First published Tue Dec 4, 2012; substantive revision Tue May 9, 2017

This entry addresses the nature and epistemological role of intuition by considering the following questions: (1) What are intuitions?, (2) What roles do they serve in philosophical (and other “armchair”) inquiry?, (3) Ought they serve such roles?, (4) What are the implications of the empirical investigation of intuitions for their proper roles?, and (in the supplementary document titled “The Logical Structure of the Method of Cases”) (5) What is the content of intuitions prompted by the consideration of hypothetical cases?

1. The Nature of Intuitions

Consider the claim that a fully rational person does not believe both p and not-p. Very likely, as you considered it, that claim seemed true to you. Something similar probably happens when you consider the following propositions:

  • [I1] If not-not-p, then p.
  • [I2] Torturing a sentient being for fun is wrong.
  • [I3] It is impossible for a square to have five sides.
  • [I4] A person would survive having their brain transplanted into a new body.

The focus of this entry is intuitions—mental states or events in which a proposition seems true in the manner of these propositions.

It appears clear that ordinary usage includes more in the extension of the term “intuition” than such states, as it would allow that a parent might have an intuition that their child is innocent of some crime or an archaeologist might have an intuition that an ancient site of some interest was in a certain area. Some psychological research seems similarly permissive. Consider recent research on “intuitions” in naturalistic decision making (Klein 1998). Such research has shown that agents with sufficient experience in a given domain (e.g., neonatal nursing, fire-fighting, or chess) arrive at judgments and make decisions on the basis of a cognitive process other than conscious considerations of various options and the weighing of evidence and utilities. Such expert “intuitions” that some infant suffers from sepsis, that a fire will take a certain course, or that a certain chess move is a good one, appear immediately in consciousness.

Less important than linguistic usage in various domains is whether our theorizing captures the relevant psychological and epistemological joints to be found in the world. The focus of the present entry is the role of intuitions in distinctively philosophical (and other “armchair”) inquiry. It is plausible (and will be assumed here, but see Nado 2014 for doubts) that the intuitions of interest in philosophy constitute a single epistemic and psychological kind exemplified by [I1]–[I4] and by many additional examples which appear in §2.2 and §2.3 below, but not the sort noted in the previous paragraph.

1.1 Intuitions as Beliefs

Some philosophers equate intuitions with beliefs or with some kind of belief. For example, David Lewis writes,

Our “intuitions” are simply opinions; our philosophical theories are the same. Some are commonsensical, some are sophisticated; some are particular, some general; some are more firmly held, some less. But they are all opinions…. (1983: x)

Such remarks suggest the following account:

  • [A1] S has the intuition that p if and only if S believes that p.

Why adopt [A1]? Some may be moved to do so on grounds of ontological parsimony. If intuitions are beliefs, we need accept no new kind psychological state. Furthermore, there is clearly a tight link between intuitions and beliefs in that one typically believes the contents of one’s intuitions.

However, that belief that p is neither necessary nor sufficient for intuition that p is suggested by conflicts between a person’s beliefs and their intuitions. One plausible characterization of a paradox holds that it is a set of a propositions, each of which is intuitive, but not all of which could be true. If one has reasoned one’s way to a satisfactory resolution of a paradox and identified the false proposition, one often still has the intuition that the rejected proposition is true. Hence, supposing that in such a case one’s beliefs are not contradictory, one can have an intuition that p while one does not believe p and one can have a belief that p without having an intuition that p. Indeed, even before such reasoning, one might suspend belief about the contradictory set while each remained intuitive. More generally, it seems that one may believe something—that some theory is true, that some mathematical or logical proposition is a theorem, that one is hungry, or that a person is now speaking—without having any intuition that p and so belief that p is not sufficient for intuition that p.

Such cases also illustrate an important feature of intuitions—their relative causal independence from explicit belief. An analogy with perception is helpful. One might, when viewing the Müller-Lyer illusion, experience one line as longer than the other even though one, having repeatedly measured the lines, firmly believes them to be of equal length. Just such an analogy is invoked when, for example, it is suggested that some moral intuitions may be

ineliminable moral illusion[s], similar to certain optical illusions which do not lose their intuitive appeal even when theory tells us better. (Kagan 1989: 15)

A more discriminating version of this sort of account holds that intuitions are beliefs with a suitable etiology. One such account, favored by many psychologists and philosophers with naturalistic inclinations, treats intuitions as beliefs without a conscious or introspectively accessible inferential etiology (Gopnik and Schwitzgebel 1998; Devitt 2006: 491; Kornblith 1998) as in

  • [A2] S has the intuition that p if and only if S forms the occurrent belief that p without consciously inferring it from some other belief.

On [A2], beliefs with an inferential origin of which a person is conscious are not intuitions. However, [A2] still mistakenly includes non-inferential perceptual beliefs, memory beliefs, and introspective beliefs as intuitions. Moreover [A2], like [A1], runs afoul of the fact that one can have intuitions the contents of which one does not believe. The former problem might be circumvented by a content restriction on the sort of non-inferential belief at issue or further etiological restrictions. The latter problem does not appear so easily circumvented.

A yet more discriminating etiological amendment to the belief analysis (Ludwig 2007: 135) is

  • [A3] S has the intuition that p if and only if S forms the occurrent belief that p solely on the basis of competence with the concepts involved in p.

This analysis is not open to many of the objections to [A1] and [A2]. It does not count an introspective, memory, or perceptual belief as an intuition. However, on the assumption that the concepts in question are not contradictory, it may imply (depending on what is required for competence with a concept) that intuitions are infallible. Even if intuitions are infallible, if S has mistakenly rejected one of the propositions making up a paradox, p, it seems she might, contrary to [A3], still have the intuition that p. Finally, [A3] appears to make the direct introspective judgment that one has an intuition difficulty to justify, as one lacks direct introspective access to the non-conscious causes of one’s beliefs.

1.2 Intuitions as Dispositions to Believe

Peter van Inwagen claims that intuitions might be

in some cases, the tendencies that make certain beliefs attractive to us, that ‘move’ us in the direction of accepting certain propositions without taking us all the way to acceptance. (1997: 309)

This suggests something like the following:

  • [A4] S has the intuition that p if and only if S is disposed to believe p.

If a disposition to believe is a propositional attitude, such an account would allow that intuitions are propositional attitudes and, unlike belief analyses, allow that one may have an intuition without belief. However, [A4] appears too liberal in placing no constraints on the nature or source of the disposition in question. One might be disposed to believe that a dog is nearby if one turns one’s head and looks, disposed to believe one is in pain if one reflects upon it, or even disposed to believe a complex theorem if one were to reason appropriately. None of these cases of being disposed to believe is, taken alone, sufficient for an intuition. Additionally, [A4] has, on some views of dispositions, the implication that a person’s believing p cannot be explained by their having an intuition that p.

Such concerns about [A4] may be met with a restriction on the ground of the disposition. A more plausible account (Sosa 1998) is:

  • [A5] S has the intuition that p if and only if S is disposed to believe p merely on the basis of understanding p.

However, many claim that the primary notion of intuition is one on which S has an intuition that p only when S is occurrently in the relevant conscious psychological state. If so, any purely dispositionalist account fails to capture the occurrent conscious character of intuitions in much the way dispositional analyses of other conscious states fail. It is quite possible to have, at a time, a large number of dispositions to believe while failing to host, at that time, a single intuition. For example, a person might have an intuition that the naïve comprehension axiom is true when asked to consider it, but not have such an intuition while driving home in heavy traffic. And yet it may be true throughout that she is disposed to believe the proposition merely upon understanding it (Bealer 1998: 209). As well, one may now have direct introspective knowledge that one has an intuition that p while one has no such direct introspective knowledge regarding one’s dispositions, especially one’s non-activated dispositions, to believe on the basis of mere understanding. (For additional discussion of dispositionalist analyses see Pust 2000, Erlenbaugh and Molyneux 2009, and Koksvik 2011.)

1.3 Intuitions as Sui Generis States

A final family of accounts holds that an intuition is a sui generis occurrent propositional attitude, variously characterized as one in which a proposition occurrently seems true (Bealer 1998, 2002; Pust 2000; Huemer 2001, 2005), in which a proposition is presented to the subject as true (Chudnoff 2011a; Bengson 2015), or which pushes the subject to believe a proposition (Koksvik 2011). Such views are united in denying that belief that p is necessary or sufficient for an intuition that p and in rejecting dispositional analyses of intuition. The close connection between intuition that p and disposition to believe p is explained by claiming that intuitions typically serve as the ground of the disposition to believe p.

