Supplement to Infinity

Theories of Numerosities

Let us give an intuitive sketch of how the theory of numerosities can be developed for all countable sets (for details see Benci and Di Nasso 2003 and Mancosu 2009, 2016). The idea is to find a way of counting infinite sets that generalizes counting on finite sets. One can call the idea counting by groups. Suppose we have a collection of \(n\) objects to be distributed among \(n\) containers labelled \(c_1,\ldots, c_n\). (In the following, we consider \(n \ge 1\) both in the labeling of containers and for the natural number sequence. However, 0 appears in the partial sums; this is only to avoid some annoying use of \(n - 1\) in place of \(n.)\) We decide upon a partition of the \(n\) objects—say \(k_1\) objects in the container \(c_1\), \(k_2\) in the container \(c_2\), and so on to \(k_n\) in container \(c_n\) (where \(k_i\) can be 0 for some but not all \(i\) such that \(1 \le i \le n).\) However we make that decision, we will have a sequence of numbers \(k_1,\ldots, k_n\) corresponding to the number of objects found in containers \(c_1,\ldots,c_n\). From that sequence we can generate a sequence of partial sums \(k_1\), \(k_1 + k_2,\ldots, k_1 + k_2 + \cdots + k_n\). Obviously \(k_1 + k_2 +\cdots + k_n\) is exactly \(n\), i.e. the original number of objects distributed in the \(n\) containers. The sequence \(k_1\), \(k_1 + k_2,\ldots, k_1 + k_2 +\cdots + k_n\) is called the approximating sequence for the collection of \(n\) objects.

For finitely many objects, this is all straightforward. However, let us generalize to infinitely many objects. Consider now an infinite sequence of containers labelled in such a way that, for each natural number \(n\), we have a container \(c_n\). Suppose we want to show how to assign numerosities to all subsets of natural numbers (these are thus the collection of objects we want to count). For each subset of natural numbers, we send each of its elements to a container—this will provide a way of counting the number of elements in that subset. In general, the construction requires that the distribution of any subset of natural numbers (finite or infinite) be done in such a way that only finitely many elements are sent to each container.

In order to simplify the construction, let us assume that given a set of natural numbers we distribute its elements in the containers according to the most trivial function respecting our constraint, namely the identity function. Suppose the set is finite—say, \(\{2, 3, 5\}\). Then the identity function sends 2 into \(c_2\), 3 into \(c_3\) and 5 into \(c_5\). Every other container is empty. We can keep track of how many objects are inside the containers by writing an infinite string of 0s and 1s. In the specific case of \(\{2, 3, 5\}\) the situation appears as follows: 0 (corresponding to \(c_1), 1\) (corresponding to \(c_2),\) 1, 0, 1, and 0 from \(c_6\) onward. The partial sums corresponding to this set and its distribution into the containers are represented by the sequence 0, 1, 2, 2, 3, and 3 from \(c_6\) onward. This infinite sequence (with a constant tail) is the approximating sequence to our original set. Not surprisingly, the constant tail with value 3 tells us that the original distributed set had three elements.

However, when we have an infinite set, say the odd numbers, the first sequence will read 1, 0, 1, 0, 1, and so on, alternating 0 and 1, corresponding to the fact that the identity function sends the set of odd numbers into the odd containers. The approximating sequence will be 1, 1, 2, 2, 3, 3 and so on. The construction of the numerosities starts from these approximating sequences and defines a “numerosity” as an equivalence class of approximating sequences that are identified if and only if the set of natural numbers on which the two approximating sequences coincide belongs to a set-theoretic object called a Ramsey ultrafilter. We need not define what this is (but keep in mind that in this context it is a collection of infinite subsets of the natural numbers), but one can think of an ultrafilter as telling us what the “large sets” are. In this context, the set of natural numbers is always considered “large”—i.e. it is contained in the ultrafilter. And thus two approximating sequences that coincide over a “large set”—i.e. a set in the ultrafilter—will belong to the same equivalence class and will be considered identical, i.e. they will have the same numerosity. These numerosities are totally ordered and their key feature is that they respect the relation of part-whole satisfied by the collections whose numerosities we are determining. For instance, the numerosity of the odd prime numbers is strictly smaller than the numerosity of the odd numbers. The two approximating sequences are 0, 0, 1, 1, 2, 2, 3, 3, 3, … and 1, 1, 2, 2, 3, 3, 4, 4, 5, … respectively. Let \(f(n)\) be the approximating sequence for the odd prime numbers and \(g(n)\) that for the odd numbers. Then the set of numbers \(n\) such that \(f(n) \lt g(n)\) belongs to the ultrafilter. Since this means that it is a “large set”, the numerosity of the odd prime numbers is smaller than that of the odd numbers.

The theory of numerosities can be extended to all sets and thus it provides an alternative way of giving “sizes” to sets that differs from that given by Cantorian cardinalities. We have already mentioned that commutativity fails for ordinal numbers, but there are basic arithmetic laws that fail for both cardinal and ordinal numbers—for instance, \(x(y+z) = xy+xz\) (distributivity of multiplication over addition). The arithmetical properties of the numerosities are much better behaved than those of cardinals and ordinals (there is no failure of commutativity, distributivity etc.) Of course, while this theory provides us with a very important conceptual development, this does not yet address the issue of whether the theory of numerosities is fruitful in mathematical practice or for philosophical considerations. These topics have been discussed, and there are interesting applications to density in number theory (Di Nasso 2010) and to probability theory—see the

Supplement on God’s lottery.

Bibliographical references for the theory of numerosities are given in the main text. For their historical and philosophical relevance see Mancosu 2009, 2015, 2016, and Parker 2013.

Copyright © 2023 by
Kenny Easwaran <>
Alan Hájek <>
Paolo Mancosu <mancosu@socrates.Berkeley.EDU>
Graham Oppy <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free