence, characteristic of the ideas in the minds of individuals with at least some experience, follows from the fact that the perceived spatial ordering of things originates in the sequences in which the qualities of sensations are presented by our moving sense organs: the objects in the space around us appear to possess the qualities of our sensations. They appear to be red or green, cold or warm, to have an odour or a taste, and so on. Yet these qualities of sensations belong only to our nervous system and do not extend at all into the space around us. Even when we know this, however, the illusion does not cease, for it is the primary and fundamental truth. The illusion is quite simply the sensations which are given to us in spatial order to begin with (Helmholtz 1971 [1878], 376–7).

As a concrete example of a judgment of relative spatial position, Helmholtz gives the case of someone grasping a pen in her fingers. She cannot infer directly from the sensation of the pen that it is in one place, because each finger feels only the position of the pen relative to the finger itself. She would have exactly the same sensations if her fingers were touching two or three different pens, separated in space. The belief that the pen is in one place only is based on her knowledge that his fingers are close enough together that only one pen will fit between them. As Helmholtz remarks,

When two different parts of the skin are touched at the same time, two different sensitive nerves are excited, but the local separation between these two nerves is not a sufficient ground for our recognition of the two parts which have been touched as distinct, and for the conception of two different external objects which follows. Indeed, this conception will vary according to circumstances. If we touch the table with two fingers, and feel under each a grain of sand, we suppose that there are two separate grains of sand; but if we place two fingers one against the other, and a grain of sand between them, we may have the same sensations of touch in the same two nerves as before, and yet, under these circumstances, we suppose that there is only a single grain. In this case, our consciousness of the position of the fingers has obviously an influence upon the result at which the mind arrives… What, then, is it which comes to help the anatomical distinction in locality between the different sensitive nerves, and, in cases like those I have mentioned, produces the notion of separation in space? (Helmholtz 1995 [1868], 175–6)

Helmholtz argues that perceived properties such as separation in space are well-founded inferences from two sources of knowledge: our experience, and the properties of our sense organs. For Helmholtz, knowledge of the way our physiology works in perception is essential to any epistemological account of spatial properties. Helmholtz argues that the more we know about the physiology of perception, the more accurate our inferences about our experience will be. In the case of a person grasping a pen or touching a grain of sand, Helmholtz argues that we become aware that the object touched is a single object by studying the position of our sense organs: the nerve endings in our fingers, in this case. Our awareness of distinction of spatial position, necessary for depth perception and perception of distance, is learned and not innate. Lenoir (2006) is a rich history of Helmholtz’s influences on this score, including Johann Herbart, Wilhelm Wundt, Carl Friedrich Gauss, and an analysis of Helmholtz’s theory of perception as “operationalizing” the Kantian view.

In Helmholtz’s early work, and in some later essays, perceptual space is a mental generalization of our orientation with respect to objects in space. We learn the general properties of space by discovering what spatial properties do not change when objects move, and when we move relative to the objects. The insight that the spatially relevant properties of objects are the properties that remain invariant when objects change position, or when we change position relative to the objects, is fundamental to Helmholtz’s later work on topology.

In the third part of Helmholtz’s Handbook of Physiological Optics, Helmholtz draws a distinction between nativism and empiricism in the physiology of perception. In drawing up the Handbook, Helmholtz’s “task was to survey the field of physiological optics for the purpose of writing a work that would appear as volume nine of Karsten’s Encyklopädie der Physik. The format of the Karsten series dictated that Helmholtz provide a thorough review of both past and present work, a task he performed diligently. Wishing to provide a systematic theoretical framework for his survey of the field, Helmholtz divided the major theoretical positions with respect to spatial perception into two groups, which he characterized with the adjectives empiristisch and nativistisch” (Hatfield 1991, 274–275. I follow Hatfield in translating the term “empirismus” as “empirism.”). Turner (1993) has argued that Helmholtz’s empirism was pragmatic – that Helmholtz adopted an empirist stance to meet the challenges of “imposing order on a chaotic new field of investigation” and of defending his stance in his lifelong debate with Ewald Hering (Turner 1993,155).

Significant questions in the empirism – nativism debate include how to explain perception of depth and relief (Turner 1993, 156). The “projection” theory explained relief perception by claiming that the mind interprets visual cues to construct a combined, relief picture out of two flat pictures provided by the eyes (Turner 1993, 158). By 1867, when Helmholtz published his Handbook of Physiological Optics, Helmholtz had developed his “sign” theory, according to which the brain’s construction of phenomena such as depth and separation in space is learned. This account brought Helmholtz into conflict with Hering.

Nativism [Hering’s account] is the view that at birth (or sometime thereafter, depending upon the ontogenetic timetable) the organism, upon visual stimulation, will experience a spatially organized array of colored areas. The key notion is that the disposition to have spatially organized visual experience is inborn and does not depend upon a process of learning. A nativist need not assert that an innately endowed organism will be visually competent at birth, for the visual system might become functional only after a further period of maturation. Empirism [Helmholtz’s account] is the view that at least some of the spatial organization found in the visual experience of the adult is the result of learning; it asserts that some or all of the ability to perceive a spatially organized visual world is acquired (Hatfield 1991, 276).

The debate between Helmholtz and Hering focused on several specific cases, in particular, how to account for the so-called “horopter” problem. The horopter is the set of points that the eye perceives as equidistant from the perceiving subject when the eye is focusing on a single point. The eye perceives points on the horopter as if they were lying on a straight line at a fixed distance from the eye. However, in reality the horopter line is a curve, that is, in reality the points are not equally distant from the eye.

When looking at a single object, some points on the object stimulate both eyes, but some points stimulate only the right or the left eye. The brain resolves these common and distinct stimuli into a single image (Hershenson 1999, 29–30). The fact that the brain must resolve two distinct images into one accounts for the horopter effect. When the eyes are focusing on a single point, the left and the right eyes give different inputs to the brain about objects to the left or right of the point of focus. The brain corrects for the different inputs coming from the left and the right eyes by representing them as equally distant from the eyes as the object of focus.

Hering and Helmholtz disagree, not about the empirical results or the concept of the horopter itself, but about how to explain the brain’s resolution of two images into one. Helmholtz argues that the brain adjusts the retinal images by a process of “unconscious inferences.” Helmholtz contends that a child’s brain learns to respond to stimuli as the child develops, and that the brain unconsciously adjusts itself to produce a coherent experience — for instance, to resolve retinal disparities. For recent work on unconscious inference see De Kock 2014a, De Kock 2014b, Patton 2018, Patton 2019.

Hering argues that the ability to experience objects as a single, spatially ordered image is a disposition inborn in human children, and not acquired. While children may not be born with the ability to resolve two images into one, Hering claims that the ability develops when a child grows to maturity, and is not learned. Hering argues that depth perception and stereoscopic vision are inherent physical abilities, like running or even breathing, that can be honed but are not learned wholesale from experience. In fact, to Hering, the adjustments the brain and eyes make to different inputs are automatic and involuntary, like a heartbeat. Helmholtz contends that depth perception and stereoscopic vision require reciprocal adjustment to objects and thus are skills that must be learned through experience, like shaving in front of a mirror (an example he takes from Müller, see Otis 2007, 129). When shaving in front of a mirror, one must learn to distinguish right from left in the mirror, and to turn the right or left side of one’s face to the mirror correctly, even though the apparent motion in the mirror is the opposite of the felt motion in one’s body. Helmholtz argues that the ability to shave in front of a mirror cannot be innate, because it requires learned adjustments to the properties of one’s environment, that reflections in a mirror are inverted, for instance.