According to proponents of accounts of this sort, when one has an intuition that p, one does not merely represent or believe or consider p. Rather, p is the content of a distinctive occurrent conscious non-belief propositional attitude. Bealer, for example, claims that

When you have an intuition that A, it seems to you that A. Here ‘seems’ is understood, not in its use as a cautionary or “hedging” term, but in its use as a term for a genuine kind of conscious episode. For example, when you first consider one of de Morgan’s laws, often it neither seems true nor seems false; after a moment’s reflection, however, something happens: it now just seems true. (Bealer 1998: 207)

Some philosophers who endorse such views also hold that perceptual (and other) experiences have propositional contents and seek to provide an account of the distinctive features of intuition, perception and other seemings or experiences.

According to the “seemings” version of such a view, an indiscriminate account of intuition would be the following:

  • [A6] S has the intuition that p if and only if it seems to S that p.

While this account seems fitting for much psychological work on the topic of intuitions, it is insufficiently discriminating. If memorial or introspective seemings with propositional content exist, they are not plausibly identified with intuitions of the sort with which this entry began. Moreover, when conjoined with the view that perceptual experience consists of a suitable seeming that p, this view implies that there are perceptual intuitions. Clarity is served by stipulating that such states are not intuitions even if they are all species of some common genus.

A more discriminating account is the following:

  • [A7] S has the intuition that p if and only if it intellectually seems to S that p.

Some, however, have claimed that there is an important distinction between the intuitions of primary interest in philosophical inquiry and other states which involve intellectual seemings that p. Bealer, for example, claims that philosophical inquiry typically relies upon “a priori intuitions” which must be distinguished from the “physical intuitions” elicited by scientific thought experiments in that the latter do not present themselves as necessary while the former do (1998: 165). Those who wish to distinguish the states involved in scientific thought experiments from those typically involved in philosophical inquiry may either endorse [A7] and reject the suggestion that such physical intuitions involve the same intellectual seeming or impose further conditions on those intuitions of distinctive philosophical relevance as in the following accounts:

  • [A8] S has the rational intuition that p if and only if it intellectually seems to S that necessarily p.
  • [A9] S has the rational intuition that p if and only if either [A] (1) it intellectually seems to S that p and (2) if S were to consider whether p is necessarily true, it would intellectually seem to S that necessarily p, or [B] it intellectually seems to S that necessarily p.

[A8] renders all rational intuitions overtly modal in content and, on a view of concept possession according to which possessing the concept c at t requires the ability to deploy c in thought at t, requires a level of sophistication not obviously had by the philosophical innocent who is, nonetheless, presumably capable of having a rational intuition (Pust 2000: 38; Ludwig 2007: 136). Moreover, possibility intuitions are also essential to philosophical practice and if the proponent of [A8] wishes to include possibility claims as the contents of intuitions (rather than treating them as inferentially justified by a rational intuition and the principle that what is necessarily possible is possible), then they must treat such intuitions as possessed of an iterated modal propositional content.

[A9] (see Pust 2000: 46) requires a single occurrent conscious psychological state in rational intuition and distinguishes that state from physical intuitions while allowing that a naïve agent might have a rational intuition even though not currently deploying the concept of metaphysical necessity. It also does not require that a possibility intuition involve an occurrent iterated modal content. However, because it leaves the distinction between a rational and physical (or other) intuitions sometimes dependent on dispositional rather than occurrent factors, [A9] may raise worries about our ability to discern directly that we harbor a rational intuition.

Some philosophers maintain that such sui generis propositional attitudes do not exist or are not part of their own mental life. For example, Williamson writes,

For myself, I am aware of no intellectual seeming beyond my conscious inclination to believe the Gettier proposition… . These paradigms provide no evidence of intellectual seemings, if the phrase is supposed to mean anything more than intuitions in Lewis’s or van Inwagen’s sense. (2007: 217)

Proponents of such accounts must be concerned to explain the error of their opponents and, ideally, to enable them to locate the states in themselves. (See Chudnoff 2011a and Koksvik 2011 for attempts to help such skeptics by describing carefully that which they should seek.)

Williamson (2007: 218–219) argues against analyses of the sort now under consideration and in favor of a more permissive belief or dispositional analysis by noting that a wide variety of propositions may be properly called “counterintuitive” and that this class does not consist merely of the negations of propositions which are, according to more restrictive accounts of intuition, the contents of intuitions. For example, Williamson points out that philosophical views which entail that there are no mountains are often thought, in virtue of such entailments, to be highly counterintuitive. The proposition that there are mountains is, however, not the content of an intuition on any of the accounts in this family.

One possible rejoinder to Williamson’s argument would be to characterize the counterintuitive claim as the claim that no suitable arrangement of matter is metaphysically sufficient for the presence of a mountain (i.e., that mountains are impossible) and there is no reason why the negation of this proposition cannot be, on more restrictive accounts of intuition, the content of an intuition. Another possible rejoinder would point out that we have extremely good grounds for believing that there are mountains and to suggest that the complaint that p is counterintuitive is merely the claim that not-p is extremely well-justified.

1.4 Propositions, Properties, and Faculties

It has thus far been assumed that intuitions always take propositions as their objects. Some might disagree, holding that we have de re or objectual intuitions of properties or states of affairs. Indeed, it might be held that our de re grasp of various properties is what grounds or justifies our assent to propositions involving them. Pursuit of this issue would require a detailed account of propositions and properties and their relations. It would also require detailed accounts of the de dicto and de re attitudes. None of these explorations can be undertaken here. It should be noted, however, that such a conception of our de re grasp of properties lurks under the surface of many rationalist accounts whether framed in terms of concepts or properties (Bealer 1998; BonJour 1998) and is even more explicit in the claim that we have knowledge by acquaintance of universals (Russell 1912).

In addition, the precise conception of propositional contents may have to be varied with the account of intuition. For example, those who appeal to propositions which seem true or which one is inclined to believe would presumably hold that what we are justified in believing via rational intuition is not a pure Russellian proposition but rather either a Fregean proposition or a Russellian proposition under something like a mode of presentation.

Finally, the focus above has been on intuitions as psychological states or events. Sometimes the issues surrounding intuitions are framed in terms of whether there is a distinct faculty of intuition. Of course, to the extent that intuitions are causally explicable, there is some process which produces them and some may wish to call that process a “faculty.” If that is all that is meant by the term, then no harm is done. Still, while such talk may have its place (especially in various cognitive scientific attempts to explain the occurrence of intuitions), taking it to mean more than just suggested seems to prejudice the issue of how much intuitive justification is like the justification produced by empirical faculties like vision and to invite dismissive caricatures of the view that intuitions serve to justify beliefs.

2. The Epistemological Role of Intuitions

2.1 Philosophical and Non-Philosophical Uses of Intuitions

As noted in §1, the focus of the present entry is the role of intuitions in philosophy. It is as accounts of such intuitions that the accounts above were evaluated. Hence, in what follows, it will be assumed that the appropriate account of the states at issue is some relatively restrictive version of the sui generis state account (§1.3). Such an assumption is not, however, essential to much of what follows.

In light of the discussion of §1, some of the states which are included in more expansive accounts of intuition might be better taken to be perceptual seemings or experiences of the sort endorsed by those who claim we have perceptual seemings or experiences with complex propositional content. In this connection, it is worth considering the views of various theorists who hold that perceptual experience can basically represent, and present to a subject, propositions featuring sophisticated properties well beyond phenomenological ones (Siegel 2010). On this kind of view, those with suitable training might have a perceptual experience that a child is ill or that a fire will soon engulf a room in the way that a non-expert has a perceptual experience that they are presented with something red. The epistemology of such propositional perceptual states (if they exist) must be addressed elsewhere.

