Supplement to Ibn Bâjja [Avempace]

Annex 2: Aristotle’s on the Soul in the Arabic tradition

There were at least two Arabic versions of the book On the Soul circulating, an ancient version from the 9th century, and a later one by Ishaq Ibn Hunayn (d. 910). The translations and their Latin and Hebrew versions show an intricate relationship.

The older version was edited by A. Badawi (Aristutalis fi-n-nafs, Cairo: Maktabat al-Nahḍah al-Misriyyah, 1954). The beginning of the manuscript is misleading since it attributes the translation to Ishaq Ibn Hunayn (d. 910) who is the author of the later version, or most of it. It is not his known terminology, and loan-words are frequent. As possible author ‛Abd al-Masih Ibn Na‛ima al-Himsi, who lived in the first half of the IX century CE, has been suggested.

Avicenna wrote annotations on the book On the Soul, (At-ta‛liqat ‛alà hawamish Kitab an-nafs li-Aristatalis, Badawi 1947: 75–116). He was using a manuscript which, for the most part, was the later translation. However, when it comes to De anima 431 a 14 we read: “Ishaq Ibn Hunayn translated the copy [of the text] to this point. From here on it is another translation with many corrections by the commentator” (Badawi 1947: 109, note 1).

This observation matches with the statement made by Ibn an-Nadim in his Fihrist (composed 987) that Ishaq Ibn Hunayn translated the book On the Soul twice (1871: vol. 1: 251), and that the first time, the translation was not complete for a small part, illa shay’an yasiran.

Michael Scotus translated Averroes’ Long Commentary on the Soul from Arabic into Latin in the XIII century (Crawford 1953). The commentary includes the text of the book On the Soul in the form of lemmas. Averroes used two Arabic translations; he preferred the translation by Ishaq Ibn Hunayn, but he quoted the older one as alia translatio also in nine passages (Crawford 1953: 46, 86, 284, 452, 469, 480, 514, 519, 526), going through the entire book.

Zerahya ben She’atiel translated Aristotle’s De anima from Arabic into Hebrew in Rome in the year 1284, and Gerrit Bos edited his translation (1994). The Hebrew version begins ascribing the Arabic translation to some Hunayn but says, at 431a 14, that “What Ishaq Ibn Hunayn translated from this treatise is being completed with [following] translation of Abu ‛Isà Ibn Ishaq from Syriac into Arabic:” (Bos 1994: 127: 325–324). Bos follows M. Steinschneider and identifies Abu ‛Isà with ‛Isà Ibn Zur‛a (d. 1008) but we should not forget that confusions over names are frequent. Ishaq Ibn Hunayn (d. 901) is the son of another famous translator, Hunayn Ibn Ishaq (d. 873), who mainly translated medical texts.

Although the remark coincides with that in the Ta‛liqat of Avicenna, we only can put forward that the text of the Ta‛liqat until 431a 14 was the same used by Averroes and by Zerahyah, i.e., the translation by Ishaq Ibn Hunayn. After 431a 14, the text used by Avicenna (d. 1037) would be completed with the old one. By contrast, Averroes (d. 1198) and Zerahya (in 1284) both relied on a text which was completed with a translation from Syriac into Arabic made by Ibn Zur‛a (d. 1008).

But we can ascertain first, that the newer version is extant in both its Latin and Hebrew versions, that its main part is by Ishaq Ibn Hunayn and that its last part could be by Ibn Zur‛a, and second, that the older version is extant complete in its Arabic original and then in a few Latin fragments of the so called alia translatio. I give here these examples taken from the version after 431a 14:

  • In 431a 14
    1. Scotus – Ishaq Ibn Hunayn: Et in anima sensibili inveniuntur ymagines secundum modos sensuum (Crawford 1953: 468).

      Hebrew: U-ba-nefesh ha-medabberet yimmaṣu dimionot ‛al dimion mi-mine ha-ḥushim (Bos 1994: 127).

      However the Latin rendered “sensible” and the Hebrew “rational” in this place, so there maybe a mistake in the Latin manuscripts.

    2. Scotus – alia translatio: Apud autem animam rationabilem ymago est quasi res sensibiles (Craword 1953: 469).

      Arabic: Wa-amma ‛ind an-nafsi an-nâṭiqati fa-t-takhyîlu bi-manzilati al-ashyâ’i l-maḥsûsati (Badawi 1954: 77: 7–8)

  • In 431b 17–19

    1. Scotus – Ishâq Ibn Hunayn: et cogitatio nostra in postremo erit utrum possit intelligere aliquam rerum abstractarum, cum hoc quod ipse est abstractus a magnitudine, aut non. (Crawford 1953: 479).