Patton (2022) argues that the Helmholtz-Hering debate “revealed deep fissures in nineteenth century accounts of scientific explanation, as well as in the conception of how physiology, psychology, physics, and philosophy are related”: “Hering was a pioneer of Lamarckian explanations, arguing for an early version of the biogenetic law. Hering explains physical processes, including perception, in terms of ‘organic memory’ that is supported by ‘vital forces’ located throughout the body. Helmholtz, on the other hand, argues that vital forces are in direct conflict with the results he and others proved in the 1840s and 50s on the conservation of force.”

Otis (2007) and Turner (1993) argue that the most significant difference between Hering and Helmholtz is not in their distinct explanations of the empirical evidence. Rather, the difference is in the epistemological consequences of their higher-order commitments. If Helmholtz is right, then our access to objective properties is not direct, but constructed. In his early “sign” theory, Helmholtz argues that perceptions of objects are not impressions like the imprint of a key on wax, but are symbols or signs of their objects, as a name is a symbol of a person. For Helmholtz, the degree of resemblance between perception and object may be as remote as the degree of resemblance between a written name and the physical person to whom the name refers (Helmholtz 1882, 2:608, Helmholtz 1903, 1:41ff; cited in Schiemann 1998, 26). Hering objects strenuously to these epistemological consequences of Helmholtz’s sign theory, and argues that we have direct access to real objects in perception.

There is significant debate over the question of how far Helmholtz’s theory was influenced by Kantianism. David Galaty, Nicholas Pastore, and David Leary have argued that Helmholtz was Kantian in his approach (Galaty 1971, 159–66; Pastore 1978, 355–76; and Leary 1982, 36; cited in Hatfield 1991, 325). As Michael Heidelberger has observed recently, the Neo-Kantian Alois Riehl refers to Kant as a “man of the physiologists,” and Riehl refers to Helmholtz’s “Kantian understanding of sensory perception,” although Heidelberger himself may not read Helmholtz as a Kantian (Riehl 1876, v and 5; Heidelberger 2007, 30). Gary Hatfield and Edwin Boring have argued that Helmholtz’s empiricism outweighs his Kantianism. Boring’s classic history of psychology inaugurated the contemporary reading of Helmholtz as an empiricist or empirist (Boring 1942, chapter 15). Hatfield argues that, while Helmholtz maintained some Kantian doctrines for a time, his mature view departs from Kantianism (Hatfield 1991, 325–326), and Lenoir concurs (2006, 200–204). In a 1918 article, the Marburg Neo-Kantian Ernst Cassirer supports this mixed reading of Helmholtz. According to Cassirer, although Helmholtz’s view was “linked deliberately to Kant,” and Helmholtz was very influential in the origins of Neo-Kantianism, Helmholtz made the a priori dependent on the results of natural science, a significant departure from Kantianism (Cassirer 2005 [1918], 96). Edgar (2018) addresses the broader question of the place of Helmholtz in the neo-Kantian tradition.

One area of debate centers on the influence of Johann Gottlieb Fichte on Helmholtz’s work. Heidelberger (1995) and De Kock (2018) emphasize the influence of Fichtean idealist philosophy on Helmholtz, noting, for instance, that Fichte’s distinction between the “I” and the “not-I” is employed in Helmholtz’s analysis of perceptual experience and in the distinction between subjectivity and objectivity. Hatfield (2018) responds that Helmholtz “rejected Fichtean idealism” and was influenced more profoundly by empirical physiologists of perception, including Müller and Wundt but also Johann Georg Steinbuch and Caspar Theobald Tourtual. Hatfield argues that Helmholtz’s view in 1867 is better understood as “a form of modest realism, a kind of structural realism” avant la lettre, “and that, in 1878, he consolidated this position in a way that renders it metaphysical” (2018, 33).

Swanson (2016) has argued that the ‘predictive processing’ paradigm in contemporary cognitive and computational neuroscience has roots in Kant and Helmholtz. Predictive processing means “perception involves the use of a unified body of acquired knowledge (a multi-level ‘generative model’) to predict the incoming sensory barrage” (Clark 2015). As Swanson notes, “The current PP paradigm emerged from early work on generative models, and this work explicitly identifies itself as being directly inspired by … Hermann von Helmholtz … For example, the seminal article on the use of generative models in machine perception, titled ‘The Helmholtz Machine,’ states that ‘Following Helmholtz, we view the human perceptual system as a statistical inference engine whose function is to infer the probable causes of sensory input’” (Swanson 2016, 10; Dayan et al., 1995, 89).

Tracz (2018) defends a reading that Helmholtz is a relationalist about perceptual properties, drawing on a related argument from Allais (2015) that transcendental idealism is a form of relationalism. “Helmholtz’s relationalism should be of interest to readers of Kant, for according to one of the main strands of interpretation, Kant’s transcendental idealism treats all properties that appear in perception as relational properties” (2018, 65). Moreover, “relationalism, particularly color relationalism, is alive in contemporary philosophy of perception (e.g., Chirimuuta 2015, Cohen 2009). Despite this, the history of relationalism is rarely thematized, so Helmholtz’s views provide some historical context of interest to present work in philosophy of perception” (Tracz 2018, 65). Patton (2019, 73) adds that

While the relationalist reading of Helmholtz is certainly defensible, it is not the end of the story: restricting ourselves to an argument according to which Helmholtz only is defending contemporary relationalism would risk losing some of the force and complexity of Helmholtz’s view… for Helmholtz, habit and inference – and even deliberate interference – can change the relational properties involved, and thus change my perceptual experience… for Helmholtz, Fechner, and Weber, perceptual experience of complex phenomena like music and colored objects is not reducible to the ground-level sensory response to physical stimuli. (Patton 2019, 73)

Giulio Peruzzi and Valentina Roberti (2023) nominate Helmholtz as one of the “chief architects of the new color theory”, who defined “the first non-Euclidean line element in color space, i.e., a three-dimensional mathematical model used to describe color differences in terms of color distances”. Hyder (2009), Turner (1996), and Kremer (1993) trace Helmholtz’s engagement with the work of James Clerk Maxwell and Hermann Grassmann on color.

3. The geometry of physical space and topology

Even when he was writing about physiology, Helmholtz’s vocation as a mathematical physicist was apparent. Helmholtz used mathematical reasoning to support his arguments for the sign theory, rather than exclusively philosophical or empirical evidence. Throughout his career, Helmholtz’s work is marked by two preoccupations: concrete examples and mathematical reasoning. Helmholtz’s early work in physiology of perception gave him concrete examples of how humans perceive spatial relations between objects. These examples would prove useful to illustrate the relationship between metric geometry and the spatial relations between objects of perception. Later, Helmholtz used his experience with the concrete science of human perception to pose a problem for the Riemannian approach to geometry.

Helmholtz’s work on geometry was made public from 1868, the year he gave a lecture, “On the Actual Foundations of Geometry,” in Heidelberg, and published his “On the Facts Underlying Geometry.” The latter “astonished” the academic public, who had considered Helmholtz primarily an experimental scientist and physiologist (Königsberger 1906, 254). However, Helmholtz had initially wanted to be a physicist, and had always been alive to the mathematical consequences of his work in physiology. Riemann’s work revolutionized mathematics and physics, and philosophy by extension, and Helmholtz was perhaps the first to recognize the extent of the revolution. Indeed, Helmholtz claimed that he had come to results similar to Riemann’s, though perhaps slightly later. Although the publication of Riemann’s Habilitationsrede, “On the Hypotheses Underlying Geometry,” meant that Helmholtz’s own results would not be seen as original, Helmholtz says in his own essay that he is content that “so distinguished a mathematician [as Riemann] should have considered these questions as worthy of his attention” (Helmholtz 1883 [1868], cited in Königsberger 261). With his 1868 essay, Helmholtz saw himself as contributing to the Riemannian approach to the foundations of geometry (Königsberger 1906, 254). Helmholtz’s title, “On the Facts Underlying Geometry,” is a deliberate echo of Riemann’s “On the Hypotheses Underlying Geometry.” The difference in the titles, facts versus hypotheses, underscores the fact that while Helmholtz’s approach is very similar to Riemann’s, there is at least one significant difference.