2.2 The Method of Cases

Consider the following paradigmatic examples of contemporary philosophical reasoning in which a philosophical theory is taken to be prima facie undermined by contradicting an intuition regarding a particular hypothetical case:

The Gettier Case (Gettier 1963):
Suppose that Smith and Jones have applied for a certain job. Smith believes, on the basis of strong evidence, that Jones will get the job and also that Jones has ten coins in his pocket. He infers from this that the man who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket. However, imagine that, unknown to Smith, he himself, not Jones, will get the job. And, also unknown to Smith, he himself has ten coins in his pocket.
Gettier Intuition: Smith does not know that the man who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket.
Justified True Belief Theory of Knowledge: S knows that p IFF S has a justified true belief that p.
The Transplant Case (Thomson 1976):
Suppose that you are a transplant surgeon and that you now have five patients, each in need of a different organ in order to prevent imminent and certain death. You also have a suitable donor in your hospital for a routine check-up. If you were to involuntarily (and secretly) take her organs and transplant them into the needy five, you are certain to bring about her death but also to prevent the death of the five.
Transplant Intuition: It is not morally permissible to take the organs of the one in order to save the five.
Act Utilitarian Theory of Morality: Action A is morally right IFF A maximizes well-being.
The Chinese Nation Case (Block 1978)
Suppose that the citizens of China are organized so as to be functionally equivalent to a human brain and to interact with a human-like body in a manner functionally equivalent to that in which the brain interacts with the human body.
Chinese Nation Intuition: The nation of China, so organized, would lack qualia (i.e., there would be nothing it would be like to be the nation of China).
Functionalist Theory of Mind: S has mental state M IFF S contains a realization of functional state F.
The Flagpole Case (Bromberger 1966)
Suppose that a flagpole is standing on level ground in bright sunshine. From a specification of the length of the flagpole’s shadow and the height of the sun in the sky one can, given the relevant laws of optics, deduce the height of the flagpole.
Flagpole Intuition: The height of the flagpole is not explained by the length of its shadow.
Deductive-Nomological Theory of Explanation: E is an explanation of F IFF E is a set of truths which deductively implies F and the deduction relies essentially on a nomic generalization.

Such examples could easily be multiplied to include teletransportation and fission cases in the literature on personal identity, preemption and epiphenomena cases in the literature on causation and explanation, clairvoyance and evil demon cases in epistemology, Newcomb cases in decision theory, Frankfurt cases in the literature on free will, Twin-Earth and Swampman cases in the literature on mental content, Jackson’s Mary case in the metaphysics of mind, trolley cases in applied ethics, experience machine cases in normative ethics, and many many others.

In each such instance, the fact that the theory or generalization in question contravenes the content of an intuition is treated as (defeasible) evidence against the theory or generalization. As well, the fact that a theory implies results which agree with intuitions is commonly taken to constitute prima facie support for the theory. (See the supplementary document “The Logical Structure of the Method of Cases” for further discussion of the logical structure of such reasoning.)

This use of intuitions is, perhaps, even clearer if we consider what seems to be a contrast between philosophical methodology and that of the natural sciences. An empirical scientist must engage in empirical observation of some sort in an order to confirm or disconfirm the theories with which her discipline is engaged. If judged by her practice, the philosopher, by contrast, appears able to proceed largely or entirely from the armchair. If one takes the evidence to which natural science is primarily responsive to be that produced by empirical observation, it seems that philosophical (and other) inquiry proceeding from the armchair must have some other (putative) evidential basis. A natural (though contested) suggestion is that intuitions are treated as the primary evidence in philosophical inquiry.

(Some contemporary discussion of the methodology and epistemology of the appeal to particular hypothetical cases treats them as “thought experiments” and endeavors to draw analogies between the role of such cases in philosophical inquiry and the role of thought experiments in empirical science (Horowitz and Massey 1991; Sorensen 1992). This analogy is not pursued here for reasons outlined in §1.3.)

2.3 General Intuitions

The four examples above (§2.2) involve appeal to intuitions regarding particular hypothetical cases in philosophical theorizing. There are, however, other prominent examples of appeals to intuition, such as those of the epistemological rationalist. For present purposes, the epistemological rationalist is one who holds that belief in some propositions is not justified by sense experience, introspection, or memory, but rather by rational intuition (BonJour 1998; Bealer 1998).

One traditional argument for rationalism appeals to various propositions which (a) we seem clearly justified in believing, and (b) seem justified not by experience, but rather simply by our seeming to see or apprehend that they are true. Plausible candidates include principles of classical logic, basic arithmetic, analytic propositions, color or shape exclusion principles, and transitivity claims. The following examples are representative:

  • [R1] Nothing can be red and green all over at the same time.
  • [R2] \(2 + 2 = 4\)
  • [R3] If A is taller than B and B is taller than C, then A is taller than C.
  • [R4] There are no round squares.
  • [R5] (P and Q) implies Q.

The hypothetical case examples which drive much philosophical theorizing in epistemology, moral theory, metaphysics, and the philosophy of mind are, in some sense, particular in content. The rationalist’s examples are typically more general.

In fact, there are philosophically significant propositions at all levels of generality which may be the content of intuitions. Here are some examples of general propositions which have been alleged to be intuitive:

  • [G1] If S is justified in believing p and justified in believing \(\Box(p \supset q)\), then S is justified in believing q.
  • [G2] If X is a heap of sand, then X remains a heap even if one grain of sand is removed.
  • [G3] S performs act A freely only if S could have done otherwise.
  • [G4] For every property P, there is a set of individuals (perhaps empty) which possess P.
  • [G5] Through a given point not on a given line, there exists exactly one line parallel to the given line.
  • [G6] Whether a later person, y, is numerically identical to an earlier person, x, can depend only on intrinsic facts about x and y and the relations between x and y.
  • [G7] Any two possible actions exactly alike in all non-moral respects must be exactly alike in all moral respects.

2.4 Intuitions as Evidence: Intuiteds vs. Intuitings

The previous sections have aimed to show that much philosophical inquiry depends in significant ways on intuitions as evidence or reasons. However, such a claim is ambiguous. To say that the intuition that p is treated as evidence might be to claim that the fact that a person has an intuition is taken to serve as some kind of evidence (the intuiting) or it might be to claim that the propositional content of the intuition (the intuited) is treated as the evidence.

Treating the intuitings as the exclusive evidence has been alleged to overly psychologize philosophy (Pust 2001) and to play into the hands of skeptics of both the armchair and empirical variety (Williamson 2007; Deutsch 2010). After all, if one’s ultimate evidence is psychological, it can seem a difficult question why such states or events ought to be treated as evidence for claims which are not psychological at all—claims about the nature of knowledge, morality, modality, etc. (For the suggestion that philosophers should instead treat many of their efforts as aiming to explicate the structure and content of our mental representations, see Goldman 1999, 2007.) Furthermore, it doesn’t seem at all plausible that most explicit philosophical argument and analysis proceeds from psychological premises (i.e., premises about what some person or persons find intuitive). Rather, they appeal to claims regarding knowledge, justification, morality, explanation, etc.

On the other hand, to fail to address the fact that the proposition in question is intuitive—that it is the content of an intuiting—is, it seems, to neglect something important about one’s apparent justification for believing the proposition. While most of our putative evidence in philosophy consists of non-psychological propositions, what qualifies such propositions as our evidence must have something to do with our epistemic justification for believing them. Even if philosophical argumentation rarely includes premises about the intuitiveness of a proposition, our justification for accepting the premises in an argument is of great importance in determining the ultimate justificatory force of the argument.

Hence, the view that intuitions are treated as evidence in philosophy is best thought of as the view that, with respect to many core questions of philosophy, our justification for believing an answer consists (at least substantially) in our having suitable intuitions. It does not follow that all explicit philosophical reasoning can be properly represented as beginning with propositions stating that we have intuitions of various sorts (that route is self-defeating and incapable of accounting for justification by reasoning). Put simply, the view is that the occurrence of an intuiting is taken to provide the person in whom it occurs with prima facie justification for believing the intuited. Alternatively, it holds that S’s having an intuition that p prima facie justifies S in believing that p. Given a capacious view of evidence, then, both the intuiting and the intuited are treated as evidence, the occurrence of the former being treated as prima facie non-inferential justification for accepting the latter and the latter as a potential inferential justification for further propositions.