      Hebrew: Ve-yihyeh maḥshavat-nu ba-aḥarito be-she-im yihyeh efshar lo she-yaskil shum davar min ha-‛inyanim ha-mufshaṭim ‛im she-hu mufshaṭ min ha-giddul im lo. (Bos 1994: 128).

    2. Scotus – alia translatio: et in postremo prescrutabimur utrum intellectus, essendo in corpore,non separatus ab eo, possit comprehendere aliquod eorum que separantur a corporibus aut non (Crawford 1953: 480)

      Arabic: Wa-sa-nanẓuru akhîran in kâna yumkinu l-‛aqla wa-huwa fî l-jism, idrâku shay’in min mufâriqâti l-ajsâdi, aw laysa yumkinuhu dhâlika (Badawi 1954: 78: 12–13).

      The Scotus – Ishâq Ibn Hunayn version uses cogitatio, the Hebrew agrees and reads maḥshavah, but the Arabic reads ̒aql, with the other version, intellectus, faithful to the Greek nous.

  • In 432b 30–433a 1

    1. Scotus – Ishaq Ibn Hunayn: ut multotiens opinantur aliquid esse delectabile aut timorosum et non mittimur ad timorem; cor autem movetur quando aliud membrum delectatur. (Crawford 1953: 514).

      Hebrew: kemo mah she-ye’amen harbeh ba-davar min ha-devarim she-hu o ‛arev o mefaḥed, ve lo bi-shloaḥ ‛al ha-paḥad; omnam ha-lev yitno‛a‛ ke-she-yimmaṣe’ [ever] aḥer ha-hana’ah. (Bos 1994: 132).

    2. Scotus – alia translatio: multotiens cogitat intellectus in aliquo timoroso aut in aliuo delectabili, sed non propter hoc erit timor aut delectatio; cor autem movetur motu timoris, sed non ex intellectu (Crawford 1953: 514).

      Arabic: wa-kathîran mâ yatafakkaru al-‛aqlu fî shay’in mukhîfin aw fî shay’in mulidhdhin fa-lâ yakûnu l-khawfu ‛an amrin wa-lâ li-l-ladhdhati ḥarakata; fa-inna l-qalba yataḥarraku ḥarakata l-khawfi, wa-laysa dhâlika ‛an il-‛aqli (Badawi 1954: 81: 10–12).

      Intellectus is found only in the alia translatio, and the Arabic has it. Although the standard Greek edition does not mention nous, it is clearly intended here.

  • In 433a 25

    1. Scotus – Ishaq Ibn Hunayn: Et desiderium movet motu qui non intrat cogitationem. Et desiderium est aliquis appetitus (Crawford 1953: 518).

      Hebrew: Ve ha-ta’awah tani‛a tenu‛ah einah nikneset be-mahshavah. Ve-ha-teshuqah hi’ ta’awah aḥat. (Bos 1994: 133)

    2. Scotus – alia translatio: Appetitus autem movet sine cogitatione, quia appetitus est modus desideri (Crawford 1953: 519)

      Arabic: wa-amma ash-shahwatu fa-innama tuḥarriku bi-ghayri fikrin li’anna ash-shahwata inmma hiya ḍarbun min ash-shawqi.. (Badawi 1954: 82: 17–18) .

  • In 433b 21

    1. Scotus – Ishaq Ibn Hunayn: Et dico modo universaliter quod corpus movetur modo consimilitudinis. Ubi enim est principium, illic etiam finis, sicut motus girativus. In hoc enim invenitur gibbositas et concavitas, illud autem finis, hoc autem principium (Crawford 1953: 525).

      Hebrew: V-omer ‛atah bi-klal ki ha-guph yitna‛e tenu‛ah keliit, ki be-maqom she-tihyeh ha-hatḥalah sham gam ken tihyeh ha-‛amidah, kemo ha-tenu‛ah ha-kilulit. Ki ba-zeh yimmaṣe’ ha-gibbonut we-ha-ḥalalut, omnam yihyeh oto takḥlit ve-omnam zeh tihyeh hatḥalah (Bos 1994: 134).

