Notes to Intuitionism in Ethics

1. Some contemporary moral intuitionists, e.g., Huemer and Enoch, reject talk of self-evident moral propositions, but nonetheless regard moral intuitions as basic sources of evidence.

2. A third option that did not seem to occur to intuitionists is that intuitions are inclinations to believe. See, e.g., Earlenbaugh and Molyneux (2009).

3. See Sturgeon (2002) for an alternative view.

4. Although he does allow that such propositions admit of clarification, and that they may be illustrated “by an advantageous representation of them, or by being viewed in particular lights” (1758/1969, 159). Whether it is possible to spell out the distinction between an “advantageous representation” of such propositions and an argument for them, is something I leave undecided here.

5. See, for example, 1930/2002, 29.

6. In this I differ from Robert Audi's view (1996, 101–36). See also Audi, 1998, 1999, and 2004, 40–79.

7. See Audi (1996). See Brink (1994) for an alternative view.

8. A common objection to the view that certain moral propositions are self-evident is the fact that there is disagreement about them. See, for example, MacIntyre (1998, 254). But this disagreement can be explained by the fact that they are supposed to be substantive moral truths, and as such may not be obvious.

9. Although it should be noted that some intuitionists did claim that self-evident moral truths are obvious. But there is nothing in the idea of a self-evident proposition as we are understanding it that commits one to this view. Indeed, one would have thought that the fact that the intuitionists differed over which principles are basic, and thus self-evident, shows that they are not obviously true.

10. Sinnott-Armstrong lists other sources of distortion, such as emotion, bias, or partiality (2006, 343).

11. Once again, Cook Wilson makes a very similar claim about the reality of the objects of simple ideas (1926, 511–521).

12. Following Locke, he seems to assume that all simple ideas are necessarily real and correspond to things in themselves. See Locke (4.4.4). See Ross (1930/2002, 82).

13. This point applies only in cases where we do not conclude that some act is right or wrong by some form of reasoning.

14. Cook Wilson (1926, 511 ff) outlines a very similar view, and like Price, argues that simple ideas must be apprehended in reality, and cannot be invented, though they are not all apprehended by sense. Although Cook Wilson does not mention moral ideas here he uses the same examples of simple non-moral ideas that are apprehended by the intellect as Price does, e.g., causality, substance, modality, time, etc.

15. See, for example, David Brink (1989) and Allan Gibbard (in Stratton-Lake, 2002).

16. See, e.g., M. Warnock (1968, 17), and H. Putnam (1981, 207). It should be noted that although Putnam thought that intuitionists such as Moore did confuse concepts and properties, he agreed with Moore that moral properties are non-natural properties (1981, 211).

17. See G. E. Moore (1903/1993a, 60 & 63), and W. D. Ross (1930/2002, 1–2).

18. Moore, (1903/1993a, 60). Moore makes this point with reference to the concept of a horse, though it is generally agreed that his example is not at all helpful.

19. Ross would argue that something is only a fitting object of a pro-attitude because it is good (1939, 278–9). This is, however, questionable. One might plausibly think that certain pro-attitudes are warranted simply by the fact that an action is kind, or considerate, rather than the fact that kindness and considerateness are good.

Copyright © 2014 by
Philip Stratton-Lake <>

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