Notes to Implicit Bias

1. For research on implicit attitudes toward consumer products, see Maison et al. (2004) and Perkins & Forehand (2012); for self-esteem, see Greenwald & Farnham (2000) and Zeigler-Hill and Jordan (2010); for food, see Friese et al. (2008) and Mai et al. (2011); for alcohol, see De Houwer et al. (2004) and Houben and Wiers (2008); and for political parties and values, see Galdi et al. (2008) and Nosek et al. (2010).

2. For accessible introductions to philosophical questions about implicit bias, including discussion of how psychological research on implicit bias can integrate with economic, institutional, and structural approaches to studying discrimination, see Kelly & Roedder (2008), Anderson (2010), Madva (2012), Brownstein & Saul (forthcoming a,b), and Kelly et al. (2010b). There are equally pressing, and related, questions to ask about the phenomenon known as “stereotype threat” (Steele & Aronson 1995), but I will not address them here (although see §3.3 for brief discussion). For philosophical discussion of stereotype threat, see the chapters by Blum, Goguen, and Mallon in Brownstein & Saul (forthcoming a,b).

3. Cogent histories of these twin roots are found in Dasgupta (2004), Payne & Gawronski (2010), and Amodio & Devine (2009). Another important precursor to contemporary research on implicit bias is Modern Racism Theory (McConahay et al. 1981; McConahay 1982), which argues that “old fashioned” explicit racism has been channeled into more socially acceptable beliefs about public policy, such as affirmative action and desegregation programs.

4. While it is common to refer to “implicit measures of attitudes,” it is unclear if “implicit” in this context refers to a kind of measurement technique or to a kind of attitude. De Houwer and colleagues (2009) aptly recommend using the terms “direct” and “indirect” to describe characteristics of measurement techniques and “implicit” and “explicit” to describe characteristics of the psychological constructs assessed by those techniques. Note, though, that “direct” and “indirect” can also refer to different kinds of explicit measures. For example, a survey that asks “what do you think of black people” is explicit and direct, while one that asks “what do you think about Darnel” is explicit and indirect (because the judgment is explicit but the content of what is being judged (i.e., race) is inferred). The distinction between direct and indirect measures is also relative rather than absolute. Even in some direct measures, such as personality inventories, subjects may not be completely aware of what is being studied. It is important to note, finally, that in indirect tests subjects may be aware of what is being measured. One ought not to conflate the idea of assessing a construct with a measure that does not presuppose introspective availability with the idea of the assessed construct being introspectively unavailable (Payne & Gawronski 2010).

5. In this study, black participants on average showed no preference between black and white faces. In other studies, roughly 40% of black participants demonstrate an implicit in-group preference for black faces over white faces, 20% show no preference, and 40% demonstrate an implicit out-group preference for white faces over black faces (Nosek et al. 2002; Ashburn-Nardo et al. 2003; Dasgupta 2004). This finding upends the view that in-group favoritism is the primary driver of implicit bias. Rather, it appears that implicit bias is driven by a combination of in-group favoritism and sensitivity to the value society places on particular groups.

6. One pressing question is whether these measures are correlated with one another (i.e., whether someone who demonstrates bias on one measure will demonstrate bias on the others). See Bar-Anan & Nosek (forthcoming) and Machery (forthcoming) for discussion (§2.2.3).

7. The IAT is not without criticism, both for the broad conceptual conclusions researchers have drawn from IAT data (Arkes & Tetlock 2004; Tetlock & Mitchell 2009) and the IAT’s ability to predict discriminatory behavior compared with direct measures based on self-report (Oswald et al. 2013). For reply, see Greenwald et al. (2014).

8. Propositional processes could just as well be called rationally sensitive, inferential, or truth-apt processes. This would perhaps avoid confusion between associative and propositional processes and associations and propositions. For example, propositions can serve as the inputs to associative processes (e.g., encountering the proposition, “I don’t want to grow up” can activate another proposition, “I’m a Toys R Us kid,” regardless of whether one judges the proposition, “I don’t want to grow up, therefore I’m a Toys R Us kid” to be true). APE uses the term “propositional processes” because these processes are typically concerned with the validation of propositions, which have been transformed from the inputs provided by associative processes (e.g., from negative gut feelings toward φ to the proposition “I dislike φ”). Hereafter, unless otherwise noted, when I refer to propositions or to propositional models of implicit attitudes, I refer to propositions in the ordinary sense, not to APE and RIM’s propositional processes.

9. See also the Iterative Reprocessing Model (Cunningham et al. 2007; Cunningham & Zelazo 2007) for a multilevel neuroscientific approach that stresses the interaction of automatic and controlled processes over time.

10. In this way, aliefs are similar to Millikan’s (1995) “Pushmi-Pullyu” representations and Clark’s (1997) “action-oriented” representations, both of which simultaneously describe the world as being a certain way and direct a certain response to stimuli. Note also that one can endorse the notion that implicit attitudes are comprised of something like bundles of automatically co-activating components without necessarily endorsing Gendler’s account of alief. For example, see Brownstein & Madva 2012b.