In “On the Hypotheses Underlying Geometry,” Riemann focuses on how to determine the overall topological properties of space. Topological properties are those spatial properties of figures that are invariant under transformation, that is, that stay the same when the figures move. Riemann proves that a space of n dimensions, that is, a space determined by n continuously and independently varying magnitudes, has constant curvature, but only under the hypothesis that all spatial figures can be moved or rotated anywhere in space without changing their form, the so-called “Axiom of Free Mobility” (cf. Königsberger 1906, 260–261). For the case of astronomy, Riemann observes:

If one assumes that bodies exist independently of place, then the measure of curvature is constant overall, and then it follows from astronomical measurements that the measure of curvature cannot be distinguished from null… However, if bodies are not independent of place, then one cannot deduce infinitely small mass relationships from the relationships between large masses. In that case, between any given points in three dimensions the measure of curvature can have any random value, provided that the entire curvature of any measurable part of space is not distinguishable from null (Riemann 1892 [1854], 285, my translation).

The assumption “that bodies exist independently of place” is valid if and only if the properties of bodies remain invariant when moved. That is, if a body changes place, that is a movement, and if the body continues to have the same properties in any different place, then its properties are invariant under transformation. Riemann goes on to say that, without this assumption, the units of comparison that are the basis for astronomical and other measurements — rays of light as the shortest path between two points, rigid bodies like meter sticks as the basis of distance measurement — no longer have the invariant properties on which one can base valid measurements.

In “On the Facts Underlying Geometry,” Helmholtz investigates a related, but distinct question. He agrees with Riemann that geometry is not possible unless we can compare figures to each other and measure them, and that measurement is not possible unless at least some properties of the figures we are measuring do not change when the figures move. Helmholtz asks, what are the most general axioms of geometry that must hold for such motions, motions preserving the spatial properties of figures, to be possible?

Helmholtz presents the idea of “rigid motions” to account for these invariant properties. “Rigid motions” are those motions that preserve a set of properties of the objects. For instance, when a sphere rotates around its central vertical axis, that motion preserves the sphere’s symmetries about the x and y axes, and thus these symmetries are invariant under that particular transformation (rotation). A given object may have a group of properties that remain invariant under transformation and a group that change, that is, when objects move in a certain way they may stretch or lose symmetry about an axis. After the publication of Helmholtz’s work, Sophus Lie argued that rigid motions form groups, and described the set of rigid motions in the mathematical terms of group theory.

While Riemann tries to describe the general properties of space, Helmholtz asks what the most general geometrical axioms are that can account for our empirical measurement of objects. These will be the axioms that preserve observed rigid motions, given an underlying system of geometry. Helmholtz investigates the question of which systems of geometry (Euclidean, Lobachevskian, and Riemannian) are possible under which assumptions. Here Helmholtz makes an initial mistake, and argues that only Euclidean geometry can account for our actual physical measurements. In April 1869, Eugenio Beltrami pointed out in a letter to Helmholtz that Lobachevskian geometry could be adequate to the task under the assumption that we live in a “pseudosphere” (see Other Internet Resources). Helmholtz concedes the point immediately (Königsberger 1906, 263). In 1870, in “On the Origin and Significance of the Axioms of Geometry,” Helmholtz investigates in much closer detail the question of whether non-Euclidean geometries can be visualized. This essay, perhaps even more than “On the Facts Underlying Geometry,” was widely influential. Moritz Schlick and Hans Reichenbach engaged with Helmholtz’s views in the 1870 essay (see, e.g., Reichenbach 1920, Schlick’s notes to Helmholtz 1921). A related article, “The Origin and Meaning of Geometrical Axioms,” was published in Mind in 1878, and Russell responds to it in his doctoral dissertation.

In Space, Number, and Geometry from Helmholtz to Cassirer, Francesca Biagioli (2016) analyzes Helmholtz’s theories of geometry and of measurement, including their origins in the work of Kant, Riemann, and Gauss, and the reception, development, and extension of Helmholtz’s work through engagement with Felix Klein’s Erlanger Programm, Sophus Lie’s theory of groups, the conventionalism of Henri Poincaré, and neo-Kantian reception in Alois Riehl, Hermann Cohen, Ernst Cassirer, and Bruno Bauch. Biagioli (2016), Biagioli (2014), and Biagioli (2018) deal with the question of how Helmholtz and neo-Kantians, especially Ernst Cassirer, could claim that space is transcendental without also arguing for the universality of Euclidean geometry. Matthias Neuber (2012, 163) argues that, while “Helmholtz’s theory of space had significant impact on Schlick’s early ‘critical realist’ point of view”, Schlick ends up radically transforming Helmholtz’s account.

Marco Giovanelli (2017) argues that the mathematical core of the development of special relativity is found in the Riemannian tradition and especially in the work of Christoffel, Lipschitz, Ricci, and, later, Levi-Civitá (Giovanelli 2017, 328). Giovanelli argues that the claims for the Helmholtzian tradition as the sole progenitor of special relativity are exaggerated, and that the real development was a ‘collision’ of traditions, in the sense well known from John Norton’s paper on the Kleinian and Riemannian traditions in general relativity.

Biagioli (2023 and 2016), Darrigol (2003), Paula Cantù (2018), and Matthias Neuber (Neuber 2018a, Neuber 2018b) delve into Helmholtz’s work on the theory of measurement, including his essay “Über Zählen und Messen,” as a precursor of more recent treatments of the topic. Cantù focuses on the question of the applicability of mathematics in general, a question also found in Frege, Hale, Wright, and Batitsky, while Neuber and Biagioli (2016) focus on Helmholtz’s account of the a priori and empirical conditions for measurement in physics and mathematics. Biagioli (2023) focuses on Helmholtz’s contributions to the psychophysical problem of the measurement of sensation.

For more detailed explanations of the notions in this section, see the entry on 19th century geometry.

See Section 7 of this entry for references to work on the philosophical implications of Helmholtz’s theory of geometry.

4. Conservation laws, electrodynamics, and acoustics

4.1 Conservation of energy: 1842–1854

From 1841 to 1842, Helmholtz finished his studies with Johannes Müller in Berlin. As seen above in the section on physiology, Müller’s endorsement of experimental science was in pragmatic conflict with his commitment to Naturphilosophie, and in particular, to vitalism. According to vitalist theories, in addition to the mechanical and physical forces present in a living body, there is a “vital force” that makes the parts of the body work together as an organism. The term for momentum, vis viva, illustrates the belief. In the early part of the 19th century, Ernst Heinrich Weber argued that the so-called “vital forces” are in fact physical forces, and he argued that the most pressing problem for 19th century physiology was to explain the so-called vital forces in physical terms, and thus to banish vitalism. According to at least one account, Müller took his cue from Weber in setting problems for the students working in his lab, including Helmholtz, Emil du Bois-Reymond, Rudolf Virchow, and Ernst Brücke, although Müller knew that Weber’s view was inconsistent with his own commitments (Königsberger 1906, 25). It is evidence in favor of this view that in 1843, Müller published Helmholtz’s first essay, “On the Nature of Fermentation and Putrefaction,” written in support of Justus von Liebig’s anti-vitalist arguments against spontaneous generation, in his own journal, Müller’s Archiv.

