Notes to Ibn Sina [Avicenna]

1. This entry is based on, and sections 3 and 4 are adapted freely from, Gutas 2014a, “Coda,” pp. 359–386, to which the reader is referred for fuller presentation and documentation of the theses stated here. The codes in parentheses following the first mention of a work by Avicenna refer, for purposes of identification, to its serial number in the inventory of his writings in that publication, from which are also taken most of the translations of the cited passages.

2. It should be borne in mind that in the early Islamic period, as also in antiquity and (for the most part) late antiquity, philosophy and science were synonymous. Philosophy was a generic term that referred both to what we call science and also to the humanities, as is obvious from the work of Aristotle himself (metaphysics and biology and physics, and also politics and poetics) and from the classification of the different parts or subjects of philosophy given below in Section 1.1. To avoid using the unwieldy term philosophy/science every time, the two words are used interchangeably, asking the reader to remember that what is meant by them both are the subjects that we treat in all three of our classification of the sciences: humanities (what we call philosophy, ethics, rhetoric, literature/poetics), social sciences (politics, economics), and hard sciences (biology, math, etc.).

3. The year 980 (370 of the Hijra) that is traditionally given in some sources is based on a miscalculation (Gutas 1987–1988/2014b-II).

4. Avicenna treats the subjects of traditional practical philosophy cursorily at the end of The Cure and primarily in terms of legislation by a prophet. Elsewhere he gives ample indications that had he treated the subject in the traditional way he would have used the books entered above in square brackets. For the Graeco-Arabic household management (oeconomics) tradition see now the texts collected by Swain 2013. For Avicenna’s views on practical philosophy see section 4 below.

5. Of the two modern European translations, the one in French by Goichon 1951 follows Tusi’s guidance more closely, while the one in English by Inati 1984, 1996, and 2014, commendable as it is for the effort, requires work.

6. That is, in the eyes of Avicenna, who thought that “beliefs accepted on authority [that is, the authority of the revealed sacred text] concerning those things which are known only through their causes posses no intellective certainty” (GS 5, De anima, 250; transl. Gutas 2014a, 184, cited below), and hence do not constitute science, no matter how they are argued for. From antiquity to this day, thinkers would agree with Avicenna that science is only the rational and open-ended inquiry into reality and not the justification of immutable and unnegotiable pre-determined theses accepted on the basis of a revealed authority. That some scholars have a broader conception of philosophy so as to include some theology within it is based on the semantic difference we hold today between the terms “science” and “philosophy”, in such a way that “philosophical theology” would be a meaningful term with accepted (or at least acceptable) referents, while “scientific theology”, if meant seriously and not expressing some fringe position, would be more problematic and in need of specification. But for antiquity and the middle ages, and certainly until Avicenna, when science was philosophy and vice versa, as stated above in note 1, such a broader conception of science/philosophy could not be maintained. For philosophers like Farabi and Avicenna, the revealed text had to be accommodated to science (or explained away by it), and not the other way around as was increasingly the case with the paraphilosophical developments in Islamic intellectual history after Avicenna.

7. The Arabic term ittiṣāl that Avicenna uses is erroneously translated by some as “junction” (most recently by Geoffroy et al. 2014, p. 96, “jonction”). Junction means joining, and to join means “to bring together so as to make continuous or form a unit” (dictionary definition). There is nowhere any indication or text by Avicenna that says that the human soul becomes one with the active intellect, or, as in the case of the commentary on Metaphysics Lambda (Geoffroy et al. 2014, 58 and 96, note 44), with the First principle; that would imply, first, that the human rational soul loses its identity as it unites with the active intellect (or, blasphemously, with the First), second, that it knows all intelligibles, like the active intellect, once it becomes one with it (for how would then the human soul, now undifferentiated from the active intellect, be able to acquire only one of the myriad intelligibles that the latter thinks always?), and third, that all this happens—essentially the human soul becoming divine once it has united with the active intellect or the First—while it is still in the body! This is a misrepresentation of Avicenna’s ideas.

