Notes to Implicit Bias

1. For research on implicit social cognition and consumer products, see Maison et al. (2004) and Perkins & Forehand (2012); for self-esteem, see Greenwald & Farnham (2000) and Zeigler-Hill and Jordan (2010); for food, see Friese et al. (2008) and Mai et al. (2011); for alcohol, see De Houwer et al. (2004) and Houben and Wiers (2008); and for political parties and values, see Galdi et al. (2008) and Nosek et al. (2010).

2. For accessible introductions to philosophical questions about implicit bias, see Kelly & Roedder (2008), Kelly et al. (2010b), Brownstein & Saul (2016 a,b), and Beeghly & Madva (forthcoming).

3. Cogent histories of these twin roots are found in Dasgupta (2004), Payne & Gawronski (2010), and Amodio & Devine (2009). Another important precursor to contemporary research on implicit bias is Modern Racism Theory (McConahay et al. 1981; McConahay 1982), which argues that “old fashioned” explicit racism has been channeled into more socially acceptable beliefs about public policy, such as affirmative action and desegregation programs.

4. For a functionalist account of implicit bias, which similarly remains agnostic about certain psychological features of implicit representations, see Johnson (ms).

5. In this study, black participants on average showed no preference between black and white faces. In other studies, roughly 40% of black participants demonstrate an implicit in-group preference for black faces over white faces, 20% show no preference, and 40% demonstrate an implicit out-group preference for white faces over black faces (Nosek et al. 2002; Ashburn-Nardo et al. 2003; Dasgupta 2004). This finding upends the view that in-group favoritism is the primary driver of implicit bias. Rather, it appears that implicit bias is driven by a combination of in-group favoritism and sensitivity to the value society places on particular groups.

6. In this way, these approaches posit cognitive structures similar in key ways to Millikan’s (1995) “Pushmi-Pullyu” representations and Clark’s (1997) “action-oriented” representations, both of which are said to simultaneously describe the world as being a certain way and direct a certain response to stimuli.

7. On the idea of “intelligent” implicit attitudes/aliefs, see also Schwitzgebel (2010), Nagel (2012), and Currie and Ichino (2012). On the flexibility and “intelligence” of automatic states, see Dreyfus & Dreyfus (1992), Arpaly (2004), and Railton (2009). Further back, central work in phenomenology (e.g., Merleau-Ponty 1945/2013) and American pragmatism (e.g., James 1890/1950) have both focused on the intelligence of habit and “body knowledge.”

8. Propositional processes could just as well be called rationally sensitive, inferential, or truth-apt processes. This would perhaps avoid confusion between associative and propositional processes and associations and propositions. For example, propositions can serve as the inputs to associative processes (e.g., encountering the proposition, “I don’t want to grow up” can activate another proposition, “I’m a Toys R Us kid,” regardless of whether one judges the proposition, “I don’t want to grow up, therefore I’m a Toys R Us kid” to be true). APE uses the term “propositional processes” because these processes are typically concerned with the validation of propositions, which have been transformed from the inputs provided by associative processes (e.g., from negative gut feelings toward φ to the proposition “I dislike φ”).

9. See Del Pinal et al. (2017) and Del Pinal & Spaulding (2018) for an account of implicit bias congenial to a belief-based metaphysics, but that does not rely upon positing contradictory beliefs. See also the symposium on Del Pinal and colleagues’ view (at the Philosophy of Brains Blog).

10. Note that this is a different use of the term “propositional” than is found in RIM and APE (§2.2). See footnote #8.

11. But see Madva (2012) for argument that associatively-structured states can form and change rapidly. Note also that Levy (2014) argues that implicit attitudes may be propositionally structured without being beliefs.

12. Proponents explain the unintuitive nature of SBF by claiming that most people think they only have the beliefs that they consciously know they have. Mandelbaum (2014) writes, people will both believe that dogs are made out of paper and believe that dogs aren’t made out of paper, but they’ll only think they have the latter belief because they have access to the judgment that accords with that belief.

13. SBF is a psychofunctional theory that attempts to identify a state in cognitive science that shares a “spiritual similarity” with the folk concept of belief (Mandelbaum 2014).

14. I focus on epistemology and implicit bias per se. For important work on epistemology and prejudice more generally, see Haslanger (2000), Fricker (2007), Anderson (2012), and Begby (2013).

15. This finding is consistent with the confabulation literature, which shows that agents often act for reasons of which they are unaware. See, for example, Nisbett & Wilson (1977). For a view dissenting from Gawronski and colleagues (2006), see Krickel (2018).

16. For CV studies, see Bertrand & Mullainathan (2004) and Moss-Racusin et al. (2012). For grading studies, see Harari & McDavid (1973). For publication bias, see Peters & Ceci (1982). For related discussion of reasoning errors due to implicit bias, see Hundleby (2016).

17. See §4.2 for discussion of interventions to combat implicit bias.

18. For discussion of evolutionary explanations of racial categorization, see Machery & Faucher (2005).

19. Relevant too are arguments that agents can be thought of as responsible for automatic praiseworthy (rather than blameworthy) actions. See, for instance, Arpaly (2004), Snow (2006), Brownstein & Madva (2012a), and Brownstein (2018).

20. Results of shooter bias tests show that white participants are consistently more likely to “shoot” unarmed black men than unarmed white men and to fail to shoot armed white men than armed black men (Correll et al. 2002; Payne 2001; Payne et al. 2002; Mekawi & Bresin 2015).

21. Some of what follows in §5 is adapted from more extensive discussion of these issues in Brownstein (forthcoming), Brownstein et al. (2019), and Brownstein et al. (ms).

22. See also the roundtable discussion on the IAT hosted at Philosophy of Brains blog.

23. This is not to say, however, that research on implicit social cognition is free from some of the causes of the replication crisis. On whether IAT research has a “file drawer” problem, for example, see Kurdi et al. (2019).

24. See forthcoming research led by Holroyd on bias and blame.

Copyright © 2019 by
Michael Brownstein <>

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