First published Mon Apr 9, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jul 26, 2021

Integrity is one of the most important and oft-cited of virtue terms. It is also perhaps the most puzzling. For example, while it is sometimes used virtually synonymously with ‘moral,’ we also at times distinguish acting morally from acting with integrity. Persons of integrity may in fact act immorally—though they would usually not know they are acting immorally. Thus one may acknowledge a person to have integrity even though that person may hold what one thinks are importantly mistaken moral views.

When used as a virtue term, ‘integrity’ refers to a quality of a person’s character; however, there are other uses of the term. One may speak of the integrity of a wilderness region or an ecosystem, a computerized database, a defense system, a work of art, and so on. When it is applied to objects, integrity refers to the wholeness, intactness or purity of a thing—meanings that are sometimes carried over when it is applied to people. A wilderness region has integrity when it has not been corrupted by development or by the side-effects of development, when it remains intact as wilderness. A database maintains its integrity as long as it remains uncorrupted by error; a defense system as long as it is not breached. A musical work might be said to have integrity when its musical structure has a certain completeness that is not intruded upon by uncoordinated, unrelated musical ideas; that is, when it possesses a kind of musical wholeness, intactness and purity.

Integrity is also attributed to various parts or aspects of a person’s life. We speak of attributes such as professional, intellectual and artistic integrity. However, the most philosophically important sense of the term ‘integrity’ relates to general character. Philosophers have been particularly concerned to understand what it is for a person to exhibit integrity throughout life. What is it to be a person of integrity? Ordinary discourse about integrity involves two fundamental intuitions: first, that integrity is primarily a formal relation one has to oneself, or between parts or aspects of one’s self; and second, that integrity is connected in an important way to acting morally, in other words, there are some substantive or normative constraints on what it is to act with integrity.

How these two intuitions can be incorporated into a consistent theory of integrity is not obvious, and most accounts of integrity tend to focus on one of these intuitions to the detriment of the other. A number of accounts have been advanced, the most important of them being: (i) integrity as the integration of self; (ii) integrity as maintenance of identity; (iii) integrity as standing for something; (iv) integrity as moral purpose; and (v) integrity as a virtue. These accounts are reviewed below. We then examine several issues that have been of central concern to philosophers exploring the concept of integrity: the relations between types of integrity, integrity and moral theory, and integrity and social and political conditions.

1. Integrity as Self-Integration

On the self-integration view of integrity, integrity is a matter of persons integrating various parts of their personality into a harmonious, intact whole. Understood in this way, the integrity of persons is analogous to the integrity of things: integrity is primarily a matter of keeping the self intact and uncorrupted. The self-integration view of integrity makes integrity a formal relation to the self.

What is a formal relation to the self? One answer is that a formal relation can be attributed to a person without evaluating the relation’s components. Strength of will is probably a formal relation one has to oneself. Very roughly, we might say that a display of strength of will is a particular relation between a person’s intention and corresponding action: it is a matter of acting on an intention given serious obstacles to the action. This is a formal relation to the self in the sense we are after because we don’t need to evaluate the appropriateness, value, justice, practical wisdom, and so on, either of the intention or corresponding action in order to identify the whole thing as a case of strength of will. We might think that all displays of strength of will are valuable, so we might have certain pro-attitudes to an action simply because it is an attempt to fulfill an intention in the face of serious obstacles. Yet we don’t need to make this evaluation in order to attribute a display of strength of will to someone. All we need to do is inspect the correspondence of intention and action given the difficulty of acting on the intention. We don’t need to evaluate whether the intention is directed at anything worthwhile, for example. John Bigelow and Robert Pargetter (2007) argue that strength of will is the core of integrity (and that alternative conceptions of integrity tend to confuse integrity with authenticity). The self-integration account of integrity takes this formal characterization of integrity a step further. Self-integration is an achievement rather than a quality or disposition such as strength of will — though strength of will is likely to be an important quality in those who achieve self-integration. Self-integration still represents a formal account of integrity. In attributing self-integration to a person we are making no evaluative judgement of the states that are integrated within the person.

One instructive attempt to describe the fully integrated self is Harry Frankfurt’s (Frankfurt 1987, 33–34). Frankfurt does not explicitly address himself to the problem of defining integrity, nonetheless he does describe an important and influential account of self-integration. According to Frankfurt, desires and volitions (acts of will) are arranged in a hierarchy. First-order desires are desires for various goods; second-order desires are desires that one desire certain goods, or that one act on one first-order desire rather than another. Similarly, one may will a particular action (first-order volition) or one may will that one’s first order volitions are of a particular sort (second-order volition). Second-order desires and volitions pave the way for third-order desires and volitions, and so on. According to Frankfurt, wholly integrated persons bring these various levels of volition and desire into harmony and fully identify with them at the highest level. There are various ideas as to what it means to fully identify with higher-level desires and volitions. However, such identification appears to involve knowing them; not deceiving oneself about them; and acting on them (usually).

A person is subject to many conflicting desires. If one simply acted at each moment out of the strongest current desire, with no deliberation or discrimination between more or less worthwhile desires, then one clearly acts without integrity. Frankfurt calls such a person a ‘wanton’ (Frankfurt 1971). Integrity thus requires that one discriminate between first-order desires. One may do this by endorsing certain first-order desires and ‘outlawing’ others. For instance, one may endorse a desire to study and ‘outlaw’ a desire to party, and do so by reference to a higher order desire ranking success over fun. Second-order desires may conflict. One may value success over fun, but also both fear that a ruthless pursuit of success will make one boring and value being fun over being boring. Fully integrated persons will not fall victim to such conflict; they will either avoid it altogether (if they can) or resolve the conflict in some way. Resolution of self-conflict may be achieved by appeal to yet higher level desires or volitions, or by deciding to endorse one set of desires and outlawing others. At some point the full integration of one’s self will require that one decide upon a certain structure of higher level desires and order one’s lower level desires and volitions in light of it. As Frankfurt puts it, when a person unreservedly decides to endorse a particular desire:

… the person no longer holds himself at all apart from the desire to which he has committed himself. It is no longer unsettled or uncertain whether the object of that desire—that is, what he wants—is what he really wants: The decision determines what the person really wants by making the desires upon which he decides fully his own. To this extent the person, in making a decision by which he identifies with a desire, constitutes himself. (Frankfurt 1987, 38)

When agents thus constitute themselves without ambivalence (that is, unresolved desire for a thing and against it) or inconsistency (that is, unresolved desire for incompatible things), then the agent has what Frankfurt calls wholeheartedness. On one way of developing the integrated-self view of integrity, wholeheartedness is equated with integrity. It should be noted that self-conflict is not limited to desire. Conflict also ranges over commitments, principles, values, and wishes. Furthermore, all of these things—desires, commitments, values, and so on—are in flux. They change over time so that achieving the kind of ‘wholeheartedness’ that Frankfurt describes is a never-ending process and task. Self-knowledge is crucial to this process in so far as one must know what one’s values, for example, are if one is to order them.

Frankfurt’s account illustrates one way of describing the fully-integrated self. (See Taylor 1981 for a different approach.) The key question, however, is whether the idea of a fully-integrated self adequately captures the quality we ascribe when we say of someone that they are a person of integrity. There have been a number of criticisms of the integrated-self view of integrity. First, it places only formal limits on the kind of person who may be said to have integrity. People of integrity, however, are plausibly thought to be generally honest and genuine in their dealings with others. (See Halfon 1989, 7–8.) Imagine a person who sells used-cars for a living and is wholeheartedly dedicated to selling cars for as much money as possible. Such a person will be prepared to blatantly lie in order to set up a deal. The person may well be perfectly integrated in Frankfurt’s sense, but we should feel no temptation at all to describe them as having exemplary integrity.

Second, a person of integrity is plausibly said to make reasonable judgments about the relative importance of various desires and commitments. Yet, again, the self-integration view places only formal limits on the kind of desires that constitute a self. (See McFall 1987, 9–11, Calhoun 1995, 237–38). As McFall notes, one cannot say with a straight face something like: ‘Harold demonstrates great integrity in his single-minded pursuit of approval.’ (McFall 1987, 9; we discuss McFall’s views more fully in Section 4, below.) If integrity is nothing more than the perfect integration of self, however, it is hard to see how one can automatically deny Harold’s integrity.