Those who prefer to focus on knowledge rather than justification can take the claim that intuitions are treated as evidence as the claim that beliefs based on intuition (if intuitions are distinct from beliefs) or intuitive beliefs are usually taken to be knowledge and so taken as evidence for further claims. They may also allow that having an intuition that p is, when it is veridical, a way of knowing that p and thereby having p as part of one’s evidence (Cath 2012).

The view that intuitions are treated as evidence in philosophy has come under recent attack by a number of philosophers (Williamson 2007; Cappelen 2012; Deutsch 2015). The critics seem clearly to wish to deny that philosophical practice treats the having of an intuition as prima facie justification for its content, either because they deny that intuitions (at least as characterized by the sui generis accounts) exist or because they are skeptical that such states could serve as prima facie justification for their contents. Though Williamson, as noted above, suggests he cannot introspectively locate such states, Cappelen and Deutsch largely avoid introspective appeals, arguing instead that attention to philosophical practice and writing reveals little evidence of appeals to intuitions. Instead, they claim that close attention to influential discussions in philosophy reveals the ultimate source of justification for various claims is to be found in arguments.

The rejoinder to such a revisionary view of the role of intuitions takes various forms. An understanding of the sort of state at issue may require careful introspection and theorizing of the sort appearing above. Moreover, one may doubt that a given account of the nature of intuitions is correct without doubting that intuitions exist. A further rejoinder would be to argue that much of the written work discussed by Cappelen and Deutsch features language which is plausibly used to designate intuitions and, additionally, that the provision of arguments supporting verdicts regarding various thought experiments is not inconsistent with the author’s taking (implicitly or explicitly) intuitions to serve as prima facie justification for their contents (Bengson 2014; Devitt 2015).

3. Challenges and Defenses

3.1 Four Constraints on Skeptical Challenges

Skeptics about intuitions allege that we are not justified in believing the contents of our intuitions. Prior consideration of the features that a suitable skeptical argument must possess will allow greater concision below and will also aid in revealing common features of the arguments.

First, such arguments are arguments for the conclusion that intuitions (either intuitions generally or intuitions of some specific sort) do not justify us in believing their contents. Hence, any such skeptical argument must have a premise stating a necessary condition on the justification of belief. Call this premise, “the normative premise.” Second, such an argument must contain a premise stating that beliefs based on the intuitions in question do not satisfy the necessary condition of justified belief advanced in the normative premise. Call this premise, “the non-normative premise.

Third, a successful argument for selective skepticism regarding intuitions must be one which does not equally apply to many other sources of putatively justified belief. After all, if the argument at issue would also justify skepticism regarding perceptual belief and/or memorial and/or introspective belief, it shows nothing distinctively problematic about intuitions or beliefs based upon them. Call this constraint on a successful argument, “the local skepticism constraint.

Finally, (a) the justification for the normative and the non-normative premises must be provided by some source of evidence or justification other than intuitions of the sort impugned by the argument and (b) we must lack good reason to think that our belief in the normative or factual premise fails the necessary condition on justified belief advanced by the normative premise. Call the conjunction of these requirements “the non-self-undermining constraint” (Bealer 1992; Pust 2001; but see Silva 2013). While running afoul of this constraint does not provide reason to think the argument at issue unsound, it appears a reasonable constraint on a skeptical argument meant to produce reflectively justified belief in a conclusion in virtue of its following from justified premises. Given that the proponents of the various skeptical arguments to be discussed are mere local skeptics, they certainly appear to be offering arguments aimed at inducing philosophically reasonable belief in a local skeptical thesis regarding intuition.

Attempts to construe skeptical arguments against intuition as a reductio of the supposition that intuitions have evidential worth will not be discussed below. Note, however, that their proponents (a) require some justification for the relevant inferential principles required by the reductio, and (b) are likely to be deprived of any justified positive epistemological position, let alone one sufficient to justify the typical intuition skeptic’s high epistemic regard for empirical inquiry.

3.2 The Argument from Lack of Independent Calibration

Some skeptics regarding intuition argue that intuition is epistemically illegitimate because it cannot be independently calibrated. In Cummins’ forceful presentation of the argument, this independent calibration requirement is used to justify the conclusion that we should “dismiss philosophical intuition as epistemologically valueless” (1998: 125).

Let us state the argument as follows:

The Argument from Lack of Independent Calibration

  • [P1] One is justified in believing the contents of a putative source of evidence only if one has independent justification for the belief that the putative source is reliable.
  • [P2] We lack independent justification for the belief that intuitions are reliable.
  • [C] We are not justified in believing the contents of intuitions.

Though it has substantial plausibility in connection with various derived epistemic sources such as scientific instruments, it is clear that [P1] runs afoul of the local skepticism constraint. It amounts to a demand which is in principle unsatisfiable. If, as [P1] implies, intuition must be calibrated by some other source, X, then, by [P1], X must itself be calibrated by yet another source of evidence, Y, which must itself be calibrated and so on. Some hold, in virtue of this fact, that it is impossible to arrive at justified belief and others that it is, in suitable circumstances, possible to do so. If the former is true, then [P1] runs afoul of the local skepticism constraint. If, instead, the latter is true, then [P1] is false. Additionally, it seems clear that an argument for [P1] will require evidential reliance on epistemic intuitions and so contravene the non-self-undermining requirement.

What of [P2]? Setting aside non-reductive accounts of testimony, independent calibrations look unlikely to succeed for the full range of philosophically relevant intuitions, at least given the more constrained accounts of intuition above. The primary reason is the lack of overlap between the contents of intuitions and those beliefs justified by suitably independent sources. One doesn’t, it seems, use one’s senses to discern if some hypothetical case is a case of knowledge or right action or a case in which the hypothetical entity is conscious or in which two temporally distinct persons are the same person. As well, while perception may indicate the truth of some proposition and hence its possibility, it seems incapable of itself demonstrating the possibility of non-actual truths or the necessity of any proposition.

3.3 Arguments from Unreliability

A more plausible normative premise would hold that unreliable (rather than uncalibratable) faculties cannot justify belief, yielding the following:

The Argument from Unreliability—First Version

  • [P1] One is justified in believing on the (sole) basis of a putative source of evidence only if it is reliable.
  • [P2] Intuitions (or intuitions of type T) are not reliable.
  • [C] Beliefs based (solely) on intuitions (or intuitions of type T) are not justified.

Insofar as the normative premise is meant to articulate a necessary truth, it is open to the “new evil demon” counterexample to the necessity of reliability (Cohen 1984) according to which subjects with exactly our experiences and beliefs are justified in believing as we do even if they are the victims of a deceptive evil demon. As a natural interpretation of the reliability condition would be contravened here, this is taken by many to demonstrate that reliability (so understood) is not a necessary condition of justified belief.

However, even those who reject [P1] typically allow that good reason to think a putative source of evidence is unreliable is sufficient to defeat whatever prima facie justification it may otherwise provide. Hence, we may reformulate the argument as follows in order to provide it with a more plausible normative premise:

The Argument from Unreliability—Second Version

  • [P1*] One is justified in believing on the (sole) basis of a putative source of evidence only if one lacks (undefeated) reason to think it unreliable.
  • [P2*] We have (undefeated) reasons to think intuitions (or intuitions of type T) unreliable.
  • [C] Hence, beliefs based (solely) on intuitions (or intuitions of type T) are not justified.

As the defense of [P1] or [P1*] requires appeal to epistemic intuitions, any attempt to justify by such means a skeptical conclusion regarding all intuitions, all epistemic intuitions or even all normative intuitions, would fail to observe the non-self-undermining constraint.

Still, it is worth considering the possible ways of attempting to justify skeptical arguments of a more limited sort by arguing that intuitions of some sort (which does not include epistemic intuitions or at least the epistemic intuitions of the sort needed to justify the premises) are unreliable. Given that the relevant non-normative premise must claim that intuitions of the sort at issue are more frequently false than true (or equally likely to be false as to be true) it seems to require an inductive justification based on a sufficiently large number of cases in which we have justification for believing \({\sim}p\) while p is the content of an intuition.

