Supplement to Infinity

Infinite Idealizations

In mathematical economics, continuum many traders (see Aumann 1964) or continuum many goods (see Dornbush et al. 1977) are standard fare. In a paper devoted to infinite idealization in economics, Albert and Kliemt 2017, for instance, mention economic models of markets with “infinite divisibility of goods, a continuum of buyers and sellers, consumers optimizing over an infinite time horizon, or actors optimizing over an infinite number of interactions” (2017, p. 4) In ecology and evolutionary biology, one finds models with infinite populations. In population genetics models, one assumes the number of agents to be infinite in order to neutralize genetic drift (see Strevens 2019 and Abrams 2016). In linguistics, infinite idealizations also appear in the assumption that languages have infinitary cardinality (see Nedft 2019).

But the area in which infinite idealizations have been studied most extensively is physics. Since the early 2000s, pioneered by Batterman’s 2002 book on asymptotic reasoning, much attention has been devoted to the role of infinite idealizations. Batterman defended the idea that infinite idealizations often yield explanatory dividends and that emergence is intimately connected to them. Infinite idealizations involve assumptions contrary to fact, such as infinite depth of ocean water in accounting for the motion of waves in hydrodynamics, infinitely many molecules in a boiling kettle (postulated in accounts of the phase transition from water to vapor in thermodynamics), etc. Among the most important case studies analyzed in this literature, we find thermodynamic limits in phase transitions and the Aharonov-Bohm effect, where an infinitely long solenoid is assumed in the idealization. (For a discussion of the literature on both cases see Shech 2018a). Infinite idealizations play a role in accounts of spontaneous symmetry-breaking, indeterminism, reversible processes in thermodynamics, and renormalization group explanations of universality. (For a bibliography see Shech 2018b, which presents the most important references in the area in the context of a syllabus for a course on infinite idealization in physics.) As an outcome of all this work, important distinctions have been made, such as the one between approximation and idealization (see Norton 2012). Furthermore, this work’s relevance to key areas of philosophical interest has been clearly established (indispensability arguments, the role of models and/or idealizations in explanations, abstraction vs. idealization, representation, confirmation, realism vs anti-realism, emergence, reduction, etc.).

All of this does not exhaust the role of infinity in physics; for more see Barrow 2006, and Luminet and Lachièze-Rey 2005.

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Paolo Mancosu <mancosu@socrates.Berkeley.EDU>
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