Third, on some accounts, the fully and perfectly integrated person is not able to experience genuine temptation. Temptation requires that the full force of an ‘outlaw’ desire be experienced, but successful integration of the self may mean that such desires are fully subordinated to wholeheartedly endorsed desires and this may preclude an agent fully experiencing them. (See Taylor 1981, 151 for an example of a view like this.) That a person experiences, and overcomes, temptation would count against their integrity on such a view. One might think, however, that a capacity to overcome temptation and display strength of character is in fact a sign of a person’s integrity, not its lack. (Halfon 1989, 44–7 urges this criticism.)

Fourth, Cheshire Calhoun argues that agents may find themselves in situations in which wholeheartedness tends to undermine their integrity rather than constitute it (Calhoun 1995, 238–41; see also, Cox, La Caze and Levine 2003, 18–2.) Victoria Davion (1991) argues that a person may change radically and yet maintain integrity. In the midst of a complex and multifaceted life one may have compelling reasons to avoid neatly resolving incompatible desires. The cost of the resolution of all self-conflict may be a withdrawal from aspects of life that make genuine claims upon us. Resolving self-conflict at the expense of fully engaging with different parts of one’s life does not seem to contribute to one’s integrity. It seems rather like the sort of cop-out that undermines integrity. (One should not confuse integrity with neatness.)

Christian Golden (2019, 505) goes further in seeking to avoid ‘framing ambivalence and conflict as defects of character and action’, proposing humility as an alternative ideal to wholeheartedness as a model of personal integrity.

One possibility here is to acknowledge different kinds of integrity. For example, Matthew Pianalto (2012) distinguishes between psychological integrity (a form of self-integration) and practical integrity in order to deal with the integrity of agents for whom wholeheartedness is not a realistic option. Alfred Archer (2017, 435, 453) argues that an integrated self has value whether or not we equate it with the virtue of integrity. Its principle value resides in the effect it has on moral agency. Self-integrated people tend overwhelmingly to be better, more effective moral agents than people who are not integrated. Disintegration tends to undermine agency in general, but most importantly, it tends to undermine moral agency. Moral exemplars exhibit strong traits of self-integration. The importance and value of self-integration need not be identified with the importance of integrity. They may have different foundations.

2. The Identity View of Integrity

A related approach to integrity is to think of it primarily in terms of a person’s holding steadfastly true to their commitments, rather than ordering and endorsing desires. ‘Commitment’ is used as a broad umbrella term covering many different kinds of intentions, promises, convictions and relationships of trust and expectation. One may be, and usually is, committed in many different ways to many different kinds of thing: people, institutions, traditions, causes, ideals, principles, projects, and so on. Commitments can be explicitly, self-consciously, publicly entered into or implicit, unself-conscious and private. Some are relatively superficial and unimportant, like casual support of a sporting team; others are very deep, like the commitment implicit in genuine love or friendship.

Because we find ourselves with so many commitments, of so many different kinds, and because commitments inevitably clash and change over time, it will not do to define integrity merely in terms of remaining steadfastly true to one’s commitments. It matters which commitments we expect a person of integrity to remain true to. Philosophers have developed different accounts of integrity in response to this need to specify the kind of commitments that are centrally important to a person’s integrity.

One option here is to define integrity in terms of the commitments that people identify with most deeply, as constituting what they consider their life is fundamentally about. Commitments of this kind are called ‘identity-conferring commitments’ or sometimes ‘ground projects’. This view of integrity, the identity view, is associated most closely with Bernard Williams. It is implicit in his discussion of integrity and utilitarianism (Williams 1973; we examine this discussion below) and also features in his criticism of Kantian moral theory (1981b). The idea is that for people to abandon an identity-conferring commitment is for them to lose grip on what gives their life its identity, or individual character. An identity-conferring commitment, according to Williams, is ‘the condition of my existence, in the sense that unless I am propelled forward by the conatus of desire, project and interest, it is unclear why I should go on at all.’ (Williams 1981b, 12).

One apparent consequence of defining integrity as maintenance of identity-conferring commitments is that integrity cannot really be a virtue. This is Williams’s view. He argues that integrity is not related to motivation as virtues are. A virtue either motivates a person to act in desirable ways (as benevolence moves a person to act for another’s good), or it enables a person to act in desirable ways (as courage enables a person to act well). If integrity is no more than maintenance of identity, however, it can play neither of these roles. On the identity view of integrity, to act with integrity is just to act in a way that accurately reflects your sense of who you are; to act from motives, interests and commitments that are most deeply your own. (Williams 1981a, 49)

A number of criticisms of the identity view of integrity have been made. First, integrity is usually regarded as something worth striving for and the identity account of integrity fails to make sense of this. (See Cox, La Caze, Levine 1999.) It disconnects integrity from the prevalent view that it is a virtue of some kind and generally praiseworthy. Second, the identity theory of integrity ties integrity to commitments with which an agent identifies, but acts of identification can be ill-informed, superficial and foolish. People may, through ignorance or self-deception, fail to understand or properly acknowledge the source of their deepest commitments and convictions and we are unlikely to attribute integrity to people who hold true to a false and unrealistic picture of themselves. (On the other hand, this view of integrity as maintenance of identify-conferring commitments recognizes the relevance of self-knowledge to acting with integrity. If people fail to act on their core commitments, through self-deception, weakness of will, cowardice, or even ignorance, then to this extent they may be said to lack integrity.)

Third, on the identity view of integrity, a person’s integrity is only at issue when their deepest, most characteristic, or core convictions and aspirations are brought into play. However, we expect persons of integrity to behave with integrity in many different contexts, not only those of central importance to them. (See Calhoun 1995, 245.)

Fourth, as noted above, the identity view of integrity places only formal conditions upon the kind of person that might be said to possess integrity. The identity view of integrity shares this feature with the self-integration view of integrity and similar criticism can be made of it on this ground. It seems plausible to observe certain substantive limits on the kinds of commitments had by a person of integrity.

3. The Self-Constitution View of Integrity

The self-integration view of integrity and the identity view of integrity, as we described them above, place only formal limits on the kinds of desires and projects that might constitute an integrated self. Christine Korsgaard (2009) develops a distinctive picture of integrity that takes the self-integration and identity views in a constructivist Kantian direction. According to Korsgaard, integrity is not so much a condition of excellence we aspire to as a precondition of being an agent at all. To the extent that we fail to live with integrity, we fail to live as persons: we fail to be a self, as opposed to a collection of strivings; we fail to exemplify human agency as opposed to the unreflective satisfaction of desire.

To live with integrity is not merely to have a coherent life-plan and the courage to realise it, it is to act in a way that is rationally endorsed both by oneself as one acts and one’s future self. To do this, one must act on principles and these principles must be such that they would be rationally endorsed by any future self who reflects on the matter satisfactorily. Hypothetical imperatives tie our present plans and our future actions together; they are necessary for agency, but not sufficient. Categorical imperatives must be brought to bear if the tie between present and future self is to be appropriately binding. A future self must be bound to a project in light of the same principles that illuminated the project’s origin, endorsable in a process of rational reflection parallel to that at work at the project’s origin.

Korsgaard illustrates how this process may fail, and what is at stake in such a failure, with an example drawn from Derek Parfit (Korsgaard 2009, 185–86). A Russian nobleman wants to create a fortune in order to give it away to others in need. But he thinks that by the time he makes his fortune, he will not be idealistic and altruistic enough to give his fortune away. He will likely regard his plan as the folly of youth. The nobleman therefore seeks a promise from his wife that the fortune will be given away even if he protests. He seeks to use an external force (his wife’s agency) to secure his present plans against his future self’s abandonment of them. In such a case, the present self is treating the future self as a stranger, as a distinct person. To overcome this, the nobleman must formulate his plan according to principles that are categorical in nature. Hypothetical imperatives have no force once their antecedent condition is abandoned. Only a categorical principle of action will necessarily form a basis for endorsing a plan now and in the future. The nobleman must formulate his plan in the light of such a principle and trust his future self to endorse the plan in the light of the same principle. It is a risk, of course. But integrity is born of this risk. And if Korsgaard is right, it is not just integrity that is constituted in this way, but our becoming a distinctive self is constituted in this way too.