“Contact”, ittiṣāl, is a metaphorical way of describing (and this can be described only metaphorically, since both the human rational soul and the active intellect are immaterial substances and there is no word to describe the “contact” of two immaterial substances) how the human soul relates to the active intellect when the former acquires an intelligible which by its very nature is actually thought of atemporally by the active intellect, or, to use another metaphor, is “stored” in it since the active intellect is the only location where intelligibles can actually exist in perpetuity (when we are not thinking them). Avicenna actually explains, in the very passage in the commentary on Lambda just cited, what this “contact” entails as he paraphrases Aristotle; he says, “and as for ‘what understands itself, it is’ the substance ‘of the intellect as it acquires the intelligible, because it becomes intelligible’ right away just as if ‘it touches it’ (yulāmisuhu), for example” (Geoffroy et al. 2014, 59, cited also below in the concluding section). Here the word “touching”, yulāmisuhu, explains “contact,” ittiṣāl. Now this is all Aristotle, when he states in the same passage in Lambda, 1072b21, that the intellection of the intelligible by the intellect happens by the one “touching” the other, thigganōn. This Greek word was translated, very properly, by yulāmisuhu, and this is what Avicenna is quoting. It is quite likely that this use of the touching metaphor by Aristotle (also employed elsewhere by him) first suggested to Avicenna to use the word ittiṣāl to describe this relation between thinker and thought at the moment of thinking. What the metaphor means in Aristotle is described as follows by W.D. Ross: “The metaphor of contact in the description of simple apprehension … in 1072b21. Its implications are (1) the absence of any possibility of error …, (2) the apparent … absence of medium in the case of touch. To thigein [touching] means an apprehension which is infallible and direct” (W.D. Ross, Aristotle’s Metaphysics. A Revised Text with Introduction and Commentary, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1958, II.277). This is what Avicenna manifestly understood by it—he was an excellent student of Aristotle, no less than Averroes, just more original—and how he used it; and that is why knowledge of an intelligible acquired at the end of a syllogistic process when the middle term is guessed correctly—expressed metaphorically when the human intellect comes into contact with the active intellect—is infallible and direct. Reading “junction” or “union” in Avicenna, mystical or otherwise, is not supported either by the language or thinking of Avicenna.

8. This is the author’s translation of the Arabic translation, since this is what Avicenna read, in Akasoy and Fidora, 2005, pp. 560–561. It follows, with slight amendments, D.M. Dunlop’s translation given there.

9. The Arabic in Avicenna’s text here, as in Usṭāth’s translation of the Metaphysics, which he follows, reads, fa-in kāna l-ilāhu abadan ka-ḥālinā fī waqtin mā, which must be supplemented as follows to make acceptable Arabic, as done in the translation: fa-in kāna <ḥālu> l-ilāhi abadan ka-ḥālina fī waqtin mā (without this supplement the Arabic would mean, “if the deity is always like our state sometimes,” which makes little sense literally). The addition of the word ḥāl stands for the Greek οὕτως ἔχει, and the sentence then corresponds perfectly with the original Greek, εἰ οὖν οὕτως [εὖ] ἔχει ὡς ἡμεῖς ποτὲ ὁ θεὸς ἀεί, and Themistius’s paraphrase, which Avicenna was following closely, fa-in kāna mā huwa li-llāhi dāʾiman bi-manzilati mā huwa la-nā fī baʿḍi l-awqāti, (Badawī 1947, pp. 17–18) where the repeated corresponds to the repeated ḥāl in Usṭāth’s translation. Since the word ḥāl is missing from all the available witnesses of Usṭāth’s translation (assuming the available editions are accurate), it must have fallen out of the text very early in its transmission (as a primitive error). By contrast, the word εὖ in the Greek is not translated in the Arabic (and it is thus secluded in the text above) but this is due to its absence in the Greek manuscript used by Usṭāth, as it is also absent in the extant Greek manuscript J (and in Themistius’s paraphrase as well), in whose tradition the Greek exemplar for Usṭāth’s translation and the manuscripts of Themistius must have belonged.

Copyright © 2016 by
Dimitri Gutas <>

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