One way of developing the case would involve a sufficiently large number of cases in which one has an intuition-independent justification for thinking \({\sim}p\) while intuition testifies that p (intrapersonal intersource inconsistency). Another would involve a sufficiently large number of cases in which one has the intuition that p and either oneself or some other person has the intuition that \({\sim}p\). In the intrapersonal case, this might involve our finding a given proposition intuitive and, at some other time, our finding its explicit negation intuitive (intrapersonal intrasource inconsistency). More likely is a less direct inconsistency, as when we have two intuitions which, though not the explicit propositional negations of each other, can be shown to contradict with the aid of some other justified principle. Many contemporary skeptics, however, wish to appeal to interpersonal disagreement as justification for their skepticism. Here we should distinguish between cases in which some other person has intuition-independent justification for believing the negation of the content of one of one’s own intuitions (interpersonal intersource inconsistency) and cases in which the other person has an intuition with a content contradicting one’s own intuition or, perhaps, fails to have any intuition regarding p (interpersonal intrasource inconsistency).

3.3.1 Intersource Inconsistency

As noted when conceding the factual premise, [P2], of the Argument from Lack of Independent Calibration (§3.2), on the sui generis accounts of intuition (§1.3), there are few, if any, direct conflicts between the putative deliverances of rational intuition and our other sources of evidence (Bealer 1998; BonJour 1998). Indirect conflicts would be ones in which the results of empirical theory contradict the content of rational intuitions. Such cases, if there are any, are quite rare.

Indeed, in view of the lack of direct conflicts, there is substantial reason to think indirect conflicts must be quite rare as standard empirical theorizing seems unlikely to yield conclusions about the domains about which intuition seems to inform us. These facts suggest that interpersonal interfaculty inconsistency will also be an insufficient basis for skepticism.

3.3.2 Intrasource Inconsistency

The main case of intrapersonal intrasource inconsistency has been mentioned previously—the case of paradoxes. To support the present (limited) skeptical argument, however, it must be parlayed into an argument that intuitions are so unreliable as to fail to justify belief at all.

It is not clear how this can be done. For one thing, there remains the fact that most of a person’s intuitions are not in conflict with one another. For another, some conflicts between intuitions can be resolved by standard means or by favoring the more intuitive propositions. This is not to claim that such disagreements might not rationally require a suspension of judgment about the actual contradicting intuitions (if they are suitably balanced in strength). However, such a conclusion is quite limited and extends clearly only to areas of demonstrable and irresolvable inconsistency.

The case of greatest interest to skeptics is likely to be the case of interpersonal intrasource inconsistency or disagreement. We must be careful to distinguish between interpersonal conflicts of intuitions and conflicts between beliefs or between beliefs and intuitions. Philosophers disagree a great deal about the correct theory of free will, knowledge, justification and the like. This fact has been alleged to make a certain sort of epistemic modesty (though not complete skepticism) about the theoretical accomplishments of philosophy quite reasonable (Christensen 2007). However, philosophers seem to disagree less about what the relevant intuitions are. Bealer claims that

the on-balance agreement among our elementary concrete-case intuitions is one of the most impressive general facts about human cognition. (1998: 214)

(See, however, “the variation project” of experimental philosophers discussed in §4.1.) Functionalists, for example, don’t usually claim to lack the intuition that the Chinese nation (Block 1978) would lack qualia. Rather, they often go to great lengths to explain away such intuitions, formulate the functionalist theory to accommodate them (Putnam 1967), or selectively deflate their epistemic value. Reliabilists don’t typically claim that there is no new evil demon problem (Cohen 1984). Rather, they engage in considerable maneuvering to discount the intuition, to rephrase it in a way not damaging to straightforward reliabilism, or, most commonly, to provide an alternative, recognizably reliabilist, theory which accommodates the intuition.

Much of the recent literature on the epistemic significance of disagreement is focused on cases in which two persons disagree with respect to a single proposition which is inferentially justified, and in which the two parties are known to each other to have the same evidence and general cognitive virtues (Christensen 2009). The lessons of such cases for the present questions are likely to be limited. If intuitions are evidence which non-inferentially justify belief, then even if one ought to suspend judgment in the aforementioned kind of case, it will not follow that one ought to do so in the case of intuitive disagreements. Hence, we must instead focus on cases of disagreement between non-inferentially justified beliefs or, more appropriately, on the propositional content of some non-doxastic basis for such belief. Feldman (2007) provides a perceptual case (explicitly compared to something like rational intuition) in which one person seems to see p and the other, similarly situated, does not seem to see p. When the two become apprised of each other’s appearances (and know each other to have equally good vision and to be honest), Feldman avers that they must withhold judgment on p. Perhaps the same is true with respect to philosophical intuitions.

However, it can be difficult to determine if another’s failure to have an intuition that p is epistemically significant, as they may have yet to really grasp or consider the precise proposition at issue. An analogous claim is true in the perceptual case as well, as when one sees an object which is well camouflaged and another claims not to see it. Still, restricting ourselves to a situation in which one has good reason to think the other fully understands the content at issue and claims either not to have the intuition or to have the contrary intuition, we must ask what the appropriate responses to such cases is. Here, it does seem that the proper response is sometimes (depending on the proposition at issue) suspension of belief or some suitable diminution of credence (BonJour 1998: 138–142). Even if the correct response to disagreement about p in such cases is the suspension of belief (or a reduction of credence), it won’t follow that beliefs in propositions about which no known disagreement exists are undermined. Nor could it follow that one must always have independent reason to think there is no disagreement prior to being justified in accepting the content of an intuition. That would be impossible.

A serious case for disagreement-based local skepticism regarding some entire class of intuitions which evades the non-self-undermining constraint would require justification for thinking that quite substantial disagreement with some equally (or more) competent other person has arisen. It cannot be supposed that the question of whether one is justified in thinking that some apparent competent interlocutor is sincerely testifying that p is entirely independent of the content of their apparent assertion or of one’s total evidence relevant to existence of other minds and their mental contents of the appropriate sort. Some sorts of apparent disagreement call into question the understanding, sanity, intelligence, or sincerity of one’s interlocutor, as when some other denies some basic truth of arithmetic. Consider a version of Feldman’s perceptual case in which there are successive occasions on which one seems to see p and one’s interlocutor apparently denies that they see any such thing. Were they to become frequent enough, there might be reason to doubt that the other is honest and competent, speaking one’s language, or, indeed, whether there is another person to whom one is speaking. Similar obstacles arise for the possibility of very widespread disagreement of intuitions, especially on views according to which the reliability of intuitions is constitutive of possessing certain concepts (Bealer 1998; Huemer 2005; Ludwig 2007).

3.4 Arguments from Explanation

Many of the most interesting arguments for skepticism regarding philosophical intuitions do not appeal to direct evidence of unreliability, but are instead instances of what shall here be called “arguments from explanation.” Such arguments maintain either that (a) the fact that our best explanations of the occurrence of intuitions (i.e., intuitings) do not appeal to the truth of their contents is reason to think we are not justified in accepting such contents, or that (b) the fact that we cannot provide any explanation of how our intuitions are or could be reliable regarding the domains about which they might initially appear to inform us, is reason to think we are not justified in believing their contents. Let us call former sort of argument “the argument from lack of explanatory necessity” and the second sort, “the argument from inexplicability of reliability.” Recent arguments of this sort have been discussed by those concerned with so-called “debunking arguments” regarding our moral beliefs and intuitions (Street 2006; Clarke-Doane 2015).

3.4.1 The Argument from Lack of Explanatory Necessity

Gilbert Harman (1977) suggests that moral theories are unjustified because they cannot be tested and confirmed in the way that scientific theories can. While he admits that we may “test” general moral principles against our intuitions regarding particular actual and hypothetical situations, he argues that we are not thereby testing our moral theories or principles against the world. Instead, we are merely testing them against our “moral sensibility” or against our tacitly held moral views.

Harman claims that there is an important difference between the use of observations in empirical science and the use of intuitions in moral inquiry, a difference which renders moral intuitions unable to provide evidence for moral theory. The alleged difference is that

you need to make assumptions about certain physical facts to explain the occurrence of the observations that support a scientific theory, but you do not seem to need to make assumptions about any moral facts to explain the occurrence

of the moral intuitions. When, for example, one has the intuition, in the Transplant case, that it would be wrong for a doctor to kill an unconsenting healthy patient to save the lives of five other patients,

an assumption about moral facts would seem to be totally irrelevant to the explanation of your making the judgment you make

and hence the intuition “does not seem … to be … evidence for or against any moral theory” (1977: 6–7). The argument seems to be:

The Argument from Lack of Explanatory Necessity

  • [P1] Aside from propositions describing the occurrence of her introspectively accessible states, S is justified in believing only those propositions which are part of the best explanation of the occurrence of those introspectively accessible states.
  • [P2] Moral propositions are not part of the best explanation of the occurrence of S’s introspectively accessible states.
  • [C] S is not justified in believing moral propositions.