According to Korsgaard, the categorical nature of the principles through which we endorse our projects ensures that they will be morally satisfactory projects. Korsgaard sums up her thinking like this:

And in the course of this process, of falling apart and pulling yourself back together, you create something new, you constitute something new: yourself. For the way to make yourself into an agent, a person, is to make yourself into a particular person, with a practical identity of your own. And the way to make yourself into a particular person, who can interact well with herself and others, is to be consistent and unified and whole – to have integrity. And if you constitute yourself well, if you are good at being a person, then you’ll be a good person. The moral law is the law of self-constitution. (2009, 214)

The self-constitution view of integrity inherits many of the challenges encountered by the self-integration view and the identity view, described above. These challenges are not decisive objections, but defence of the self-constitution view will need ultimately to take account of them. In addition, the view appears to rely on a constructivist account of normative reasons. (See Bagnoli, 2011.) In particular, the kind of agency Korsgaard appeals to when she identifies integrity with successful agency and self-constitution must be inescapable if it is to constitute the very possibility of being a person. David Enoch (2006) argues that this kind of agency is optional, and that one could coherently aspire to a distinct form of agency – he calls it “shmagency” – which allows one to act in a practically successful way without committing oneself to universalizable, categorical norms of action. The issue turns on whether the account of agency developed by Korsgaard is inescapable; whether is must govern reflection on what to do by any rational self-conscious being and whether this inescapable characteristic of agency, if it exists, stretches to an ideal of a complete life of unified agency that Korsgaard identifies with integrity.

4. Integrity as Standing for Something

The self-integration and identity views of integrity see it as primarily a personal matter: a quality defined by a person’s care of the self. Cheshire Calhoun argues that integrity is primarily a social virtue, one that is defined by a person’s relations to others (Calhoun 1995). The social character of integrity is, Calhoun claims, a matter of a person’s proper regard for their own best judgement. Persons of integrity do not just act consistently with their endorsements, they stand for something: they stand up for their best judgment within a community of people trying to discover what in life is worth doing. As she puts it:

Persons of integrity treat their own endorsements as ones that matter, or ought to matter, to fellow deliberators. Absent a special sort of story, lying about one’s views, concealing them, recanting them under pressure, selling them out for rewards or to avoid penalties, and pandering to what one regards as the bad views of others, all indicate a failure to regard one’s own judgment as one that should matter to others. (Calhoun 1995, 258)

On Calhoun’s view, integrity is a matter of having proper regard for one’s role in a community process of deliberation over what is valuable and what is worth doing. This, she claims, entails not only that one stand up, unhypocritically, for one’s best judgment, but also that one have proper respect for the judgment of others.

Calhoun’s account of integrity promises to explain why it is that the fanatic lacks integrity. It seems intuitively very plausible to distinguish between fanatical zeal and integrity, but the self-integration and identity views of integrity threaten to make the fanatic a paradigm case of a person of integrity. Fanatics integrate desires and volitions of various orders in an intimidatingly coherent package; they remain steadfastly true to their deepest commitments like no others. On Calhoun’s view of integrity, however, we can locate a distinction between integrity and fanaticism. Fanatics lack one very important quality that, on Calhoun’s view, is centrally important to integrity: they lack proper respect for the deliberations of others. What is not clear in Calhoun’s account, and is in fact very hard to get clear on in any case, is what the proper respect for other’s views in the end amounts to. Exemplary figures of integrity often stand by their judgment in the face of enormous pressure to recant. How, then, is one to understand the difference between standing up for one’s views under great pressure and fanatically standing by them? Calhoun’s claim that the fanatic lacks integrity because they fail to properly respect the social character of judgement and deliberation sounds right, but most of the work is done by the idea of ‘proper respect’—and it is not clear in the end what this comes to. It may be that integrity involves standing up for one’s views in a way that does not fully respect the differing views of others. We therefore need an account of the difference between between failing to respect the differing views of others (which is compatible with integrity, and indeed sometimes required by it) and failing to properly respect the differing views of others (something that it incompatible with integrity on Calhoun’s account).

One way to expand upon Calhoun’s account of integrity is to furnish an epistemic conception of integrity. Greg Scherkoske (2011, 2012a and 2012b, see also discussion in section 6 of this entry) develops such an account. According to Scherkoske “Integrity is an epistemic virtue: that is, it is a stable disposition that reliably places its possessor in good epistemic position and leads to cognitive success” (Scherkoske 2011, 196). Hugh Breakey (Breakey, 2016) develops an alternative to this approach. He argues that integrity is a potentially dangerous trait in that possession of it can lead strong-minded people to act without proper regard for the needs and perspectives of others. However, he argues, “integrity contains substantive moral principles that serve to surgically target the dangers that integrity would otherwise pose.” (Breakey 2016, 613) Integrity fits its possessor with what is required to act as a benign deliberator in community with other deliberators. These are substantive rather than epistemic commitments implicit in the possession of integrity, and include such things as trustworthiness, non-coercion, and sociability. In this way, Breakey proposes a morally substantive account of integrity that includes, not general kinds of moral commitments, but specific commitments targeted at the dangers of being a self-directed and strong-minded individual. By contrast, the following account of integrity is explicitly concerned with quite general attitudes towards morality.

5. Integrity as Moral Purpose

Another way of thinking about integrity places moral constraints upon the kinds of commitment to which a person of integrity must remain true. There are several ways of doing this. Elizabeth Ashford argues for a virtue she calls ‘objective integrity’. Objective integrity requires that agents have a sure grasp of their real moral obligations (Ashford 2000, 246). A person of integrity cannot, therefore, be morally mistaken. Understood in this way, one only properly ascribes integrity to a person with whom one finds oneself completely in moral agreement. This concept of integrity does not, however, closely match ordinary use of the term. The point of attributing integrity to another is not always to signal unambiguous moral agreement. It is often to ameliorate criticism of another’s moral judgment. For example, we may disagree strongly with the Pope’s views of the role of women in the Church, take this to be a significant moral criticism of him, and yet admit that he is a man of integrity. In such a case it is largely the point of attributing integrity to open a space for substantial moral disagreement without launching a wholesale attack upon another’s moral character.

Mark Halfon offers a different way of defining integrity in terms of moral purpose. Halfon describes integrity in terms of a person’s dedication to the pursuit of a moral life and their intellectual responsibility in seeking to understand the demands of such a life. He writes that persons of integrity:

…embrace a moral point of view that urges them to be conceptually clear, logically consistent, apprised of relevant empirical evidence, and careful about acknowledging as well as weighing relevant moral considerations. Persons of integrity impose these restrictions on themselves since they are concerned, not simply with taking any moral position, but with pursuing a commitment to do what is best. (Halfon 1989, 37)

Halfon’s view allows that integrity is not necessarily ‘objective’, as Ashford claims, and is similar in a number of respects to Calhoun’s. Both see integrity as centrally concerned with deliberation about how to live. However, Halfon conceives this task in more narrowly moral terms and ties integrity to personal intellectual virtues exercised in pursuit of a morally good life. Halfon speaks of a person confronting ‘all relevant moral considerations’, but this turns out to be quite a formal constraint. What counts as a relevant moral consideration, on Halfon’s view, depends upon the moral point of view of the agent. Persons of integrity may thus be responsible for acts others would regard as grossly immoral. What is important is that they act with moral purpose and display intellectual integrity in moral deliberation. This leads Halfon to admit that, on his conception of integrity, it is possible for a Nazi bent on genocide of the entire Jewish people to be a person of moral integrity. Halfon thinks it possible, but not at all likely (Halfon 1989, 134–36).

Other philosophers object to this consequence. If the genocidal Nazi is a possible object of ascriptions of moral integrity, then we can properly ascribe integrity to people whose moral viewpoint is bizarrely remote from any we find intelligible or defensible. (See McFall 1987 and Cox, La Caze and Levine 2003, 56–68. Putnam 1996 draws on the work of Carol Gilligan 1982 to suggest a different way of overcoming the problem of the Nazi of integrity.) Moral constraints upon attributions of integrity need not take the form of Ashford’s ‘moralized’ view or Halfon’s more limited formal view. One might say instead that attributions of integrity involve the judgment that an agent acts from a moral point of view those attributing integrity find intelligible and defensible (though not necessarily right) —and that this formal constraint does have substantive implications. It prohibits attributing integrity to, for example, those who advocate genocide, or deny the moral standing of people on, for example, sex-based or racial grounds. There are things which a person of integrity cannot do. The Nazis and other perpetrators of great evil were either committed to what they were doing, in which case they were profoundly immoral (or not moral agents at all) and lacked integrity; or else they lacked integrity because they were self-deceived or dissembling and never actually had the Nazi commitments they claimed to have. Judgments of integrity would thus involve judgment about the reasonableness of others’ moral points of view, rather than the absolute correctness of their view (Ashford) or the intellectual responsibility with which they generally approach the task of thinking about moral questions (Halfon).

