Supplement to Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

More on Grounding Theories of Intrinsicality

Another account of intrinsicality in terms of grounding starts with the idea that the core of an analysis of intrinsicality should be independence of accompaniment (Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon 2005). The account first holds that an object \(x\) has a property \(F\) in an intrinsic fashion iff (i) \(F\) is independent of accompaniment, and (ii) if \(x\) has \(F\) at least partly in virtue of having some other property \(G\), then \(G\) is independent of accompaniment. It then holds that \(F\) is intrinsic iff, necessarily, anything that has \(F\) has \(F\) in an intrinsic fashion.

Unlike both Langton and Lewis’s account and Weatherson’s account, in which independence of accompaniment also plays an important role, the Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon account classifies identity properties, like the property of being Obama, as intrinsic. Something having the property of being Obama, for example, plausibly doesn’t have this property in virtue of having some other property. Given the property of being Obama is independent of accompaniment, this account therefore plausibly classifies it as intrinsic. This suggests that the account is best seen as an account of the distinction between interior and exterior properties (although see Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon 2005:349 for a different diagnosis).

As Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon mention, their theory needs some relatively fine judgments about what properties are instantiated in virtue of which other properties in order to handle some hard cases, such as the property of being a rock. They also acknowledge that their account classifies all indiscriminately necessary properties as extrinsic, since indiscriminately necessary properties fail to be independent of accompaniment. However, some indiscriminately necessary properties, such as the property of being self-identical, are intuitively intrinsic.

Trogdon (2009) has argued that the account is also incompatible with priority monism, the view championed by Schaffer (2007) that the universe as a whole is more fundamental than its parts (and everything else). In reponse, Trogdon has proposed a modified version of the account which he claims is compatible with both priority monism and priority pluralism, the view that the universe’s atomic parts are fundamental. (See Skiles 2009 for criticism of Trogdon’s account, and Trogdon 2010 for a response.)

Like Langton and Lewis’s account and Weatherson’s account, the Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon account and the account of Trogdon (2009) face the objection that they are incompatible with certain metaphysical views that posit necessary connections between wholly distinct entities, such as the view that each thing \(x\) is wholly distinct from its singleton set \(\{x\}\), and is such that, necessarily, it exists iff its singleton \(\{x\}\) exists. As noted in section 3.5 of the main document of this entry, both of these accounts also face the objection that they are incompatible with metaphysical theories that allow facts that are intrinsically about something to ground a fact that is intrinsically about something wholly distinct from it.

Copyright © 2018 by
Dan Marshall <>
Brian Weatherson

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