The normative premise, [P1], is perfectly general and hence may be equally deployed to undermine justified belief of any proposition failing its standard. Indeed, there seems equally good reason to think that the propositions which are the contents of most philosophical intuitions will not be part (outside of attitude contexts) of the best explanation of our having those intuitions. (See Goldman 1989, 1992 for similar skeptical arguments regarding the use of intuitions in contemporary metaphysics.)

One possible response to this sort of argument is to concede [P1] and to argue, for the class of propositions at issue, that they do satisfy the necessary condition of justification. This maneuver is represented by Sturgeon’s (1984) rejoinder to Harman. Sturgeon suggests that it is often reasonable to think that we wouldn’t think some action or person possessed a relevant moral property unless they in fact possessed the property. More precisely, he holds that in order for a given act or agent to have a different moral status it or they would have to differ in some non-moral way and then we often would not take it or them to have the same moral status. However, whatever the plausibility of this account with respect to actual token actions or persons, it is less clear how the counterfactual criterion would apply to the moral status of actions featured in the merely hypothetical cases found in typical methodology. Moreover, even if one takes Sturgeon’s maneuver to be successful against Harman’s attack on moral intuitions, it seems quite unclear how it is to be extended to the many appeals to intuition catalogued above (§2).

It has also been argued that [P1] is unjustified (Pust 2001). There appear to be only two ways that [P1] could be justified. It might be justified by being intuitive or by being supported by our intuitions regarding particular cases of justified belief. [P1] is not, however, intuitive. Furthermore, an inductive argument for [P1] based on our intuitions about particular cases of justified belief will not support [P1] since many of what seem, intuitively, to be our most justified beliefs run afoul of [P1]. (See, for example, [I1]–[I4] from §1 and the examples in §2.2 and §2.3.) Many of our particular epistemic beliefs, moral beliefs, and modal beliefs seem, intuitively, no less justified than our empirical beliefs. Indeed, some of them seem more justified. Since it seems implausible that all of these propositions are required in the best explanation of the occurrence of our intuitions, it seems that [P1], which requires such a role, is undermined by such cases.

Even if there were sufficient intuitive support for [P1], defending this argument by such means would contravene both strands of the non-self-undermining constraint (Pust 2001). According to [P1], S’s non-introspective belief that p is justified only if the proposition believed plays a role in the best explanation of S’s mental states. No demonstration of explanatory relevance is involved in the two methods of justifying [P1] just discussed. Rather, each approach would take the mere fact that the principle is the content of an intuition or best explains the content of a set of particular intuitions (i.e., intuiteds) as sufficient for justified belief in that principle. This is to treat intuiteds as supporting evidence for a principle allowing only intuitings to count as evidence. Moreover, since [P1] states a necessary condition for the justified acceptance of any proposition not about the occurrence of an observation or intuition, acceptance of [P1] itself is justified only if it satisfies the very requirement it articulates. Unfortunately, because [P1] is a normative proposition about when a belief is justified, it is difficult to see how its truth could play any role in the explanation of the occurrence of any of our experiences or intuitions. However, if [P1] does not satisfy [P1], then, if [P1] is true, we cannot be justified in believing [P1].

3.4.2 The Argument from Inexplicability of Reliability

The second argument from explanation has its origins in Benacerraf’s (1973) epistemological objection to Platonism in mathematics. Benacerraf argued that the best semantic accounts of mathematics (e.g., Platonist ones) were in tension with our best theories of knowledge (e.g., causal ones) and that attempts to bring the truth conditions of mathematical statements into closer epistemic proximity to human subjects were semantically inadequate. Though he claimed to favor “a causal account of knowledge” and such an account is now generally thought mistaken, it should be noted that Benacerraf motivated the causal connection constraint by noting that one may justify the claim that S does not know p by arguing that S

could not have come into possession of the relevant evidence or reasons: that [S’s] four-dimensional space-time worm does not make the necessary (causal) contact with the grounds of the truth of the proposition

for S to have adequate evidence (1973: 671).

Field (1989) provides a Benacerraf-style epistemic challenge to belief in mathematics (construed in a Platonist fashion), one which he alleges

does not depend on any theory of knowledge in the sense in which the causal theory is a theory of knowledge; that is it does not depend on any assumption about necessary and sufficient conditions for knowledge. (pp. 232–233)

On his account, the fundamental problem has to do with the impossibility of explaining “the reliability of our beliefs” in the domain in question. More precisely, he alleges that “if it appears impossible to explain” how our beliefs about some entities or our grounds for the beliefs “can so well reflect the facts about them,” then

that tends to undermine the belief in …. (these) entities, despite whatever initial reasons we might have for believing in them. (p. 26, emphasis added)

Though Field’s argument has various of our beliefs as it target, it seems to support the following argument against intuition:

The Argument from Inexplicability of Reliability

  • [P1] If we have good reason to think that there is no explanation of why our intuitions are reliable, then we are not justified in believing p on the basis of the intuition that p.
  • [P2] We have good reason to think that there is no explanation of why our intuitions are reliable.
  • [C] We are not justified in believing p on the basis of the intuition that p.

The non-normative premise, [P2], seems to extend to all necessary truths if the explanation of reliability mentioned in [P1] requires any sort of counterfactual sustaining relation between the truth makers of the propositions in question and our psychological states. The failure of explanation here is intimately linked to the intuitive deviance of counterfactuals featuring in their antecedents the negations of necessary propositions. The standard semantics treats them as uniformly and vacuously true and so there is little informative sense to be made of the notion that were some proposition we take to be (necessarily) true to be false we would believe (or intuit) otherwise than we do. As it is implausible that all our beliefs in non-contingent matters are unjustified, this cuts against [P1] if it is taken to require a counterfactual supporting kind of explanation.

If, on the other hand, [P1] requires only that we have reason to think our reliability not utterly mysterious, then, while [P1] is more plausible, the relevant instance of [P2] may be false. It has been suggested that the provision of an explanation of our having the intuitions we do would, in virtue of the impossibility of such propositions as we intuit having different truth values, suffice as an explanation of their reliability. There is no particular reason to think that our intuitions lack explanation while our other mental states have an explanation. That explanation, when conjoined with our prima facie justification for believing the contents of our intuitions (and our being prima facie justified isn’t challenged on this construal of the argument) seems to suffice as an explanation of our reliability. Put another way, if our reliability is a necessary accompaniment of having a certain content, then we have no reason to think our reliability is inexplicable. The explanation, in this sense, of our reliability is a straightforward consequence of the necessarily true contents of our intuitions and the psychological explanation for our having those particular intuitions (Pust 2004; Grundmann 2007: 84; but see Schechter 2010).

It may also be argued (Pust 2004) that it isn’t, as seems assumed by Field’s objection, clearly possible for a creature to have intuitions significantly different from our own. Given the more constrained accounts of intuition discussed above, it is not clear that a creature might have intuitions with contents generally contradicting our own. That such a creature is metaphysically possible is itself a modal claim apparently requiring justification by intuition and such intuitions seem to be lacking. This response to the explanationist can be elaborated in the context of a theory of concept possession according to which a necessary condition of the genuine possession of a given concept (of the sort of primary interest in philosophical investigation) is the reliability of one’s intuitions regarding hypothetical cases. Such an account is justified by intuitions and so cannot be an independent justification of them. It may, however, still reasonably be thought to be an explanation (though not a causal one) of their (necessary) reliability.

Finally, just as was true with respect to the Argument from Lack of Explanatory Necessity, there remains the concern that any attempt to justify believing [P1] and [P2] will run afoul of the non-self-undermining constraint by relying on intuitions about justification and explanation in order to argue that intuitions do not justify belief.