After receiving his medical degree in 1842, Helmholtz worked as a military surgeon in Potsdam from 1843 to 1848. However, he took frequent trips to Berlin to work in Gustav Magnus’s lab, and to talk with Müller’s other former students and with Carl Ludwig. As mentioned above, in 1845 Helmholtz joined the Berlin Physical Society, which du Bois-Reymond and Brücke founded with the express intention of banishing vitalism. Also in 1845, Helmholtz took a five month leave from his work as a surgeon to take his qualifying exams. He used the time to work in the lab in Berlin, and continued to focus on the consequences of Weber’s and Liebig’s attacks on vitalism.

Liebig had focused attention on the question of whether an organism’s metabolism produces all its heat and mechanical energy. If so, then appealing to a vital force to explain these phenomena would be superfluous. Through experiments on frogs’ muscles using electrical currents, Helmholtz showed that the heat the frogs’ muscles produced was accounted for by metabolism and muscular action. He published his results in 1845, again in Müller’s journal, in “On Metabolism during Muscular Activity” (see Bevilacqua 1993, 297ff). Helmholtz realized, again in 1845, that the question of whether forces could be accounted for by mechanical means had a much more general application. The presupposition of vitalism, that there is an inexhaustible “vital force” that powers living bodies, had led some investigators to posit that there is an inexhaustible force, whether mechanical or not, that can power a machine indefinitely: a perpetual motion machine, perpetuum mobile. The realization was prompted by Helmholtz’s study of the 18th century classics of mathematical analysis: Euler, Bernoulli, D’Alembert, and Lagrange. As Helmholtz remarked years later, by the end of the 18th century these mathematicians had established the impossibility of a perpetual motion machine powered by mechanical forces:

for all purely mechanical, that is to say, for moving forces,…all our machinery and apparatus generate no force, but simply yield up the power communicated to them by natural forces, falling water, moving wind, or by the muscles of men and animals. After this law had been established by the great mathematicians of the last century, a perpetual motion, which should make use only of pure mechanical forces…could only be sought after by bewildered and ill-instructed people (Helmholtz 1995 [1854], 24).

But what about the non-mechanical forces: heat, light, electricity and magnetism? When Helmholtz started to look into the question of the character of non-mechanical forces, instead of looking for perpetual motion, he asked “if perpetual motion is impossible, what is the relationship between natural forces that must hold?”

On the 23rd of July in 1847, Helmholtz gave an address, “The Conservation of Force,” at the Physical Society. “Force” [Kraft], as Helmholtz uses it, is equivalent to the modern term “energy.” Helmholtz’s address was very well received by the Society, but Helmholtz was forced to publish it as a pamphlet after Poggendorff rejected it for his Annalen as too speculative.

Helmholtz summarizes his conclusions in the essay as follows:

The deduction of the propositions contained in the memoir may be based on either of two maxims; either on the maxim that it is not possible by any combination whatever of natural bodies to derive an unlimited amount of mechanical force, or on the assumption that all actions in nature can be ultimately referred to attractive or repulsive forces, the intensity of which depends solely on the distances between the points at which the forces are exerted. That both these propositions are identical is shown at the commencement of the memoir itself (Helmholtz 1853 [1847], 114–115; cited in Königsberger 1906, 39).

Helmholtz argues that a proof that all natural actions can be accounted for by universal action at a distance is equivalent to a refutation of perpetual motion.

In 1842–1843, Robert Mayer and James Joule had formulated principles of the conservation of energy. Their work asserted the conservation of mv2, the mass of a particle times the square of its velocity. Further, Joule and Mayer argued that heat and mechanical work are interchangeable (see Kuhn 1969, Mach 1911). Helmholtz called on Joule’s work (though he claimed to be unaware of Meyer’s) to achieve three results. As Bevilaqua (1993) sums it up, Helmholtz concluded that:

The principle of conservation of force implies that the maximum quantity of work available from a system is a determined, finite quantity if the acting forces do not depend on time and velocity; if they do so depend, or if the forces act in directions other than that joining the active material points, the “force” can be gained or lost ad infinitum; and under non-central forces, a system of bodies at rest could be set in motion by the effect of its own internal forces (Bevilaqua 1993, 315).

Kenneth Caneva (2019) argues that Helmholtz’s principle is a “creative refashioning” of the tradition of rational mechanics, especially the principles of vis viva and its conservation.  Bevilacqua argues that the main innovation of Helmholtz’s work was to unite two fields, and to anticipate the integration of potential energy into mechanics:

In the tradition of analytical mechanics, the stress had been on the conservation of vis viva; in the tradition of mechanical engineering on the conservation of work. Helmholtz, by contrast, stressed the equivalence of the two. It was the introduction of the term Spannkraft that brought the real shift in meaning: with tension forces we are very far from the concept of work and very close to that of potential energy (Bevilaqua 1993, 315).

While Helmholtz’s work was published in pamphlet form in Germany, it was picked up quickly by English scientists and published in English translation almost immediately. Helmholtz’s work became known quickly in English scientific and philosophical circles, which contributed to his lasting influence in both fields (see Cahan 2012).

Helmholtz acknowledged in his essay that earlier scientists, including Joule, Newton, Bernoulli, and Rumford, had arrived at various forms of the principle of energy conservation. In his history of mechanics, Ernst Mach argues that some form of Helmholtz’s principle was known to “almost all eminent investigators” in history (Mach 1911, 20). In his landmark study of energy conservation, Thomas Kuhn presents the work of Joule, Mayer, and others from the 1830s, which argues that heat and work can be substituted for each other quantitatively, which is a significant component of Helmholtz’s principle (Kuhn 1969, 321). Kuhn argues that the discovery of the principle of energy conservation is a case in which several scientists lay the experimental and conceptual framework for a principle together.

Kuhn does insist that Helmholtz formulated the principle. Robert Purrington observes, following Kuhn, that “There was a widely held, intuitive view that the total quantity of force (or motion) might be somehow constant, but it did not necessarily imply an ability to distinguish the vector nature of force or momentum from the scalar energy” (Purrington 1997, 105). In his “Philosophical Introduction” to the essay, Helmholtz himself argues that his task in the essay is not to find new experimental evidence or a completely new principle, but rather to explain the “unknown causes” of the phenomena from their “visible actions” according to the “laws of causality”:

The problem of the sciences…is, in the first place, to seek the laws by which the particular processes of nature may be referred to, and deduced from, general rules. These rules—for example, the law of the reflection and refraction of light, the law of Mariotte and Gay-Lussac regarding the volumes of gases—are evidently nothing more than general ideas by which the various phenomena which belong to them are connected together. The finding out of these is the office of the experimental portion of our science. The theoretic portion seeks, on the contrary, to evolve the unknown causes of the processes from the visible actions which they present; it seeks to comprehend these processes according to the laws of causality (Helmholtz 1853 [1847], 114–115; cited in Königsberger 1906, 39).