McFall (1987) contains an interesting discussion of the nature of the constraints on proper attributions of integrity. She asks ‘Are there no constraints on the content of the principles or commitments a person of integrity may hold?’ and then invites us to consider the following statements (McFall 1987, 9).

  1. Sally is a person of principle: pleasure.
  2. Harold demonstrates great integrity in his single-minded pursuit of approval.
  3. John was a man of uncommon integrity. He let nothing, not friendship, not justice, not truth stand in the way of his amassment of wealth.

McFall holds that the fact that ‘none of these claims can be made with a straight face suggests that integrity is inconsistent with such principles.’ (McFall 1987, p. 9) The question, however, is whether this is due to the formal constraints or substantive constraints; that is, whether attributions of integrity are constrained by the content of principles a person maintains, or by way certain kinds of principle fail to meet formal constraints on the way persons of integrity hold to their principles. McFall appears to suggest the latter interpretation.

In providing reasons for our dismissal of [i] to [iii] she says (1987, 9–10)

A person of integrity is willing to bear the consequences of her convictions, even when this is difficult … A person whose only principle is ‘Seek my own pleasure’ is not a candidate for integrity because there is no possibility of conflict—between pleasure and principle—in which integrity could be lost. Where there is no possibility of its loss, integrity cannot exist. Similarly in the case of the approval seeker. The single-minded pursuit of approval is inconsistent with integrity … A commitment to spinelessness does not vitiate its spinelessness—another of integrity’s contraries. The same may be said for the ruthless seeker of wealth. A person whose only aim is to increase his bank balance is a person for whom nothing is ruled out: duplicity, theft, murder. Expedience is contrasted to a life of principle, so an ascription of integrity is out of place. Like the pleasure seeker and the approval seeker, he lacks a ‘core,’ the kind of commitments that give a person character and that make a loss of integrity possible. In order to sell one’s soul, one must have something to sell.

This is an argument that invokes formal incompatibility between particular principles or goals and the proper attribution of integrity. The argument is not conclusive, however. Seeking pleasure, approval or wealth, is not always easy and it seems possible that conflict could arise, for example, between determinations to pursue higher or lower pleasures, long-term pleasures or immediate gratifications. The ruthless seeker of wealth seems to have a ‘core,’—albeit a nasty one—along with a set of principles of a sort and a set of actions that are ruled out on principle. If integrity requires a conflict between pleasure and principle, that would explain why a pure pleasure seeker lacks integrity. But in this case, it seems that a perfectly virtuous agent does not possess, or need to possess, integrity. For instance, Aristotle’s model of a virtuous agent contrasts with merely enkratic agents who must struggle to act virtuously. The fully virtuous Aristotelean agent would have no need of integrity if integrity were about the struggle between pleasure and principle. (But see Kristján Kristjánsson, 2019.) The idea that a fully virtuous agent lacks integrity does not seem plausible, however, and this suggests that integrity cannot merely reside in the triumph of principle over pleasure.

According to McFall, we judge people to be of integrity only if they have commitments which a reasonable person could accept as important. She writes, ‘Whether we grant or deny personal integrity, then, seems to depend on our own conceptions of what is important. And since most of our conceptions are informed if not dominated by moral conceptions of the good, it is natural that this should be reflected in our judgments of personal integrity’ (1987, 11).

However, she also draws a distinction between personal and moral integrity (McFall 1987, 14). On her view, a person who, in acting on some morally deficient principle, does morally abhorrent things may have personal integrity even if not moral integrity. McFall gives the example of a utilitarian lover of literature who is willing to stop people burning books by killing them. She says of the utilitarian killer (1987, 14), ‘Although we may find his actions morally abhorrent, we may still be inclined to grant him the virtue of personal integrity. We would not, however, hold him up as a paragon of moral integrity.’

It may be, then, that a certain kind of integrity — moral integrity — should be defined in terms of moral purpose (perhaps along the lines laid out by Ashford or by Halfon) and another kind of integrity — personal integrity — defined in terms of other qualities adumbrated by theorists discussed previously. Defining the overall integrity of character in terms of moral purpose has the advantage of capturing intuitions of the moral seriousness of questions of integrity. However, the approach may also be too narrow. Halfon’s identification of integrity and moral integrity appears to leave out important personal aspects of integrity, aspects better captured by the other views of integrity we have examined. Integrity does not seem to be exclusively a matter of how people approach plainly moral concerns. Other matters like love, friendship and personal projects appear highly relevant to judgments of integrity. Imagine a person who sets great store in writing a novel, but who postpones the writing of it for years on one excuse or another and then abandons the idea of novel-writing after one difficult experience with a first chapter. We would think this person’s integrity diminished by their failure to make a serious attempt to see the project through, yet the writing of a novel need not be a moral project.

6. Integrity as a Virtue

If integrity is a virtue, the key questions are what sort of virtue it is; what is its object and characteristic motivation? Bernard Williams (1981a, 49) claims that integrity is not a virtue because:

… while it is an admirable human property, it is not related to motivation as the virtues are. It is not a disposition which itself yields motivations, as generosity and benevolence do; nor is it a virtue of that type, sometimes called ‘executive’ virtues, which do not themselves yield a characteristic motive, but are necessary for that relation to oneself and the world which enables one to act from desirable motives in desirable ways — the type that includes courage and self-control.

Williams also contends that integrity does not dispose its possessors towards a characteristic thought—there is nothing in particular that integrity leads those who possess it to attend to. He writes “If integrity had to be provided with a characteristic thought, there would be nothing for the thought to be about but oneself—but there is no such characteristic thought, only thoughts associated with projects, in carrying out which a man may display his integrity” (Williams 1981a, 49). Williams holds this view because he sees integrity as steadfast maintenance of identity-conferring commitments, a view we discussed in section 2. Nonetheless, Williams sets out a clear challenge for those who hold integrity to be a virtue. They should either set out the characteristic motivations and thoughts of those who possess the virtue or explain why it is that integrity is an anomalous virtue, one not associated with characteristic motivations and thoughts. There are two main ways this has been approached. One is to claim that the virtue of integrity need not involve characteristic motivations or thoughts because it is a special kind of virtue; the other is to claim that integrity is a cluster concept and thus involves multiple motivations and thoughts.

Scherkoske (2011, 2012a and 2012b) suggests that integrity is an epistemic virtue, broadly conceived. In his view this explains why integrity appears not to furnish its possessor with a characteristic sort of motivation or thought. According to Scherkoske, epistemic virtues are distinct from moral virtues in just this way: they neither dispose agents to particular motivations or characteristic thoughts. “In the same way that epistemic virtues such as accuracy, open-mindedness and analytical insightfulness do not specify any particular content, integrity does not supply a characteristic thought, either” (Scherkoske 2011, 201). However, it seems that epistemic virtues do furnish characteristic motivations. An epistemically virtuous person, it seems, is motivated to discover the truth, the most justified belief, or something along these lines. A virtuously open minded person, for example, is not motivated to entertain new ideas merely because they are new, they are motivated by the possibility that in new ideas lie new insights and new possibilities for encountering the truth. A benevolent person is motivated by the needs of particular others and characteristically thinks of what will answer these needs. An epistemically virtuous person is motivated by the search for truth or justification and characteristically thinks of what will answer this quest. Scherkoske’s contrast between moral and epistemic virtues may therefore be overdrawn. Scherkoske’s view was discussed in section 3.

An alternative view is that the concept of integrity is a cluster concept, tying together different overlapping qualities of character under the one term. Cox, La Caze and Levine (2003) argue that integrity is a virtue, but not one that is reducible to the workings of a single moral capacity (in the way that, say, courage is) or the wholehearted pursuit of an identifiable moral end (in the way that, say, benevolence is). On this view, integrity is a complex and thick virtue term. One gains a fair grasp of the variety of ways in which people properly use the term ‘integrity’ by examining conditions commonly accepted to defeat or diminish a person’s integrity. Integrity stands as a mean to various excesses. On the one side we have character traits and ways of behaving and thinking that tend to maintain the status quo even where acting with integrity demands a change. These are things like arrogance, dogmatism, fanaticism, monomania, preciousness, sanctimoniousness, and rigidity. These are all traits that can defeat integrity in so far as they undermine and suppress attempts by an individual to critically assess and balance their desires, commitments, wishes, changing goals and other factors. Thus, refusing to acknowledge that circumstance in a marriage, or one’s passionate desire to write a novel, have dramatically changed (for whatever reasons) may indicate a lack of integrity—a giving in to cowardice for example, and a refusal to acknowledge new or overriding commitments. These same factors can defeat one’s integrity, or an aspect of one’s integrity, whether one decides to stay with a marriage or abandon it. In one case staying may indicate a lack of integrity, while in a different case, abandoning the marriage would indicate such a lack.

