## The Relational Account of Intrinsicality

Robert Franscecotti (1999, 2014) has outlined an analysis that takes the concept of intrinsicality as non-relationality to be primary. Francescotti takes a property to be extrinsic if an object possesses it in virtue of its relations to other objects. So being a duplicate of Jack and being such that the number 17 exists are extrinsic, while being identical to Jack and being a vertebrate (i.e. having a vertebral column) are intrinsic. Francescotti notes that not all relational properties are extrinsic. Having a vertebral column, for instance, seems to be relational in that it consists of a relation to a vertebral column, but it is also an intrinsic property. So he focuses on relations to wholly distinct objects.

Francescotti does not give an entirely precise statement of his account. On one way of spelling it out, however, the account is as follows. First, a property $$F$$ is defined to be a d-relational property of $$x$$ iff: $$x$$ has $$F$$, and either

1. There is a relation $$R$$, and an item $$y$$, such that (i) the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ is the state of affairs of $$x$$ bearing $$R$$ to $$y$$, and (ii) $$y$$ is not part of $$x$$; or
2. There is a relation $$R$$, and a set of items $$C$$, such that (i) the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ is the state of affairs of there being some member of $$C$$ to which $$x$$ bears $$R$$, and (ii) at least one member of $$C$$ to which $$x$$ bears $$R$$ is not part of $$x$$; or
3. There is a relation $$R$$, and a set of items $$C$$, such that (i) the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ is the state of affairs of $$x$$ bearing $$R$$ to every member of $$C$$, and (ii) it is possible that there is a member of $$C$$ that is not part of $$x$$; or
4. The state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ can be expressed by a truth-functional compound, at least one of whose constituents expresses a state of affairs satisfying (a), (b) or (c).

Secondly, an internal property of $$x$$ is defined to be a property had by $$x$$ that is not a d-relational property of $$x$$. Thirdly, $$F$$ is defined to be an intrinsic property of $$x$$ iff there are internal properties $$I_1 ,\ldots ,I_n$$ such that the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ is identical to the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$I_1 ,\ldots ,I_n$$. Finally, $$F$$ is claimed to be an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, for any $$x$$, if $$x$$ has $$F$$, then $$F$$ is an intrinsic property of $$x$$.

There are a number of problems with this formulation of Francescotti’s account. One problem is that it appears not to classify the property of being accompanied as d-relational, and hence appears not to classify it as extrinsic. (Recall that something is accompanied iff it coexists with something wholly distinct from itself that contingently exists.) This property would be classified as a d-relational property of Obama, for example, if there were some set $$C$$ and a relation $$R$$ such that the state of affairs of Obama being accompanied is identical to the state of affairs of there being a member $$y$$ of $$C$$ to which $$x$$ bears the relation $$R$$ (where at least one member of $$C$$ to which $$x$$ bears $$R$$ to is not part of $$x)$$. However, there appears to be no such set. (For example, suppose $$C$$ is the set of all contingently existing things wholly distinct from Obama. Then the state of affairs of Obama being accompanied would need to be identical to the state of affairs of there being a contingently existing member of $$C$$ that Obama coexists with and is wholly distinct from. However, since Obama could have been accompanied without any of the contingently existing things Obama is actually accompanied by existing, the former state of affairs could have been true without the latter being true, and hence these states of affairs aren’t identical.)

This problem can be rectified by replacing sets with properties in Francescotti’s account, replacing (b) and (c) with (b*) and (c*):

• (b*) There is a relation $$R$$, and a property $$P$$, such that (i) the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ is the state of affairs of there being something that has $$P$$ to which $$x$$ bears $$R$$, and (ii) at least one thing having $$P$$ to which $$x$$ bears $$R$$ is not part of $$x$$.
• (c*) There is a relation $$R$$, and a property $$P$$, such that (i) the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ is the state of affairs of $$x$$ bearing $$R$$ to every thing having $$P$$, and (ii) it is possible that there is something having $$P$$ that is not part of $$x$$.

A deeper problem with Francescotti’s account is that it is incompatible with a number of accounts of properties. (In the following we will use ‘property’ broadly to include states of affairs, which may be thought of as zero-place properties, and relations, which may be thought of as multiple place properties, as well as one-place properties.) Consider, for example, the coarse-grain theory of properties according to which all necessarily coextensive properties are identical. (Two states of affairs are necessarily coextensive iff they are necessarily equivalent.) Given this theory of properties, any intrinsic property $$F$$ of a thing $$x$$ will be a d-relational property of $$x$$, since the state of affairs of $$x$$ having $$F$$ will be identical to the property of either being $$F$$ and lonely, or else being $$F$$ and accompanied, and hence will be expressible by a truth-functional compound at least one of whose constituents express a state of affairs satisfying (b*). Hence, given the coarse-grain theory of properties, Francescotti’s account falsely classifies every intrinsic property is being extrinsic.

Francescotti’s account is also incompatible with standard fine grain theories of properties. Consider, for example, a Russellian theory of properties, according to which properties are structured entities built up out of objects, coarse-grain properties, and coarse-grain operators, combined with the view that the structure of properties matches the syntactic structure of the predicates expressing those properties. Given this fine grain account, ‘Obama is accompanied’ and ‘There is a contingently existing $$x$$ such that Obama is wholly distinct from, and coexisting with, $$x$$’ express different states of affairs, since these sentences have different syntactic structures. As a result, given this fine grain theory, the property of being accompanied is not d-relational, since it cannot be expressed by a predicate of the form $$\ulcorner\lambda x\exists y Rxy\urcorner$$ (and cannot be expressed by a predicate of any other form that would make it count as d-relational). Hence, the property of being accompanied is falsely classified as intrinsic by Francescotti’s account on this fine grain theory of properties.

The fact that Francescott’s account is incompatible with these theories of properties might not be a decisive objection against the account since these theories might be rejected. In particular, there might be strong reasons to reject these theories based on considerations stemming from intrinsicality itself. For example, given numbers necessarily exist, the coarse-grain theory is incompatible with the intuition that certain necessarily coextensive properties, such as being self-identical and being such that there is a number, differ in their intrinsicality, since, according to the coarse-grain theory, such properties are identical. This intuition about intrinsicality might therefore be used to reject the coarse-grain theory. If an account of intrinsicality respects this intuition, and as result is incompatible with the coarse-grain theory of properties, this might therefore not be a mark against the account. In addition to not being compatible with the above theories of properties, however, it is not obvious that Francescotti’s account is compatible with any credible theory of properties. In order to properly evaluate Francescotti’s account, therefore, proponents of the account need to specify what theories of properties it is compatible with, and why we should believe that at least one of these theories is true. This task has not yet been carried out.