      We cannot but conjecture that Ishaq translated the Greek gigglymos “hinge-joint” as lawlab, “spiral”, following Themistius kamâ tanqalibu l-jihâtu fî l-lawlab ‛alà t-tabdîl wa-l-miḥwaru thâbitun (“and the lynchpin is stable”, Lyons 1973: 223, ll. 10–11) because Ishaq is also the translator of Themistius’ Paraphrase. Scotus seems to have understood its meaning right but not Zerahyah.

    2. Scotus – alia translatio: Dicamus igitur breviter quod motor es quasi habens eandem dispositionem in suo principio et in suo fine, sicut illud quod digitur Grece gigglimus. Est enim in eo gibbositas et concauitas, et unum eorum est finis et aliud principium (Crawford 1953: 526).

      Arabic: Fa-inna nakhtaṣiru fa-naqûlu bi-ijâzin inna l-muḥarrika ka-âlatin huwa alladhî bi-ḥâlin wâḥidatin min bad’i-hi wa-nihâyatihi, mithla ma yusammà bi-l-yûnânîyatin jinjilmûs, fa-inna fî-hi aḥadun (sic) wa-thaniyatan: fa-aḥadu hadhayni nihâyatun wa-l-âkharu bad’u-hu (Badawi 1954: 83: 19–21).

      The Arabic and the Latin run parallel, in an approximate way, up to gigglimus and thereafter the Hebrew follows the Greek but the Arabic diverges and becomes unintelligible.

As for the text transmitted by Avicenna’s Ta‛liqat, Gätje did not hesitate to identify the first part, i.e., that reaching until 431a 14 (Badawi 1947: 109, note 1) with the later translation preserved in the lemmas of the Long Commentary, and in the Hebrew translation. In addition, A.L. Ivry (2001) utilized Averroes’ Middle Commentary on the Soul and reinforced Gatje’s position. Gätje however found enough evidence to identify the second part with the older translation (Gätje 1971, p. 38) and aligned with R. Frank who already in 1958 argued that the last part of the third book was none other than the version edited by Badawi.

The issue remains open, and Elamrani-Jamal holds the view that there were three translations, but different from those here mentioned. Elamrani-Jamal takes into consideration the above mentioned statement made by Ibn an-Nadim and affirms that 1) the first translation done by Isḥaq Ibn Ḥunayn is preserved in the glosses of Avicenna, 2) the complete translation transmitted by its Hebrew version and by the lemmas of Scotus’ Latin version could be the second translation of Isḥaq, but Elamrani-Jamal is not sure and calls it anonymous, and 3) the translation published by Badawi (1954) and preserved in the references to alia translatio in Scotus’ Latin version, (2003, 351) is by an anonymous translator.

The main difficulty for establishing a third translation on the basis of Avicenna’s Ta‛liqat is not only the scarceness of the fragments but also their approximate, not literal, character. For instance, if we take the longest fragment above, Badawi 1954: 83: 19–21, and check it with the parallel passage in Frank’s inventory (1958, p. 239), in the Ta‛liqat (Badawi 1947: 114: 12–14) we read:

Ayyu anna al-âlata allatî bi-hâ yuḥarriku sh-shawqu yajibu an takûna ‛uḍwan fî l-wasaṭi, huwa al-bad’u wa-ilayhi l-intihâ’u, ka-l-markazi wa-l-miḥwari (approximative 433b 21–22).

The presence of the term âlah, “instrument” points to the older version, since the term is not present in the later one. We can consider it as circumstantial evidence in favor of the thesis of Frank and Gätje, but not in favor of a third translation. As for the clarifying comparison ka-l-markazi wa-l-miḥwari, “like the center and the axis”, it echoes Themistius’ words wa-l-miḥwar thâbit (Lyons 1973: 223, 11) which translated his original tēn peronēn menousan (“and the linchpin is stable”, Heinze, 121. 12–13). Therefore, the question arises whether Avicenna was relying here more on Themistius’ Paraphrase of On the Soul than on Aristotle’s book. But there are no compelling reasons to suspect that Avicenna was not reading the same or similar version that Averroes and Zerahyah did.

As a result of these observations, we should establish one first anonymous translation, that edited by Badawi, a second translation by Ishaq Ibn Hunayn which is the source of the Latin and Hebrew translations, and a third translation maybe by Ibn Zu‛ra, partially recorded, which completes the second. We do not know which translation Avempace was reading. By contrast, we know that Averroes had two translations at hand and that he preferred the second by Ishaq Ibn Hunayn to the old one.

Copyright © 2018 by
Josép Puig Montada <>

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