For the philosophical implications of Helmholtz’s work on the conservation of energy, see Bevilacqua (1993) and Hyder (2006 and 2009). Bevilacqua investigates two matters: Hemholtz’s synthesis of earlier work into a single principle, and his methodological distinction, evident in the above citation, between theoretical and experimental physics. Hyder investigates Helmholtz’s argument in the essay that “force functions must be definable with regard only to the relative positions of the mass-points comprising a physical system” (Hyder 2006, 1). Marshalling the Kantian antecedents of the argument, Hyder maintains that Helmholtz’s response to criticisms of “On the Conservation of Force” by Clausius in 1854 influenced Helmholtz’s later work on geometry. Hyder 2009 is an analysis of Helmholtz’s “radical critique” of Kantian geometry in the context of Helmholtz’s retention of a “transcendental element” in physics, especially with respect to the relationship between geometry and empirical determinacy (2009, 19). In contrast, Edward Jurkowitz (2010) argues that “already in his 1847 ‘Über die Erhaltung der Kraft’ one may find important aspects of [Helmholtz’s] later empiricism” (p. 39).

4.2 Acoustics, electrodynamics, and fluid dynamics: 1855–1881

In 1857, Helmholtz published “On the Integrals of the Hydrodynamic Equations which Express Vortex-Motion” in Crelle’s Journal für die reine und angewandte Mathematik. Königsberger observes that this essay was a “work of genius that proved him to be a mathematician of first rank” (Königsberger 1906, 167).

Helmholtz knew of Euler’s and Lagrange’s previous mathematical formulas describing fluid motion. Euler’s equation treated fluids as continua or fields, whereas Lagrange’s formulation treats them as discrete particles (see Emanuel 2000, 8). Helmholtz took up Euler’s equation, which gives the equations of the flow of fluids in which friction does not alter the fluid’s motion significantly (the “inviscid” fluids). Lagrange had remarked that Euler’s equations did not work for “viscous” fluids, in which the fluid’s friction alters its movement, because Euler’s equations work only on the assumption of a general conservation law, and viscous forces are not conservative (Farge 2004, cf. Königsberger 1906, 167).

Helmholtz, who had formulated a conservation law ten years previously in “On the Conservation of Force,” entered the field at this point. Helmholtz’s own work had concentrated on applying the notion of a potential to fluid movement. But viscous forces do not have potentials. Helmholtz decided to disregard the viscous forces themselves, but also to redefine the problem without appealing to potentials. He defined the “vorticity” of a fluid in a small region as its average rotation or circulation in that region: the rotation at each point on the boundary of the region divided by the area of the region, which is described mathematically as the curl of the velocity of the fluid. (In technical terms, Helmholtz evaluated this as the curl of Euler’s equation.) The vorticity of a fluid at a single point is a vector quantity. Helmholtz introduced two further idealizations. A “vortex line” is the tangent to the vorticity vector of a point in the fluid. If you draw vortex lines on the boundary of a region of the fluid, and then make the region around each line indefinitely small, the lines will converge to “vortex filaments,” now also called “vortices.”

Helmholtz was able to prove three theorems in fluid dynamics using these notions. In their modern expression, they are:

  1. “Fluid particles originally free of vorticity [rotation] remain free of vorticity.
  2. Fluid particles on a vortex line remain on a vortex line, so that vortex lines move with the fluid.
  3. The strength of the vorticity is proportional to the length of the vortex line” (Fuhs and Shetz 1999, 736).

These laws are used still in fluid dynamics, though they are modified slightly from Helmholtz’s original version (they are cited above in the contemporary, modified form).

Helmholtz’s work on fluid dynamics is significant philosophically because Helmholtz’s equations requires ideal fluids, that is, fluids that are free from viscosity and perfect continua. Helmholtz’s equations are a paradigm case of mathematical idealizations in physics. For a discussion of Helmholtz’s work in this context, including his discussions with Gustav Kirchhoff and the notion, very significant in contemporary fluid dynamics, of Helmholtz-Kelvin instability (or Kelvin-Helmholtz instability), see Eckert 2006, 19ff. For accounts of Helmholtz’s use of idealizations in physics and of the development and significance of his work in fluid dynamics, see Patton 2009 and 2012.

In 1863, a professor of physiology at Bonn, Helmholtz published his pioneering work on sound waves, acoustics, and musical theory in On the Sensations of Tone as a Physiological Basis for the Theory of Music. One of the most significant discoveries in On the Sensations of Tone is the precise mathematical description of “sound vibrations in an open cylindrical tube” (Königsberger 1906, 206). Helmholtz begins On the Sensations of Tone with a description of noise as we experience it in ordinary life:

We perceive that generally, a noise is accompanied by a rapid alternation of different kinds of sensations of sound. Think, for example, of the rattling of a carriage over granite paving stones, the splashing or seething of a waterfall or of the waves of the sea, the rustling of leaves in a wood (Helmholtz 1954 [1863], 7).

To analyze the “rapid alternations” of these noises into their component vibrations, Helmholtz constructed the “Helmholtz resonator.” Helmholtz began by removing the bottom of an empty, uncorked wine bottle, stretching a membrane over the bottom, and fastening the membrane with a band. Then he suspended a single thread, with a bit of wax on the end, from the band so that it hung halfway down the membrane. If the thread is agitated, the bit of wax hits the membrane as a drumstick hits a drum. Based on experimental evidence and mathematical reasoning, Helmholtz argued that there will be a single tone, the “prime tone,” that is the tone at which the membrane vibrates at the highest frequency, based on the thickness and size of the membrane. By performing experiments, Helmholtz was able to distinguish the prime tones of various membranes. Then if he played music or made noise, the vibration of the membranes would reveal the component vibrations of the sound.

Then Helmholtz had the idea of constructing more sophisticated resonators, made of spheres or cylinders of glass or metal. The resonators narrow to a small, hollow point at one end, and have a circular opening at the other. Helmholtz placed a small piece of hot wax at the small end, let it cool, and then inserted it into his ear or the ear of a subject. The prime tone of such a resonator is determined by its own composition and by the sympathetic vibrations of the ear. If a sound other than the prime tone of the resonator plus ear system is played, the listener hears only muffled noises, but “if the proper tone of the resonator is sounded, it brays into the ear most powerfully” (Helmholtz 1954 [1863], 43). Again, using resonators allows an experimenter to distinguish the component vibrations of music or ordinary noises, by first determining the prime or proper tone of the resonator, and then determining, using the resonator, whether the music or noise contains that tone.

Heller (2012) considers Helmholtz’s most enduring contributions to be his theories of dissonance and musical harmony (p. 441). In the theory of pitch, Heller analyzes a debate between “Helmholtz and Georg Ohm on one side and Rudolf Koenig and August Seebeck on the other”, which engaged physicists and instrument makers alike for decades (441ff.). Heller’s work provides an appreciation of the strengths and weaknesses of Helmholtz’s work from the perspective of modern physics and acoustical theory. Deutsch 1984 provides a complementary perspective on Helmholtz’s place in the history of the physiology and psychology of music perception.

Hui 2011 and especially 2012 are detailed histories of research in psychophysics and in acoustics in 19th century Germany, which illuminate not only the social and cultural context, but also the debates over scientific advances and experimental results.

It is typical of Helmholtz that, even as he was working on acoustics, he realized that his work on sound waves could apply to related wave phenomena, if supplemented with mathematical reasoning and experimentation. Recent work on electrodynamics supported the conclusion that electricity was a wave phenomenon. In 1845, Faraday had demonstrated the connection between electric and magnetic phenomena. In 1856, Wilhelm Weber and Rudolf Kohlrausch discovered the ratio between electromagnetic and electrostatic units of charge (Assis 1994, 18). If he could describe sound vibrations in a cylindrical tube, Helmholtz reasoned, similar equations might be successful for describing the motion of electrical waves around a circular boundary.