On the other side, a different set of characteristics undermine integrity. These do not undermine the status quo as much as they make it impossible to discern stable features in one’s life, and in one’s relations to others, that are necessary if one is to act with integrity. In this category are capriciousness, wantonness, triviality, disintegration, weakness of will, self deception, self-ignorance, mendacity, hypocrisy, indifference. Although the second of these lists dominates contemporary reflection on the nature of integrity, the first may also represent an ever present threat to our integrity. The person of integrity lives in a fragile balance between every one of these all-too-human traits (Cox, La Caze, Levine 2003, p. 41). It is not that integrity stands as a mean between the vices that are represented in these two lists. Rather, the person of integrity will find a mean between the excesses of each one of these vices, or traits or practices that can undermine—that do undermine—integrity. Some people will be more prone to a certain set of practices or character traits that undermine integrity than others. The defeaters of integrity are person-relative, and may even be situation-relative.

One worry with this kind of grab-all approach to integrity is that it fails to issue in clear moral judgment of individual cases. Robert Audi and Patrick Murphy call this the blunt instrument problem (Audi and Murphy 2006, 8). Attributions of integrity leave too much unspecified to afford clear and determinate ethical judgments, either of character or action. In saying that a person or an organization acted with integrity, for example, we fail to pass a clear and unambiguous moral judgment upon their action. Audi and Murphy’s suggestion is that the term should be used as a complement to other, more specific, moral terms drawn from theories like utilitarianism and Kantianism. Self-standing attributions of integrity are of little practical or intellectual value in their view (Audi and Murphy 2006, 11). Audi and Murphy are surely right that ethical judgment of action is rarely if ever settled by observing that agents have acted with integrity. The question remains open, however, about the work that integrity attributions do. Is there anything in general that attributions of integrity specifically commend in a person?

On the assumption that integrity is a cluster concept of some kind, the question turns on whether anything ties together the various traits associated with integrity in a coherent overarching conception of integrity, one that makes it a clear virtue. One possibility is that the traits of integrity are tied together by the idea of successfully taking one’s life seriously either in all its important aspects (personal, intimate, social, professional, aesthetic, intellectual and emotional) or in some of them. The variety of qualities that Cox, La Caze and Levine claim are needed for integrity might not be an awkwardly heterogeneous collection they seem to be at first sight if they contribute in recognizable ways to the business of successfully taking one’s life—in itself and as lived with others— seriously. Such a view requires development of the idea of taking one’s life seriously, but it might posses certain advantages. It might have an advantage over integrationist views, for example, because it promises an explanation of why integration seems both important to integrity and also sometimes in tension with it. Audi and Murphy explicitly deny this tension—they deny that a person of integrity will experience very much self-conflict except over clashing prima facie duties (Audi and Murphy 2006, 18). However, the idea that integrity is compatible with substantial self-conflict is defended by a number of authors (see the discussion of integrity as self-integration in section 1).

Central to the idea of integrity as the virtue of taking one’s life seriously would be the idea that a pursuit of integrity involves somehow taking account of one’s changing values, convictions, commitments, desires, knowledge, beliefs and so on over time. Integrity would thus require a robustly successful kind of self-examination (an examined life). Further understanding of this aspect of integrity would likely involve examining the so-called moral emotions or emotions of self-assessment: regret; remorse; guilt; shame. These are central to the kind of self-monitoring that would be part of what it means to have the virtue of integrity, understood as the virtue of successfully approaching one’s life seriously. Far from being either unnecessary or undesirable, such emotions may be essential to integrity. (Pugmire (2005) discusses integrity and the emotions.)

This account of integrity makes it appear that integrity is much more difficult to achieve than is sometimes thought. It makes integrity a quality of character that one may have to a greater or lesser extent, in certain ways but not others, and in certain aspects or areas of one’s life but not others. Having integrity is not on this view an all or nothing thing. To say a person has integrity is to make an “all things considered” judgment: something that we may say of people if we know—and even if they know—that in certain ways and about certain things, they lack integrity.

A conception of integrity as a virtue—either developed along the lines described above or along different lines—is compatible with the existence of constraints on the content of the norms the person of integrity is committed to. Profound moral failure may be an independent defeater of integrity, just as hypocrisy, fanaticism and the like are defeaters of integrity. One might judge as internal to such a conception of the virtue the idea that integrity is incompatible with major failures of moral imagination or moral courage, or with the maintenance of wholly unreasonable moral principles or opinions. On such a view, the Nazi could not, all things considered, be a regarded as person of integrity. The Nazi may be self-deceiver and a liar (which is highly probable), but even if he is not, his principles and his actions are not rationally defensible under any coherent moral view. And this latter fact may by itself justify the judgment that the Nazi lacks the virtue of integrity.

7. Types of Integrity

References to different types of integrity, such as intellectual and artistic integrity, abound in the philosophical literature on integrity and everyday discourse. Because integrity involves managing various commitments and values, one might conjecture that such types of integrity are simply manifestations of a person’s overall integrity, or of their personal integrity. However, there are many people who we are inclined to say have intellectual but not personal integrity—or who have more of the former than the latter. If there is a radical disjunction between the type of integrity which is demanded in one sphere of life and another, integrity overall, or personal integrity, may be undermined, or at least profoundly challenged. There may, for example, be conflict between types of integrity, such as between intellectual and moral integrity. (See Code 1983, 268–282; Kekes 1983, 512–516.)

Is integrity in one area of life likely to flow over into others? This is possible, in that the kind of reflection and self-assessment which goes into maintaining integrity in one sphere of life may help people to reflect similarly in other spheres. However, given human beings’ capacity and need for compartmentalization, or psychologically separating out different parts of their lives, this effect will not necessarily occur. The relationship between different types of integrity and moral and personal integrity needs to be carefully charted. Is integrity a zero-sum game, so that for example, the more artistic integrity a person has, the less she has in personal life? This does not seem necessarily to be the case. At the same time, a lack of integrity in one aspect of life does not necessarily mean there will be a lack in other aspects of life. Presumably, a person could lack personal integrity, but still have integrity in a number of restricted areas of life, such as in intellectual and artistic pursuits.

A related question is how different types of integrity are associated with moral integrity. Stan Godlovitch (1993, 580) says that professional integrity, for example, is weaker than moral integrity, and is more like etiquette. For him (1993, 573), integrity ‘trades between the norms of unity and honesty’. More specifically, Godlovitch (1993, 580) argues that the responsibilities of performers, for example, are quasi-moral; they are not truly moral because they are internal to the profession. However, it seems plausible to maintain that professional integrity is better understood as an important contribution to the living of a moral life. Professional integrity is specific to the sphere of a profession, but not entirely independent of morality.

One can also ask how types of integrity are distinguished from each other. Halfon (1989, 55) argues that we distinguish between types of integrity in terms of commitments to specific kinds of ends, principles and ideals. However, not every end creates a distinct type of integrity. Trivial ends, like train-spotting, do not introduce a new species of integrity. To count as being a type of integrity, the sphere of action and commitment in question should be a complex and valuable human pursuit that has distinct ways in which integrity is demonstrated. Robust examples are intellectual integrity and artistic integrity. On this way of looking at the matter, personal integrity and various specific types of integrity tend to be run together. Integrity is seen as the one virtue: essentially the same virtue expected of one’s life partner, a friend, an employee, a priest, a teacher, or a politician. (See Benjamin, 1990; Calhoun, 1995; Halfon, 1989; and Grant, 1997.) Professional integrity then becomes a matter of the extent to which a person displays personal integrity in professional life. Halfon (1989, 53), for example, argues that types of integrity may overlap, ‘So a person who is an artist by profession may come to possess professional and artistic integrity in virtue of performing one and the same action or fulfilling one and the same commitment’.

There are, however, good reasons to resist this running together of various types of integrity. In the first place, our legitimate expectations of people must be sensitive to the roles we have tacitly or explicitly agreed that they perform. If we expect people to act with integrity in a certain professional context, then our judgment of them should be based on an understanding of this context: its special duties, obligations, rights, competencies, and so on. What it is to display integrity in one profession need not, therefore, carry over to other professions; and the difference between acting with integrity in one context may not share a common currency with what it is to act with integrity in another context. It seems that the concept of integrity cannot be demarcated into types without specific characterization of the kinds of challenges and hazards encountered in the relevant field of action.

