Notes to Introspection

1. A related concern in contemporary discussion is the refrigerator light illusion. The refrigerator-light illusion is named after the error a child might make in thinking that the refrigerator light is always on because it’s always on whenever she looks to see whether it is. We fall victim to this illusion, it’s sometimes suggested, if we think we have constant visual experience of the far periphery of the visual field or constant tactile experience of our feet in our shoes. On this view, we do not have such constant peripheral experiences, it’s suggested, but whenever we think, or introspect, about such matters, we create such experiences, resulting in the illusion that such experiences are always there. See Jaynes 1976; Dennett 1991; Thomas 1999; Noë 2004; Block 2007; Schwitzgebel 2007a. Among those who hold that we do have constant peripheral experiences are James 1890/1981 and Searle 1992.

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Eric Schwitzgebel <>

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