In 1861, Helmholtz gave a lecture, “A Universal Method of the Transformation of Problems of Electrical Distribution,” to the Society for Natural History and Medicine at Heidelberg. Helmholtz was unaware that, in letters to Liouville, William Thomson (Lord Kelvin) had achieved the same results that he had, but he was told of this immediately afterward. Helmholtz, who had met Kelvin in 1855 and had been corresponding with him since 1856, acknowledged Kelvin’s priority in the Transactions of the Heidelberg society in 1862, and wrote to Kelvin to ask whether he would be willing to publish his results about the “distribution of electricity at a circular edge” (Königsberger 1906, 206). Kelvin responded with his own results. Between 1861 and 1864, James Clerk Maxwell postulated that light was an electromagnetic wave in the ether (Assis 1994, 18). In 1864, Helmholtz traveled to England. During the trip, Helmholtz met with Kelvin, John Tyndall, George Stokes, James Joule, Michael Faraday, Thomas Huxley, Thomas Graham, Max Müller, and Maxwell. He visited Graham’s, Maxwell’s, and Kelvin’s laboratories. By the end of the 1860s, Helmholtz was well informed on the experimental and theoretical basis of the new electrodynamic theory in England.

Alisa Bokulich (2015) explores the analogies that Maxwell and Helmholtz draw between hydrodynamics and electrodynamics, arguing that their methods give “insight into debates about the representational and explanatory power of mathematical models” (p. 28). Susan Sterrett (2017) “provides a critical history of the concept of physically similar systems”, including the use of the concept in Helmholtz’s theoretical hydrodynamics.

In 1870, Helmholtz published the first Part of “On the Theory of Electrodynamics,” “Equations of Motion of Electricity in Conductors at Rest,” in Crelle’s Journal für die reine und angewandte Mathematik. In the essay, Helmholtz supported Maxwell’s work, but criticized Wilhelm Weber’s electrodynamic equations, charging that Weber’s equations posit an infinite kinetic energy, which contradicts Helmholtz’s conservation law of 1847. Weber and Helmholtz disputed the question throughout the 1870s. Over the next several years, Helmholtz published two more Parts of “On the Theory of Electrodynamics,” in which he responded to Weber and continued to support Maxwell’s assertion that light is an electromagnetic wave in the ether. The debate between Helmholtz and Weber did not reach a conclusion until the end of the 1880s, when the explanation of electromagnetic force in terms of action at a distance between particles in the ether gave way to the field theory.

5. Thermodynamics, the least action principle, and free energies: 1881–1887

In 1880, Helmholtz became the director of the Institute of Physics in Berlin. Between 1881 and 1884, Helmholtz attacked the question of how to integrate energy conservation and Maupertuis’s principle of least action to describe thermodynamic and chemical processes.

Over the 19th century, the application of the least action principle dominated the approach of analytical dynamics to physical problems. Lagrangian mechanics seeks to determine the trajectory of a system of particles over time by solving Lagrangian equations for the system. These equations are formulated using the least action principle. In the Lagrangian formalism, a system of particles follows a path that minimizes the action over time. Lagrange’s equations can be applied easily to systems of polar coordinates and of Cartesian coordinates alike, a reason that the Lagrangian formalism was adopted preferentially over the 19th century.

While the Lagrangian formalism is well adapted to evaluating mechanical systems of particles, it is not as well suited to evaluating some transfers of energy, which involve calculations over a vast multitude of molecules. The Hamiltonian formalism is better suited to this task. The Hamiltonian equations also evaluate the action in a system, but use an integral sum of the momenta of the elements of the system. In the simplest case, the Lagrangian deals with the velocity of a particle and the Hamiltonian with the momenta of the particle. The Hamiltonian gives a minimum value for a function over any path given the initial and end states of the action. Thus, the Hamiltonian formalism yields the same result, namely the mathematical determination of the path taken by a system.

The Hamiltonian expression of the momenta of the system can be derived from the Lagrangian, and vice versa, using a Legendre transform. In fact, the Hamiltonian just is the Legendre transform of the Lagrangian for any given system. The formalisms are equivalent, but there are some situations, including evaluating heat transfer, in which the Hamiltonian is preferred.

In 1882, Helmholtz gave an address, “The Thermodynamics of Chemical Processes,” at the Berlin Academy. Up until Helmholtz’s address, chemical reactions had been explained by “chemical forces” or “affinities” between chemical substances, measured quantitatively by the heat developed during a chemical reaction. Gustave Coriolis had clarified the notion of work as the product of force over distance in 1821, and this notion was in common use by the late 19th century. In his address, Helmholtz “proved that affinity was not given by the heat evolved in a chemical reaction but rather by the maximum work produced when the reaction was carried out reversibly” (Kragh 1993, 405). However, while kinetic and mechanical energy can be converted into heat in every case, only in restricted cases can heat be converted into kinetic and mechanical energy. Hence, the equations describing chemical processes involving heat could not always be reversed. These are the conditions under which the Legendre transform could not be applied, and thus the Hamiltonian could not be determined for that system.

In particular, the equations for a system containing heat as a variable contain entropy as a variable quantity. Entropy is an inconvenient variable, difficult to control for and hold constant as one can hold temperature, pressure, and volume constant. The Legendre transform allows a researcher to convert equations containing entropy into equations expressed only in terms of temperature, pressure, and volume. The Legendre transform can be applied correctly only under certain conditions, which must be specified.

Helmholtz proposed the notion of a “free energy” to account for cases involving heat and entropy. The Helmholtz free energy is defined as FETS, where E is energy, T is temperature, and S is entropy. The free energy equation yields a quantity, F, that is independent of heat and entropy. Many equations involving F and not T or S are fully reversible, and so Helmholtz’s work allowed for the application of the Hamiltonian to many chemical processes. Hence while “Helmholtz was neither the sole nor the most important contributor” to theoretical chemistry, “his thermodynamic theory of 1882–1883 was the pioneering work on which much of the new theoretical chemistry rested” (Kragh 1993, 406).

For discussions of the philosophical and scientific implications of Helmholtz’s work in thermodynamics, see Kragh 1993 and Campisi 2005.

6. The Berlin School of Physics: 1878–1894

By the end of the 1870s, the experimental basis of electrodynamics had been established, but mathematics lagged behind. In memoirs of his training, Arnold Sommerfeld recalls that until the 1880s, the laws of electromagnetic phenomena were constructed using unwieldy extensions of Coulomb’s, Biot-Savart’s, and Weber’s generalizations of Newton’s laws (Sommerfeld 1952, 1–2). Further, although the relationship between electric and magnetic phenomena had been established, there was no direct empirical evidence for the existence of electromagnetic waves.

Between 1870 and 1887, Helmholtz was Director of the Institute of Physics at Berlin University. Between 1880 and 1933, the following scientists worked in Berlin: “Max Planck [Helmholtz’s student] and Albert Einstein above all, also Gustav Robert Kirchhoff, Friedrich Kohlrausch, Emil Warburg, Walther Nernst, Max von Laue, James Franck, Gustav Hertz, Erwin Schrödinger, Peter Debye” and others (Hoffmann 1998, 1).

Perhaps the most significant relationship Helmholtz had with a student or colleague was with Heinrich Hertz. Beginning in 1878, Hertz did research as a graduate student in Helmholtz’s and Kirchhoff’s laboratories. In 1879, Helmholtz set a prize problem for the Prussian Academy of Science: “To establish experimentally any relation between electromagnetic forces and the dielectric polarization of insulators” (von Harnack 1900, 617, cited Hoffmann 1998, 6). While Hertz was very interested in the problem, he put it aside in 1879 to pursue other work. In 1880, Hertz graduated and took a position as Helmholtz’s assistant. From 1886 on in his own laboratory in Karlsruhe, Hertz performed his now-famous experiments, which Hertz himself acknowledged were prompted by Helmholtz’s prize question, demonstrating the existence of radio waves (which are a kind of electromagnetic wave). Hertz “discussed his progress and results immediately and in great detail with Helmholtz” (Hoffmann 1998, 6).