Consider the example of intellectual integrity. The term ‘intellectual integrity’ is ambiguous between integrity of the intellect and the integrity of the intellectual. While it should, in general, be construed broadly, as integrity of the intellect, and thus applicable to anyone who thinks, here we will concentrate on the integrity of the intellectual, or integrity as the academic’s virtue, as Susan Haack puts it (1976, 59). Intellectuals may differ in the extent to which they exemplify intellectual virtues such as honesty, impartiality, and openness to the views of others. Intellectual integrity may then be thought of as the over-arching virtue that enables and enhances these individual virtues by maintaining a proper balance between them.

Halfon (1989, 54) argues that Socrates had a commitment to the pursuit of truth and knowledge, and he demonstrated his intellectual integrity in the face of attacks on it. Socrates may be an outstanding example of a person of intellectual integrity; nevertheless, there is more to intellectual integrity than having a commitment to truth and knowledge. Intellectual integrity is often characterized as a kind of ‘openness’— an openness to criticism and to the ideas of others. However, if one is too open, one could absorb too many influences to be able to properly pursue any line of thought. So an adequate account of intellectual integrity must incorporate conflicting claims: that one must be open to new ideas but not be overwhelmed by them. An account of intellectual integrity should recognize other sources of conflict and temptations that impede intellectual integrity, such as the temptations offered by the commercialization of research, self-deception about the nature of one’s work, and the conflict between the free pursuit of ideas and responsibility to others.

There are a range of commonly cited intellectual virtues central to our conception of intellectual integrity, such as honesty, courage, and fairness. Plausibly, such virtues as sensitivity and perceptiveness or insightfulness should also be added. In Virtues of the Mind, Linda Zagzebski (1996, 114) gives a very comprehensive list of intellectual virtues, adding such items as intellectual humility, perseverance, adaptability and communicativeness. Possession of these virtues is part of what it means for a person to have intellectual integrity, although they may exist in varying degrees without undermining a person’s overall intellectual integrity. There are a range of kinds of actions one might expect from a person of intellectual integrity as well: for example, being against plagiarism, refusing to suppress counter-arguments, and consistently acknowledging help. The fact that there are a number of distinct intellectual virtues, involving distinct, and sometime conflicting, dispositions to action, means that we have a need to balance or manage these virtues. For example, a person who has too much intellectual courage may well become a dogmatist, and a person who is excessively impartial will probably lack conviction. It seems plausible to say that intellectual integrity is that quality that enables a person to balance the various demands of intellectual work and to manifest intellectual virtues in a proper order.

This balance cannot be maintained without a certain degree of reflection on the relationship between different intellectual commitments. The importance of appropriate reflection to intellectual integrity indicates that, like personal integrity, it is closely related to self-knowledge. Self-knowledge appears essential to integrity in general, and given that intellectual integrity concerns knowledge itself, the relationship between having intellectual integrity and self-knowledge is particularly close. This close relationship might lead one to assume that self-deception is antithetical to intellectual integrity because it undermines the kind of self-knowledge, such as knowledge of our intellectual strengths and capacities, necessary to such reflection. However, self-deception does not necessarily undermine intellectual integrity. In fact, some self-deception might be necessary to pursue some lines of thought well. Having integrity may be consistent with—may even require—self-deceptive strategies to maintain one’s equilibrium in the face of conflicts and obstacles. As Amélie Oksenberg Rorty (1994, 218) points out, self-deception can be necessary to be energized to do anything. The mild self-deception that one has a good idea before one really has an idea at all is often necessary to get started on a piece of work.

Nonetheless, some forms of self-deception are seriously detrimental to intellectual integrity. Gabriele Taylor (1981, 146) believes that self-deception constitutes the most fundamental and important case of lack of integrity. She discusses an example which shows in an exemplary manner the dangers of self-deception—that of Casaubon in George Eliot’s Middlemarch (1994). Casaubon is a cleric working on the connections between different religions, a mammoth scholarly work he has devoted himself to for many years. In Taylor’s view, he is self-deceived about his commitment to scholarship. Casaubon’s problem may be seen as a conflict between his belief in his capacity and desire to write something very important and his realization of the truth that he is incapable of doing so. The kind of failure of integrity here is partly due to failure to take the views of others seriously, and thus differs from cases where others might encourage one in self-deception. Casaubon acted to prevent his wife Dorothea and others from realising the paucity of his researches. His case is more blameworthy because of this failure and it demonstrates the way in which self-deception can undermine intellectual integrity.

Another important type of integrity is artistic integrity. Bernard Williams (1981) discusses a fictionalized version of Gauguin’s story, a discussion that raises questions about the relationship between artistic integrity and other kinds of integrity. On Williams’s (1981, 22) account, Gauguin ‘turns away from definite and pressing human claims on him in order to live a life in which, as he supposes, he can pursue his art.’ In other words, the fictional Gauguin left his loved ones to paint in Tahiti. Williams’s point is that how Gauguin judges himself and how his actions are judged partly depends on the success of his artistic project. In Williams’s view, if Gauguin’s artistic project fails, we are apt to judge him morally deficient; if his artistic project succeeds, we are likely to see his actions in a more favorable moral light. Although Williams’s discussion of this case is focused on the concept of moral luck, there are two important issues concerning artistic integrity here. First, there is the issue of whether Gauguin acted with a kind of integrity at all, and second, there is the issue of whether artistic integrity, if this is what Gauguin’s actions manifest, conflicts with moral and personal integrity.

Calhoun (1995, 244) notes that ‘… insofar as we imagine that Gauguin, in pursuing ‘what he found his life bound up with’, acted merely on a psychologically deep impulse without critically reflecting on the value of doing so, we may suspect him of not acting with integrity’. He may have lacked personal integrity because he did not take an assessment of his values and commitments seriously enough. Calhoun (1995, 244) suggests that perhaps Gauguin believes that morality does not demand he give up partiality to his own artistic project. If this is his view, then the success of his artistic project may contribute to a favorable judgment of his moral integrity. Williams’s argument that Gauguin’s actions are given some sort of justification by the success of his artistic project is not entirely convincing. There is no reason to think that Gauguin’s project could only succeed if he turned away from the people that depend upon him, leaving them to a ‘grim’ life. Posterity may think more of him as an artist because of his work in Tahiti, but it doesn’t follow that we should think that Gauguin showed artistic integrity in taking his art to Tahiti, valuing his drive to paint in an exotic location above other commitments. Nor is it clear that being successful in Tahiti contributes to our judgment of his artistic integrity. Would our judgment of his artistic integrity have suffered had he stayed at home producing his art? Artistic integrity may come into conflict with personal and moral integrity, but it is surprisingly difficult to characterize the precise circumstances of such a conflict. Williams’s fictionalized portrait of Gauguin does not convincingly demonstrate such a conflict (and nor was it devised by Williams for such a purpose).

There are certainly connections between artistic integrity and the moral integrity of artists, which in turn is connected to the moral features of artworks themselves. Novitz (1990, 16), for example, argues that the values we bring to art are social ones, and that so-called pure aesthetic values are themselves socially induced. At the very least, the moral values which artworks suggest or promote are relevant to considerations of artistic integrity. On the one hand, artistic integrity and moral integrity can overlap, particularly if the standards of artistic integrity are high. On the other hand, artistic and moral integrity can come apart in situations of great pressure. Circumstances also vary, and with them both the difficulty of pursuing integrity, and our assessment of its merit. Stewart Sutherland (1996) argues that the case of Dimitri Shostakovich creates difficulties for an account of integrity developed in terms of consistency. The idea is that Shostakovich demonstrated equal if not greater integrity than other more artistically consistent composers writing in more congenial circumstances by coding his works with anti-Stalinist irony. More plausibly, however, one might argue that Shostakovich showed considerable strength of character in difficult circumstances whilst also admitting to his many artistic compromises, compromises which affected his integrity as an artist. Thus, one might rate his moral integrity more highly than his artistic integrity. Expectations of artistic integrity have to be tempered by understanding of the conflicts and pressures, both commercial and political, involved in pursuing artistic values.

Does having one type of integrity mean that one is, to that extent, moral? Halfon says that integrity in one sphere of life is admirable, though less admirable than having integrity overall and a specific type of integrity may interfere with moral integrity rather than be expressive of it. Yet overall integrity demands that this conflict be managed in appropriate ways. Integrity is so broad that it has to encompass morality in a profound way. Artistic integrity is greater if it involves not just following the demands of the profession, but doing so in such a way that one does not diminish others’ lives. Daniel Putnam (1996, 237) expresses the point well when he says: ‘Integrity reaches its highest point when it unifies and maintains a balance of virtues.’ In that sense, a particular type of integrity, such as intellectual integrity, is greater when it does not interfere with personal and moral integrity.