3.5 Defenses of Intuitions: Self-Support and Epistemic Circularity

There are, broadly speaking, two ways of defending the use of intuitions as evidence. The first possible defense would be an empirical defense of intuitions by arguing against the second premise of the Argument from Lack of Independent Calibration (§3.2). The defense would proceed by providing an inductive argument, based on non-intuitive evidence, that the contents of intuitions (either generally or of some specific sort) are reliable.

The only other apparent possible defense of the thesis that intuitions prima facie justify belief in their content appeals, as does the traditional rationalist, to the fact that there are many particular propositions which one seems justified in believing simply in virtue of their being the content of a rational intuition (Bealer 1998; BonJour 1998). The strength of the conclusion is, of course, more supported to the extent that such examples are multiplied. And, as noted above, there appear to be many such examples.

This defense may be generalized by claiming that intuition is self-supporting insofar as the general claim that intuitions provide prima facie justification for belief in their contents is itself intuitive. The possibility of such a defense is the result of the same fact that revealed that all of the extant local skeptical arguments run afoul of the non-self-undermining constraint—the fact that intuitions seem to be the only source of justification for claims about justification, reason, evidence, and other epistemic properties.

The obvious concern about this sort of defense (in both its particular and general form) is the fact that it necessarily involves epistemic circularity of some kind. That is, it defends the appeal to intuitions as reasons for belief by appeal to intuitions. It seems clear that epistemically circular defenses are sometimes illegitimate, as when questions about the epistemic probity of appeals to a crystal ball are answered by consulting the ball. However, as indicated above (§3.2), it also appears that some sort of epistemic circularity is inevitable in the attempt to defend our most basic modes of evidence and justification. Exactly when such circularity is epistemically disabling and when, if ever, it is acceptable is a difficult question which cannot be here treated in detail (Alston 1986, 1993; Bergmann 2006; Cohen 2002; Vogel 2008). However, a few remarks are in order.

First, if epistemic circularity is always unacceptable, then it is impossible to defend the appeal to intuition. However, the same result will follow (ultimately) for any putative source of evidence. So, while it will be the case that the use of intuitions as evidence cannot be defended, it will also follow that the reliance on perception, memory and introspection can also not be defended. Universal skepticism would appear to follow. Alternatively, if epistemic circularity is sometimes acceptable, then no reason has been provided why it is not acceptable in the case of rational intuition.

Second, if we focus on the question of whether we are prima facie justified in accepting the contents of our intuitions, there may be a feature which distinguishes intuition from all other putative sources of evidence. Only intuition is clearly capable of epistemic self-support because it is the only source which produces non-doxastic states with epistemically normative content. Whether or not apparent perception that p, introspection that p, or apparent memory that p justify us in believing their content is, it seems, a question they cannot answer as their content is never epistemic. Hence, intuition appears distinguishable from our other putative sources of evidence in being both required for a coherent epistemology and capable of epistemic self-support. So, if any source of evidence can be defended against global skeptical attack, it seems that intuitions can.

Recently, a number of philosophers have argued that the epistemic credentials of intuitions can be defended by appealing to similarities between perceptual justification and intuitive justification or to a general doctrine regarding non-inferential justification. According to perceptual dogmatism, a person having a perceptual experience or a perceptual seeming with propositional content p is thereby prima facie justified in believing p (Pryor 2000). According to intuitive dogmatism, a person having an intuition or intellectual seeming with propositional content p is thereby prima facie justified in believing p. According to general dogmatism, when it seems to a person that p, that person is thereby prima facie justified in believing p. It follows from general dogmatism that intuitions, as characterized by the various versions of the sui generis state view above (§1.3), are a source of justification (Huemer 2005, 2007). Moreover, it seems extremely plausible that if perceptual dogmatism is true, then so is intuitive dogmatism (Chudnoff 2011b; Koksvik 2011; Bengson 2015).

Whatever the merits of general or perceptual dogmatism, it is important to recognize that appealing to them in defending intuitive dogmatism involves exactly the same sort of epistemic circularity as that involved in the more straightforward defense previously noted. This is because all versions of dogmatism are themselves justified entirely on intuitive grounds—by the fact that they properly accommodate our various intuitions about the conditions under which a person has non-inferential propositional justification. Hence, appeals to dogmatism of any sort are ultimately justified only if intuitions do provide prima facie justification and so cannot serve as an independent defense of the appeal to intuitions. Epistemic circularity in the epistemology of intuition appears unavoidable.

4. Experimental Philosophy and Intuitions

4.1 The Nature of Experimental Philosophy

In the last ten to fifteen years, there has been an explosion of interest in research involving the scientific or empirical investigation of intuitions of philosophical interest. Such projects are now frequently grouped under the rubric of “experimental philosophy.” (For general characterizations of experimental philosophy see Knobe and Nichols 2008, Appiah 2008, and Nadelhoffer and Nahmias 2007.) At least four broadly-individuated projects in experimental philosophy can be distinguished.

The first project, “the psychology project,” aims to discover how people ordinarily think. Knobe and Nichols claim that the results of such inquiries “have great philosophical significance in their own right … for traditional philosophical questions” (2008: 12). This claim is motivated in part by the idea that questions which occupied the attention of historically significant philosophers ought to count as philosophically significant questions. As many philosophers of antiquity and the early modern period made various claims about human psychology, such questions, it is claimed, count as philosophical questions which may be better pursued by modern psychological inquiry.

The second project, “the verification project,” aims to determine if the various propositions which philosophers allege to be intuitive, pre-theoretical, or “part of common sense” are, in fact, intuitive to ordinary non-philosophers. This project is motivated both by the general conviction that empirical claims, such as those regarding the extent to which some belief or intuition is shared by others, require adequate empirical support, and by the suspicion that what philosophers find intuitive or regard as commonsensical may be the result of their specialized training, theoretical allegiance, or general cognitive biases (Nadelhoffer and Nahmias 2007: 125; Knobe and Nichols 2008: 9). An example of this approach can be found in Nahmias and colleagues’ investigations of free will (2006, 2007).

The third project, “the sources project,” aims to discover the psychological mechanisms or processes that produce people’s intuitions. According to Knobe and Nichols, it is motivated by the “hope … that we can use the information to help determine whether the psychological sources … undercut the warrant for the beliefs” based upon the source (2008: 9). Similarly, Allman and Woodward suggest that

better understanding of the sources and character of moral intuition will help to clarify whether and when it has a legitimate role in moral argument. (2008: 167)

Examples of this approach include: Greene’s (Greene et al. 2001; Greene 2003: 848) fMRI investigations of moral judgment (criticized in Berker 2009), Horowitz’s (1998) attempt (see also Sunstein 2005) to explain certain intuitions taken to support the doctrine of doing and allowing using Kahneman and Tversky’s prospect theory (criticized in Kamm 1998 and van Roojen 1999), and aspects of Nichols and Knobe’s (2007) investigations of the role of affect on judgments regarding the compatibility of determinism and moral responsibility.

The fourth project, “the variation project,” seeks to determine the extent of variation in intuitions between different groups, persons or persons-at-times or persons-in-contexts. Many working on this project hold that the empirically discovered variation in intuitions gives us reason to believe that intuitions are unreliable (Alexander et al. 2010). Examples of this approach (which traces its main intellectual lineage back to Stich 1988) include Weinberg et al. (2001) on cross-cultural variation in intuitions about knowledge (criticized in Sosa 2007), Swain et al. (2008) on order effects in intuitions about knowledge (criticized in Sosa 2007), Buckwalter and Stich (2013) on gender variation in intuitions of many sorts, and Machery et al. (2004) and Mallon et al. (2009) on cross-cultural variation in intuitions about reference (criticized in Ludwig 2007; Devitt 2011; Deutsch 2009; Sytsma and Livengood 2011).

4.2 The Experimental Evidence

For experimental philosophers seeking to investigate the sources, character, and distribution of intuitions of philosophical interest, the primary method has consisted of asking subjects questions about hypothetical scenarios, or less frequently, about principles or generalizations. The evidence has been responses (whether binary [yes/no] responses or graded [Likert scale] responses) to such survey questions. Those pursuing the sources project and the variation project also aim to determine which factors co-vary with answers—cultural or ethnic group, socio-economic status, region of brain or cognitive processes implicated in answering the question, psychopathology, order of questions, framing of questions, etc.