Hertz’s experiments and their consequences finally laid to rest the disputes between Helmholtz and Wilhelm Weber. Among those consequences was the death of Helmholtz’s view that electromagnetism is a kind of action at a distance, and the replacement of the action at a distance view with a field theory, “one of the major turning points in the history of physics” (Heidelberger 1998, 9). Since Hertz revealed empirical evidence for the existence of electromagnetic waves, “the sources of the electrodynamic effect are not anymore to be sought in agents that are hidden from our view but in the surrounding medium” (Heidelberger 1998, 17). While Helmholtz supported Maxwell’s view that electromagnetism was a wave in the ether, Helmholtz explained wave propagation by means of action at a distance. Hertz demonstrated that electromagnetic waves were perturbations in a medium, which at the time was thought to be the ether, and which later was re-conceived as a field. More importantly, Hertz explained the propagation of electromagnetic waves directly “from the interactions themselves,” based on his empirical data, and thus did not need to appeal to actions at a distance (Buchwald 1994, 265ff).

Although Hertz’s results were in conflict with his own theory, Helmholtz supported Hertz’s career with unflagging enthusiasm until Hertz’s death at the age of 37. Recent scholarship by Jed Buchwald emphasizes the influence of Helmholtz’s methods and theory on Hertz’s discoveries (Buchwald 1994).

In 1888 Helmholtz assumed the founding directorship of the Physikalisch-Technische Reichsanstalt, an institute for the study of physics and industrial technology in Berlin founded in part by Helmholtz’s lifelong associate Werner von Siemens. For a comprehensive history of the institute that illuminates the history of Helmholtz’s later career, see Cahan 1989. Helmholtz retained the post until the end of his life.

For philosophical treatments of the shift from action at a distance to field theory, and from Helmholtz to Hertz, see Heidelberger 1998 and Leroux 2001. See also Purrington 1997.

7. Epistemology

In 1921, 100 years after Helmholtz was born, Paul Hertz and Moritz Schlick brought out an edition of Helmholtz’s epistemological writings: Schriften zur Erkenntnistheorie. This edition made available “On the Origin and Significance of the Axioms of Geometry,” “On the Facts Underlying Geometry,” “Numbering and Measuring from an Epistemological Viewpoint,” and “The Facts in Perception.” Schlick’s part in the selection of work having to do with geometry and empirical measurement is significant. Schlick, a close associate of Einstein’s, saw the relevance Helmholtz’s work had for Einstein’s theory. For a discussion of the influence of Helmholtz on the early career of Einstein, see Cahan 2000, 70ff.

Schlick and Paul Hertz assess the relevance of Helmholtz’s work as follows: Helmholtz’s “classic works on physics — one may for example recall the energy principle or his work on vortex motions — stand at the end of lines of development… his work seems for science at its present stage to be something completed and left behind. There is only one field, but a very important one, to which this does not apply: it does not hold for Helmholtz’s epistemological studies” (Hertz and Schlick 1977 [1921], xxxiv). In his Notes on “On the Origin and Significance of the Axioms of Geometry,” Schlick sees the “chief epistemological result” of Helmholtz’s work in the replacement of the Kantian necessary a priori with a judgment that “Euclidean space is not an inescapable form of our faculty of intuition, but a product of experience” (Schlick’s note to Helmholtz 1921 [1868], 35).

For a thorough discussion of the anti-Kantian implications of “On the Origin and Significance of the Axioms of Geometry,” see DiSalle 1993, 516ff. DiSalle discusses Helmholtz’s famous debate with the Kantian J. P. N. Land, as does David Hyder (Hyder 2006, Land 1877). DiSalle also mentions that in 1972, Jürgen Ehlers, Felix Pirani, and Alfred Schild “derived the metric of general-relativistic spacetime from assumptions about falling bodies and light rays” (DiSalle 1993, 520n). Ehlers, Pirani, and Schild note that their method “has some similarity to Helmholtz’s derivation of the metrics of spaces of constant curvature” (Ehlers et al. 1972, 65).

Despite Schlick’s conviction that Helmholtz’s view is antithetical to Kantianism, Helmholtz’s notion that the a priori in space consists of the manifold of possible orientations in space has inspired new readings of Kant’s a priori. This influence comes partly through the mediation of Hans Reichenbach, whose reading of Helmholtz was significantly different from Schlick’s (Reichenbach 1920). Reichenbach and Schlick both pointed out the relationship between the views of Helmholtz and those of Poincaré, though Schlick realizes that Helmholtz is not a conventionalist and Reichenbach may not have done (see Schlick’s note 40 to Helmholtz 1921 [1868], 34). For a discussion of Helmholtz’s influence on Michael Friedman’s reading of Kant, also influenced by Robert DiSalle, see Friedman 2000. Also see Friedman 2001, Chapter One.

In The Mechanics of Meaning, David Hyder traces discussions of Helmholtz’s theory regarding “sensation-spaces and their relation to the philosophy of space and perception” by Boltzmann, Poincaré, Carnap, Russell, and Weyl (Hyder 2002, 19n). De Kock 2013 is an analysis of the problem of externality in Helmholtz’s theory of perception. Biagioli (2014) analyzes Helmholtz’s debate with Albrecht Krause over the status of geometrical axioms; more generally, Biagioli’s work illuminates Helmholtz’s relationship to Poincaré and to Holder. Darrigol 2003 also places Helmholtz’s work in context, including with respect to related work by Grassmann, Fechner, and Wundt. Darrigol’s focus is Helmholtz’s theory of number and measure in physics and mathematics.

In Hermann von Helmholtz’s Mechanism, Gregor Schiemann sees Helmholtz’s work in the sciences as characteristic of a shift from the early modern to the modern tradition, as emblematic of the “relativization of claims to validity” of scientific knowledge, the “loss of certainty” characteristic of the modern attitude toward science.

The influence of Hertz, and indirectly Helmholtz, on Wittgenstein is argued by many. Brian McGuinness, Wittgenstein’s biographer, and Peter Hacker, in Insight and Illusion, are perhaps the first to have so argued (see, e.g., Grasshoff 1993, 243, Hacker 1986, 2–4). Gerd Grasshoff traces the development in Grasshoff 1993, arguing that Hertz and Boltzmann were the first to develop a “picture theory,” according to which physical and linguistic theories give us pictures [Bilder in the original German] of the world. Hertz’s and Boltzmann’s picture (Bild) theories go well beyond Helmholtz’s view. Helmholtz argues that the constraints on using Bilder to construct scientific explanations are given by physical experience and natural science, and Hertz and Boltzmann argue that these constraints are determined mathematically. However, according to this interpretation, the historical roots of the picture theory can be found in Helmholtz’s substitution of the “sign theory” for nativistic explanations (see, e.g., Schiemann 1998, Patton 2009). According to Helmholtz’s “sign” theory, our physical perceptions are images or symbols that do not resemble their objects directly. Michael Heidelberger and Jean Leroux argue as well for the influence of Helmholtz’s sign theory on Hertz’s picture theory in Heidelberger 1998 and Leroux 2001. See section 2 for a detailed discussion of the sign theory.