There certainly can be conflict between types of integrity, particularly where the demands of a profession interfere with personal and moral integrity. Pursuit of one particular project can prevent us from balancing our commitments, as in Williams’s fictional Gauguin case. However, while different types of integrity can be sequestered from each other, integrity of one type is more likely to flourish in a context of greater integrity in various spheres of existence. The kind of virtues and skills which are developed in maintaining, say, intellectual integrity, are likely to be available to make use of in dealing with the conflicts and temptations which threaten personal and moral integrity, and conversely.

8. Integrity and Moral Theory

Despite the fact that it is somewhat troublesome, the concept of integrity has played an important role in contemporary discussion of moral theory. An important and influential line of argument, first developed by Bernard Williams, seeks to show that certain moral theories do not sufficiently respect the integrity of moral agents. (See Williams 1973 & 1981.) This has become an important avenue of critique of modern moral theory. (See, for example, Scheffler 1993 and Lomasky 1987.)

Modern moral theories, the most representative of which are utilitarianism and Kantian moral theory, do not concern themselves directly with virtue and character. Instead, they are primarily concerned to describe morally correct action. Theories of morally correct action generally aspire to develop criteria by which to categorize actions as morally obligatory, morally permissible, or morally impermissible. Some theories of morally correct action also introduce the category of the supererogatory: an action is supererogatory if and only if it is morally praiseworthy, but not obligatory. The two theories of primary concern to Williams are utilitarianism and Kantian moral theory, and both of these are usually interpreted as eschewing the category of the supererogatory. (See Baron 1995 for an argument that Kantian moral theory has no need for the category of the supererogatory.) Williams maintains that both utilitarianism and Kantian moral theory are deeply implausible because of their integrity undermining effects. His argument against utilitarianism makes the more transparent appeal to the concept of integrity and it is this argument that we examine here. (But see Herman 1983, Rogerson 1983, Jensen 1989, and Baron 1995, chapter four, for critical discussion of the Williams’s argument against Kantian moral theory.)

Williams’s argument against utilitarianism is directed against a particular version of utilitarianism—act-utilitarianism. This is, very roughly, the view that an agent is to regard as morally obligatory all and only actions that maximize general well-being. The act-utilitarian theory that Williams criticizes has an important feature: it aspires to describe the correct form of moral deliberation. It does more than specify what it is for an action to be morally correct, it specifies how an agent should think about moral decisions. Agents should think about which of the actions available to them will maximize general well-being and decide to act accordingly. Notice that this theory is completely impartial and that it makes no room for an agent to give special weight to personal commitments, causes, projects, and the like. Act-utilitarianism recognizes no personal sphere of activity in which moral reflection operates merely as a side-constraint.

According to Williams, an agent who adopted this version of utilitarianism would find themselves unable to live with integrity. As he puts it, to become genuinely committed to act-utilitarianism is for a person to become alienated:

in a real sense from his actions and the source of his actions in his own convictions. It is to make him into a channel between the input of everyone’s projects, including his own, and an output of optimific decision; but this is to neglect the extent to which his actions and his decisions have to be seen as the actions and decisions which flow from the projects and attitudes with which he is most closely identified. It is thus, in the most literal sense, an attack on his integrity. (Williams 1973, 117)

Williams’s argument is based on the identity theory of integrity, discussed above. Integrity, on this view, requires that persons act out of their own convictions, that is, out of commitments with which they deeply identify. Act-utilitarianism seeks to replace personal motivations of this kind with impartial utilitarian reasoning. Williams’s argument appears to make acting with integrity incompatible with acting in accordance with act-utilitarianism.

Williams develops the point with two famous and much discussed examples (1972, 97–99). The example which best illustrates his argument involves the figure of George, a recent doctoral graduate in chemistry who is having difficulty finding work. George has young children. He also has poor health, limiting his job opportunities. George’s (unnamed) wife must work to support the family and on Williams’s story this causes a great deal of strain on the family. George has a strong commitment to pacifism, a conviction amounting to an identity-conferring commitment. A dilemma arises for George when more senior colleague tells him about a decently paid job in a laboratory doing work on biological and chemical warfare. If George does not take up the job, it will almost certainly go to another chemist, one without George’s pacifist commitment, who will pursue the development of biological and chemical weapons more vigorously than George. Should George take the job or not?

The most likely act-utilitarian conclusion here is that George should accept the job. This would contribute greatly to the well-being of his family as well as probably contributing to general welfare by forestalling some relatively zealous development of weapons of mass destruction. Weighed in the balance are George’s feelings in the matter. The utilitarian calculation, if it really does come out this way, is demanding a sacrifice of George: that he put aside his opposition to, and distaste for, biological and chemical weapons development and deal with the anguish and alienation that may result from working in the laboratory.

According to Williams, however, act-utilitarianism in fact demands a different kind of sacrifice from George. It demands that he act without integrity, abandoning or ignoring a longstanding, identity-conferring commitment to pacifism simply because maximum general well-being is to be found elsewhere. This is just one, particularly acute, example of the tendency of impartial utilitarian deliberation to run roughshod over identity-conferring commitments, treating them as no more than one source of utility among others. In general, Williams concludes, identity-conferring commitments cannot play the kind of role in act-utilitarian moral deliberation that is required for an agent to act with integrity, that is, for an agent to act with genuine conviction in matters of grave, identity-determining importance to them.

Williams’s critique of utilitarianism has spawned a large and important literature in which the argument has been interpreted and reinterpreted, redrafted, and much criticized. There are, nonetheless, three main lines of response to the Williams’s critique of utilitarianism. We consider them in turn. The first reply essentially concedes the point and offers in response a development of utilitarian moral theory, one aimed at avoiding the flaws that Williams sought to demonstrate. One way to do this is by watering down the impartiality of utilitarian theory, explicitly factoring in the permissibility of giving extra weight to one’s own personal projects, commitments, and so on. (See Scheffler 1993 for a development of this view, and Harris 1989a and 1989b for criticism of the adequacy of this response.)

Another way to try and improve utilitarianism in response to Williams’s argument is to advance a less ambitious form of utilitarian moral theory. Recall that Williams criticizes a version of act-utilitarian moral deliberation, so one may respond to it by describing a version of utilitarianism that does not directly dictate the form of moral deliberation. Thus one might subscribe to an act-utilitarian account of morally correct action whilst not demanding that someone like George approach life by deliberating in strictly utilitarian ways. Instead, utilitarianism may be thought to furnish criteria from which to derive decision-procedures. (See Driver 2012, Moore 2007, Railton 1986, for discussion of such a view; Cox 2005, Howard-Snyder 1997, and Harcourt 1998 for criticism of it.)

A second possible line of response to the argument is to deny the presupposition of Williams’s argument that it is absurd for a moral theory to undermine integrity. It may just be that moral demands upon us really are very stringent, and identity-conferring commitments must sometimes (perhaps often) be sacrificed in the interests of, say, our acting to ameliorate preventable suffering. One might even consider it a virtue of utilitarianism that it demonstrates how genuinely difficult it is to preserve one’s integrity when confronting a world of massive and easily preventable suffering. (See Ashford 2000 for an argument along these lines.)

The third, and most influential, line of response argues directly against the idea that utilitarianism demands that agents act against their convictions. Utilitarianism demands that agents adopt utilitarian ideals; that agents give utilitarian ideals the kind of priority that would have them function as the central identity-conferring commitments of their life. Thus utilitarianism does not demand that one live without identity-conferring commitments at all, but that one live with utilitarian identity-conferring commitments. Were George a utilitarian, he would not have been acting against his convictions by taking a job in the chemical weapons factory. He does not lose his integrity simply in virtue of his commitment to utilitarianism. Williams appears to confuse the case in which a utilitarian George acts against his personal interests (in which case his integrity would be preserved) with the case in which a non-utilitarian George is somehow persuaded to act as a utilitarian (in which case his integrity would not be preserved). Acting as a utilitarian when one has no sympathy with utilitarianism may well diminish one’s integrity, but such a loss of integrity is not attributable to utilitarianism and has no bearing on utilitarianism’s plausibility as a moral theory. (See Carr 1976, Trianosky 1986 and Blustein 1991 for versions of this criticism.)