Of course, traditional first-person armchair methods seek to determine which features of the content of the scenario under consideration vary with one’s intuitions. Indeed, this is exactly how one endeavors to test or to make more precise some general thesis in many areas of philosophy. Proponents of the sources project and the variation project however, seek to determine which features of those considering the scenario or of framing or presenting the same question vary with the relevant intuitions.

There have been a variety of worries raised about the adequacy of survey methods as means of gaining access to intuitions of the relevant sort. The strength of these worries vary according to the conception of intuition. If, as claimed by various sui generis state accounts (§1.3), intuitions are not beliefs or mere dispositions to believe, then the inferential route from evidence consisting of survey responses to conclusions about intuitions is considerably lengthened.

First, differences in responses may be produced by different ways of “filling in” a schematic hypothetical case (Sosa 2007; Horvath 2015). Second, there may be multiple concepts answering to a single word (Sosa 2007). (For some recognition of this fact by experimental philosophers, see the use of the “coin-flipping” case by Weinberg et al. (2001) and Swain et al. (2008) to exclude subjects who use “S knows that p” to mean merely that S has high confidence that p.) These two suggestions do not raise the possibility that that the subjects in such surveys are not responding on the basis of intuitions. Rather, they raise the possibility that the intuitions are not intuitions regarding the same property or about the same case. (See Alexander and Weinberg 2007 for the suggestion that both of these concerns apply equally to non-solipsistic proponents of the traditional armchair methodology.)

A third, more general, worry is that such surveys run a risk of eliciting from subjects responses determined by something other than their intuitions regarding the answer to the survey question—e.g., by implicatures determined by what a sentence is typically used to communicate (Adams and Steadman 2004; Deutsch 2009; Bach 2002) and by more general pragmatic factors governing the determination of speaker meaning and task interpretation. These worries may be especially pressing in the odd and ambiguous context of a set of hypothetical and often bizarre cases presented by a philosopher to a philosophically naïve subject unaware of the nature of the discipline (Scholl 2007: 580; Cullen 2010; Ludwig 2007). Bengson (2013) argues that it is plausible that many survey responses are often not indicative of subjects’ intuitions but are instead the product of guesses, hunches, or inferences.

Some proponents of survey methods claim that such worries have very low prior probability and should not be taken seriously without experimental confirmation. Those who raise them, however, claim to have significant independent evidence of their general relevance (Cullen 2010; Scholl 2007) or their importance in producing the particular results at issue (Bengson 2013). Some of these problems seem difficult to control for without engaging subjects in something like philosophical dialogue and dialectic (see Kauppinen 2007)—i.e., by doing philosophy with them—which is thought by many experimental philosophers to be a form of biasing or data contamination.

A final worry, of relatively recent vintage, concerns the extent to which the results in question are reproducible or robust. A number of recent studies have provided reason to think that many published psychological results are not reproducible, with studies in social psychology being especially likely to fail attempts at reproduction. Exactly what to make of this fact and how to respond to it is a matter of much current debate, but it should be noted that experimental philosophers have begun to pay attention to the problem and to seek replication of their results. The issue is quite complicated and the research moving quickly, but it appears that quite a few of the claims of cultural or gender differences have not proved robust (Seyedsayamdost 2014, 2015; Adleberg et al. 2014). These claims of variation, as noted below, have been the primary empirical basis of skepticism regarding the evidential value of intuition.

Nothing precludes experimental philosophers from circumventing some of the concerns just noted by using experimental paradigms other than the administering of surveys. They may use reaction-time studies from cognitive psychology (Arico et al. 2011), empirical evidence from neuroscience (Allman and Woodward 2008; Greene et. al. 2001), evolutionary biology, or other sources. While such sources of evidence are not subject to the difficulties of surveys, they also appear unlikely to produce direct evidence of use to the verification project or the variability project because these projects require responses to the abstract and detailed linguistic descriptions of cases one typically presents in philosophical analysis. Indeed, Scholl (2007) suggests that the most methodologically satisfactory experimental philosophy will be primarily a version of the sources project implicating rather low-level processes immune, in virtue of their modularity, from the interpretive and pragmatic difficulties outlined above.

4.3 Experimental Philosophy and Skeptical Challenges

The sources project is, as noted above, often presented as a possible means of justifying skepticism regarding some class of philosophical intuitions. An analogy suggested by Knobe and Nichols (2008) is to debunking explanations of religious beliefs. Theorists engaged in such projects argue that religious belief (or religious experience on which such belief is based) is produced by some questionable process such as wish fulfillment, desire for a father figure, cultural indoctrination, etc. It is then argued (or assumed) that this fact about the source of the belief (or its direct internal ground) undermines the epistemic credentials of such beliefs.

This may suggest that some skeptical proponents of the sources project aim to motivate an instance of the Argument from Unreliability (§3.3). As an example, consider Greene’s fMRI-based arguments (Greene et al. 2001; Greene 2003, 2007) against certain “characteristically deontological” intuitions in ethics. The primary experimental data on which his argument is based is the fact that portions of the brain independently implicated in emotional reaction are more active when subjects consider cases giving rise to characteristically deontological intuitions than when they consider cases giving rise to characteristically consequentialist intuitions. However, critics will allege (§3.3) that attempts to show that a process is unreliable (independent of disagreement) require independent access to the target domain and such intuition-independent access seems lacking for most of the target domains of philosophical inquiry. In this vein, Berker (2009) argues that the best argument in Greene’s work rests largely on other intuitions about the general normative insignificance of the factors within hypothetical cases to which Greene believes deontological intuitions are responsive. (See Unger 1996 for an entirely a priori criticism of many “characteristically deontological” intuitions for their apparent responsiveness to intuitively normatively insignificant factors.)

The aforementioned analogy to debunking explanations of religious belief might also be taken to suggest a version of the Argument from Lack of Explanatory Necessity (§3.4.1). According to that argument, the provision of an explanation of the occurrence of the intuitions in question (the intuitings) which does not appeal to the truth of their contents (the intuiteds) undermines belief in their contents. The role of experimental work might be thought to be to support the factual premise of that argument (see Greene 2003: 849 for such a suggestion). As we have seen (§3.4.2), critics will claim that the argument relies on a questionable normative premise and violates the non-self-undermining constraint. They may also suggest that the plausibility of the non-normative premise of the argument derives from very general armchair (perhaps even entirely a priori) reflections on the contents of the intuitions, their truth-makers, and the nature of explanation. If so, then the experimental investigations are idle.

Some proponents of the variation project present us empirical evidence of disagreement between intuitions in order to motivate a version of the Argument from Intrasource Inconsistency (§3.3.2). Some critics of skepticism motivated by the variation project claim, contrary to what was suggested earlier (§2.4), that intuitions are not treated as evidence or reasons in philosophical inquiry (Deutsch 2015; Williamson 2007; Cappelen 2012). Whether such a maneuver really evades whatever skeptical implications follow from disagreement depends on whether disagreements of belief are epistemologically less troubling than variations in non-doxastic justifiers.

Though critical of the variation project, Sosa’s suggests that

there will definitely be a prima facie problem for the appeal to intuitions in philosophy if surveys show that there is extensive enough disagreement on the subject matter supposedly open to intuitive access. (Sosa 2007)

Relevant to determining whether the antecedent of Sosa’s conditional is satisfied are the methodological concerns about survey methods noted above and their ability to support claims of intuition disagreement. Relevant to determining the possibility of the antecedent of Sosa’s conditional being satisfied are the distinctively a priori concerns raised above (§3.4.2) about the possible extent of disagreement, about how the existence of widespread disagreement could be justifiably believed to exist (§3.3.2), and, importantly, about the non-self-undermining constraint.

5. Further Research

In light of the foregoing, it seems that further research on the following issues would be especially beneficial.

The first is determining the precise conditions under which epistemic circularity is problematic. Though some epistemic circularity appears unavoidable, this would aid in determining the relative initial epistemological standing of intuition and perception.

The second is determining the exact actual and possible extent of intuitive disagreement and the proper response to such disagreement. This would enable the proper evaluation of what appears to be the most serious sort of skeptical argument.


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Other Internet Resources


For very helpful and patient critical comments on previous drafts of this entry, I thank Joshua Alexander, Selim Berker, David Chalmers, Richard Feldman, Ole Koksvik, Anna-Sara Malmgren, and Sean Nichols.

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