11. The alief/belief distinction—in particular that aliefs are “arational”—is reminiscent of the core distinction between associative and propositional processes in RIM and APE (§1.3.2). Indeed, Bodenhausen & Gawronski (2014: 957) write that the

distinction between associative and propositional evaluations is analogous to the distinction between ‘alief’ and belief in recent philosophy of epistemology.

Note here, however, the potential confusion of associative and propositional processes with associations and propositions. Aliefs are not propositions; they also may operate according to what RIM and APE call associative processes. But these are different claims. See footnote #8.

12. See also Holroyd & Sweetman (forthcoming) and Zimmerman (2007) for multiple kinds accounts of implicit attitudes. For critique of Amodio & Devine (2006, 2009), see Gawronski & Bodenhausen (2011: 105–108) and Madva & Brownstein (ms).

13. On the flexibility and “intelligence” of automatic states, see also Dreyfus & Dreyfus (1992), Arpaly (2004), and Railton (2009). Similar notions are found in empirical work on motor skill and confabulation, for example in Jeannerod (1996). Further back, central work in phenomenology (e.g., Merleau-Ponty 1945/2013) and American pragmatism (e.g., James 1890/1950) have both focused on the intelligence of habit and “body knowledge.”

14. To avoid confusion, note again that this is a different use of the term “propositional” than is found in RIM and APE (§1.3.2). See footnote #8.

15. But see Madva (2012) for argument that associatively-structured states can form and change rapidly. Note also that Levy (2014) argues that implicit attitudes maybe be propositionally structured without being beliefs.

16. For critique of “in-between belief,” see Zimmerman (2007). Note also that Schwitzgebel’s “in-between beliefs” bear some resemblance to Levy’s “patchy endorsements” (§2.1). Both conceptualizations capture the ways in which implicit attitudes are belief-like in some important ways but also fail to behave like bona fide beliefs in other ways. While Levy stresses the fact that implicit attitudes are belief-like because they appear to respond to the semantic content of other mental states, yet do so too unsystematically to count as bona fide beliefs, Schwitzgebel stresses the fact that implicit attitudes are belief-like because they dispose agents to think, feel, and act in the ways typically associated with the relevant attitude, but not in a unified enough way to fully attribute the relevant attitude to the agent.

17. Proponents explain the unintuitive nature of SBF by claiming that most people think they only have the beliefs that they consciously know they have. Mandelbaum (2014) writes,

people will both believe that dogs are made out of paper and believe that dogs aren’t made out of paper, but they’ll only think they have the latter belief because they have access to the judgment that accords with that belief.

18. On the comparative effectiveness of interventions, see Lai et al. (2013). On the interpretation of dissonance literature, see Gawronski & Bodenhausen (2011). Note that Gawronski and colleagues do not support SBF’s interpretation of their data.

19. SBF is a psychofunctional theory that attempts to identify a state in cognitive science that shares a “spiritual similarity” with the folk concept of belief (Mandelbaum 2014).

20. I focus on epistemology and implicit bias per se. For important work on epistemology and prejudice more generally, see Haslanger (2000), Fricker (2007), Anderson (2012), and Begby (2013).

21. This finding is consistent with the large confabulation literature, which shows that agents often act for reasons of which they are unaware. See, for example, Nisbett & Wilson (1977).

22. Another possibility is that agents ordinarily lack content awareness of their implicit attitudes but gain it when an experimenter asks them to focus in the right ways.

23. Gawronski and colleagues (2006) argue that some evaluative conditioning studies (e.g., Olson & Fazio 2001) suggest that agents do sometimes have direct introspective access to their implicit attitudes.

24. I draw these examples from Siegel (2013) and from Siegel’s interview with Richard Marshall for 3:AM magazine (First published Friday, September 20, 2013).

25. See, for example, research on attentional capture and race (e.g., Eberhardt et al. 2004; Richeson & Trawalter 2008).

26. For CV studies, see Bertrand & Mullainathan (2004) and Moss-Racusin et al. (2012). For grading studies, see Harari & McDavid (1973). For publication bias, see Peters & Ceci (1982). For related discussion of reasoning errors due to implicit bias, see Hundleby (forthcoming).

27. See §4.2 for discussion of interventions to combat implicit bias.

28. For discussion of evolutionary explanations of racial categorization, see Machery & Faucher (2005).

29. See §4.1.2 for discussion of Cameron and colleagues’ third experimental condition which treated folk psychological attitudes toward control over one’s implicit biases as the independent variable.

30. Relevant too are arguments that agents can be thought of as responsible for automatic praiseworthy (rather than blameworthy) actions. See, for instance, Arpaly (2004), Snow (2006), and Brownstein & Madva (2012a).

31. This bias-justified revisionism is in keeping with calls for revisionism about many moral concepts on account of findings in empirical psychology (e.g., Doris 2002).

32. For an extended philosophical discussion of how intergroup contact reduces implicit bias, see Anderson (2010).

33. Results of shooter bias tests show that white participants are consistently more likely to “shoot” unarmed black men than unarmed white men and to fail to shoot armed white men than armed black men (Correll et al. 2002; Payne 2001; Payne et al. 2002).

34. For a listing of replication efforts, blog posts, and media coverage of social priming research, see the page at

35. See forthcoming research led by Holroyd on bias and blame.

Copyright © 2015 by
Michael Brownstein <>

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