In his early writings, Helmholtz defends a broadly Kantian methodology against a more far-reaching idealism. In “On the Relation of Natural Science to Science in General”, Helmholtz opposes Kant to Hegel. Helmholtz argues that for Kant “a principle discovered a priori was a rule applicable to the method of pure thought, and nothing further; it could contain no real, positive knowledge” (Helmholtz 1995 [1862], 79). For Hegel, on the other hand, “not only the physical phenomena, but even the actual world…were the result of an act of thought on the part of the creative mind” (ibid.). As a result, according to Helmholtz, Hegel attempted to unify the human and the natural sciences (the Geistes- and the Naturwissenschaften).

The question of the independence of the methods of the human sciences, prominently including history, from the physical sciences became the theme of heated debate over the 19th century. Wilhelm Dilthey (1883 [1989]) defended the independence of the methods of the human sciences, while Wilhelm Windelband (1980/1894) argued that only the natural, physical sciences are “nomothetic,” or law-governed, and thus genuinely scientific (see Beiser 2012 and Patton 2019 for more detail on this debate and its history).

In an essay on the relation of the natural sciences to science in general, Helmholtz observes that it is true that the human sciences became increasingly scientific over the first half of the 19th century. As a result, “the opposition between them and the physical sciences has become less and less marked” (Helmholtz 1995 [1862], 81). Helmholtz argues that nonetheless there is a profound difference, and that,

In short, there is no denying that, while the moral sciences deal directly with the nearest and dearest interests of the human mind, and with the institutions it has brought into being, the natural sciences are concerned with dead, indifferent matter, obviously indispensable for the sake of its practical utility, but apparently without any immediate bearing on the cultivation of the intellect (Helmholtz 1995 [1862], 81).

Helmholtz then addresses the old question of the “dispute of the faculties” — is it better to separate the study of the natural sciences from all others? He concludes that the logical induction characteristic of natural sciences must always be supplemented with the aesthetic induction of the human sciences, which draws conclusions about human character and behavior (Helmholtz 1995 [1862], 85). Helmholtz concludes that the best outcome for human knowledge is to encourage the strengths of aesthetic and logical induction, to maintain the presence of both in the same academy, while keeping their foundations and methods strictly separate. The Hegelian program of methodological and conceptual unification must give way to a separation between the Geisteswissenschaften and the Naturwissenschaften.

Helmholtz observes that what he sees as the attempt by the Hegelian philosophy to legislate for natural science resulted in the following impasse:

That in the moral sciences traces of the activity of the human intellect and of the several stages of its development should present themselves, was a matter of course; but surely, if nature really reflected the result of the thought of a creative mind, the system ought, without difficulty, to find a place for her comparatively simple phenomena and processes. It was at this point that Hegel’s philosophy, we venture to say, utterly broke down. His system of nature seemed, at least to natural philosophers, absolutely crazy…. The philosophers accused the scientific men of narrowness; the scientific men retorted that the philosophers were crazy. And so it came about that men of science began to lay some stress on the banishment of all philosophical influences from their work… Thus, it must be confessed, not only were the illegitimate pretensions of the Hegelian system to subordinate to itself all other studies rejected, but no regard was paid to the rightful claims of philosophy, that is, the criticism of the sources of cognition, and the definition of the functions of the intellect. (Helmholtz 1995 [1862], 79–80)

Helmholtz concludes that once natural scientists, physiologists of perception such as himself, entered the philosophical fray, “the path of future investigation was basically prescribed by the inductive methods of the natural sciences” (ibid. 394). Helmholtz’s work in epistemology epitomizes the return to the methods of the natural sciences in the mid-19th century. See Patton (2019) and Schiemann (2013) for more on the background of changes to the approach to the sciences over the 19th century.


Primary Literature by Helmholtz

  • 1853 [1847], “On the Conservation of Force,” translation by John Tyndall, Scientific Memoirs, London.
  • 1854, “On the Interaction of the Natural Forces,” in Science and Culture: Popular and Philosophical Essays, ed. David Cahan, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1995, 18–45. (Lecture delivered February 7, 1854, at Königsberg.)
  • 1862, “On the Relation of Natural Science to Science in General,” in Science and Culture: Popular and Philosophical Essays, ed. David Cahan, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1995, 76–95.
  • 1892, “Goethe’s Presentiments of Coming Scientific Ideas,” in Science and Culture: Popular and Philosophical Essays, ed. David Cahan, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1995, 393–412.
  • 1863, On the Sensations of Tone as a Physiological Basis for the Theory of Music, trans. by Alexander J. Ellis from the fourth (1877) edition, New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1954. First German edition published Braunschweig: Verlag von F. Vieweg & Sohn.
  • 1867, Handbuch der physiologischen Optik, Leipzig: Leopold Voss. Published in parts from 1856 to 1866, then published in toto in 1867 as Volume Nine of the Allgemeinen Encyclopädie der Physik, ed. Gustav Karsten. Second revised edition of 1896, Leipzig: Leopold Voss, available entire from Google Books.
  • 1883 [1868], “Über die Thatsachen, welche der Geometrie zu Grunde liegen,” in Wissenschaftliche Abhandlungen, Volume II, Leipzig: Johann Ambrosius Barth, 618–639. Originally published in the Nachrichten von der Königl. Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Göttingen, No. 9 (3 June).
  • 1868, “The Recent Progress of the Theory of Vision,” in Science and Culture: Popular and Philosophical Essays, ed. David Cahan, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1995, 127–203. Originally published in the Preussische Jahrbücher, Volume 21.
  • 1869, “Über das Ziel und die Fortschritte der Naturwissenschaft,” in Das Denken in der Naturwissenschaft, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1968.
  • 1878, “The Facts of Perception,” in Selected writings of Hermann von Helmholtz, edited, with an introduction, by Russell Kahl. Middletown, Connecticut: Wesleyan University Press, 1971.
  • 1882, Wissenschaftliche Abhandlungen, Three volumes: second volume 1883, third volume 1895, Leipzig: Johann Ambrosius Barth.
  • 1894, Introduction to Hertz 1894.
  • 1903, Vorträge und Reden, Two volumes, fifth edition, Braunschweig: F. Vieweg u. Sohn.
  • 1921, Schriften zur Erkenntnistheorie, Moritz Schlick and Paul Hertz (eds.), Berlin: Julius Springer.
  • 1921, Hermann von Helmholtz. Epistemological Writings. The Paul Hertz/Moritz Schlick Centenary Edition of 1921, newly translated by Malcom Lowe. Robert S. Cohen and Yehuda Elkana (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1977.
  • 2017, Hermann von Helmholtz. Philosophische und Populärwissenschaftliche Schriften, Michael Heidelberger, Helmut Pulte, and Gregor Schiemann (eds.), Hamburg: Meiner Verlag.

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Other Internet Resources


Collaborative work and discussion with Clinton Tolley, Scott Edgar, Gary Hatfield, Susan Sterrett, Martin Kusch, Michael Heidelberger, Liesbet de Kock, and Francesca Biagioli, among many others, has made my grasp of Helmholtz’s views more precise. Discussions with Michael Forster on the methods of the natural and the human sciences provided valuable leads for that section. Thanks are due to Emily Carson, Michael Hallett, and Alison Laywine for their aid with my very early work on Helmholtz, and to Stephen Menn for suggestions for revisions. Link Swanson, M. Steinfels, Eric Schliesser, and David Hyder have recommended work and suggested corrections. Especial thanks are due to Clark Glymour for detailed and very helpful comments on the first draft of this entry.

Copyright © 2023 by
Lydia Patton <critique@vt.edu>

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