The matter is not finally settled, however, for notice that Williams’s critique is premised on a version of the identity theory of integrity. As we have seen, there are other plausible candidates for an account of integrity and the critique of utilitarianism may well succeed better in their terms. The key issues are whether utilitarian commitment is compatible with a fully satisfactory account of integrity, and if so, whether integrity is of such value and importance that the clash between integrity and utilitarian commitment undermines the plausibility of utilitarian moral theory. An adequate account of integrity needs to deal with these issues and to capture basic intuitions about the nature of integrity: that persons of integrity may differ about what is right but a moral monster cannot have integrity.

Stuart Rosenbaum (2015, 23, 41) claims that ‘integrity is the heart of morality to most people’, and that pragmatism alone can accommodate that centrality. He (2015, 24) argues that pragmatist conceptions render integrity more than ‘useful in efforts to understand the moral life.’ For Rosenbaum (2015, 27), ‘The idea of integrity, focussed through the lens of pragmatism, enable a cohesive way of thinking about the many and diverse moral dimensions of life.’ He (2015, 22) maintains that the idea of integrity does not ‘play any distinctive role’ in utilitarian, deontological, or virtue ethics; and he laments (2015, 22, 28–33) what he sees as the baleful historical influence of Platonism in misdirecting moral philosophers’ attention away from ordinary peoples’ actual moral concerns. For Rosenbaum (2015, 34, 65), integrity is not an a priori ideal, but provides for a context-sensitive, working theory of morality. A person’s integrity consists of their autonomy, their commitment to community values and traditions, and their commitment to the ideals of self and community (2015, 87f.). ‘Being a person of integrity is doing one’s best given one’s values and the social and cultural conditions of one’s environment (2015, 106). Thus Rosenbaum is in agreement with Williams that integrity lacks determinate content; but he differs in qualifying the italicized declaration that integrity ‘has no moral content of its own, no essence or ontology of its own, apart from the cultures, societies, and psyches that may realize it’ (2015, 20; cf.88). So it is that, although he sees universal applicability in this concept of integrity, and indeed in aspects of integrity-based morality more widely, Rosenbaum (2015, 103f.) is able to contemplate the possibility that even a suicide-bomber may be a person of integrity.

In keeping with Williams’ views, Cécile Laborde (2017, 203) defines integrity as ‘an ideal of congruence between one’s ethical commitments and one’s actions’, and argues (2017, 207) that two tests must be applied to claims (religious or otherwise) for exemptions from laws. These are the thick sincerity of the claimant, and the thin acceptability of the proposed exemption — which must thus be compatible with the basic rights of others. For Lori Watson (2019, 656), no exemptions are permissible which are ‘incompatible with the project of liberal egalitarian justice.’ Giulio Fornaroli (2019, 659) goes further, concluding that ‘the notion of personal integrity is, by itself, unnecessary and possibly detrimental in a theory of justice.’

9. Integrity in relation to Social and Political Conditions

Even where the social and political dimensions of integrity are discussed, integrity is often seen as largely a private or personal affair—albeit one with important implications in the public sphere. Less attention has been given to ways in which social (e.g. family, business, religious) and political (e.g. forms of government) structures and processes may affect personal integrity. They can do this either by promoting or undermining features essential to having or practicing integrity; or by aiding, abetting, or being inimical to the defeaters of integrity (e.g., self-deception). If integrity is as central and important a virtue as recent work on the topic suggests, then ideally the institutions—including forms of government and economic arrangements—that help shape our lives should be structured in ways that promote integrity. Arguably, this is not the case, and why it may not be the case, and how to change it, is as much a problem for social and political philosophy, and ethics generally, as it is for philosophical psychology.

Susan Babbitt (1997, 118) says that an adequate account of personal integrity must:

…recognize that some social structures are of the wrong sort altogether for some individuals to be able to pursue personal integrity, and that questions about the moral nature of society often need to be asked first before questions about personal integrity can properly be raised. Questions about integrity may turn out to be, not about the relationship between individual characteristics, interests, choices and so on, and a society, but rather about what kind of society it is in terms of which an individual comes to possess certain interests, characteristics, and so on. This does not imply that questions about personal integrity are entirely moral, not having to do with idiosyncratic characteristics of individuals; instead, it suggests that the very meaning of personal integrity in particular cases sometimes depends upon more general considerations about the nature of the society that makes some idiosyncratic properties identifying and others not. The pursuit of adequate personal integrity often depends, not so much on understanding who one is and what one believes and is committed to, but rather understanding what one’s society is and imagining what it could be.

Babbitt explicitly links personal integrity to political and social structures in a way that broadens the concept of integrity. What she says is applicable to all of the views that we have discussed. But her account also enables us to raise questions about the relationship between social structures and personal integrity. The most general question is what kinds of society and what kinds of practice within a society are most conducive to personal integrity?

If society is structured in such a way that it undermines people’s attempt at either knowing or acting upon their commitments, values and desires, then such a structure is inimical to integrity. And if integrity is connected to well-being, then adverse social and political conditions are a threat—not merely an ultimate threat, but also a daily threat—to well-being. The twentieth century technical term for this mismatch is alienation. Alienation results when people are so confused or conflicted—are relentlessly exposed, for example, to the social manufacture of incompatible desires—that they take on roles they mistakenly believe they want or deceive themselves about wanting.

Are political and social conditions in contemporary liberal democracies conducive both to acquiring the self-understanding necessary for integrity and, more generally, to the business of acting with integrity? Historically, one of the governing ideals of liberal democratic societies is to provide its citizens, not with the goods they desire, but with certain primary goods, such as freedom, and with political/social/cultural structures (laws, codes, institutions, practices, and so on) that facilitate their capacity to obtain goods they desire for themselves. This is one reason education has always played a prominent role in discussion of liberal-democratic forms of life. Education is seen as a crucial structure in the facilitation of individuals’ pursuit of chosen goods. Such an instrumental view of education is rather narrow and omits any role for inculcation of the means to choose goods wisely. Integrity requires more than facilitation of an instrumental capacity to acquired desired goods. It requires the wisdom and self-knowledge to choose appropriate goods, worthwhile goals, and so on. It is, perhaps, hard to see extant social educational structures playing a very significant role in this process, and harder still to imagine real institutions—institutions compatible with the demands and limitations of contemporary life—that would.

If social educational structures fail to facilitate the life of integrity, other structures may be positively hostile to it. Arguably, and despite what might seem like overwhelming choice, job markets are structured by financial and other incentives, restricted opportunities and economic rents. The result is that many people choose careers they do not really want and for which they are barely suited. There are other perhaps more straightforward ways in which social and cultural structures may be inimical to the pursuit of integrity. The ideology of love, for instance, may undermine the integrity of lovers, as it may undermine the possibility of genuine and realistic love. In professional life, people may be called upon (not only tacitly) to lie, bluff or manipulate the truth in ways that directly or indirectly affect their integrity. The construction of a mission statement or a strategic plan is in some ways an open invitation to dissemble, pander and obfuscate. The expectation that one ‘sells oneself’ or ‘sells the company’ provides explicit reward for hypocrites and sycophants. And there are many kinds of assessments, reports and application processes that foster both deception and self-deception. If this is right, then contemporary society is inimical to a life of integrity in many small-scale ways. Broad social structures also have a deleterious effect on our capacity to live with integrity and here, of course, the effects of totalitarian regimes are more extreme than those liberal democracies.

Those who are oppressed seem to be in a paradoxical relation to integrity. On the one hand, members of oppressed groups would seem to be deprived of the conditions for developing integrity: the freedom to make choices how to act and think. As Babbitt (1997, 118) notes, one needs to be able to make choices in order to develop the kinds of interests and concerns which are central to leading a life of integrity. On the other hand, oppressed people are often able to reflect on political and social realities with the greater insight because they do not benefit from them. They have no incentive to adopt self-deceptive/self-protective attitudes about circumstances of oppression or to see past them with convenient blindness. Oppressed groups therefore have all the more scope to think about social reality with integrity, and to act out of this understanding with integrity. A capacity for reflection and understanding enables one to work toward integrity even if it does not ensure that one achieves an ideal of integrity.

Any attempt to strive for integrity has to take account of the effect of social and political context. The kind of society which is likely to be more conducive to integrity is one which enables people to develop and make use of their capacity for critical reflection, one which does not force people to take up particular roles because of their sex or race or any other reason, and one which does not encourage individuals to betray each other, either to escape prison or to advance their career. Societies and political structures can be both inimical and favorable to the development of integrity, sometimes both at once.


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