Notes to Thomas Jefferson

1. Of the loss of his books, he wrote to boyhood friend John Page (21 Feb. 1770), “Would to god it had been the money [that the books cost and not the books]; then had it never cost me a sigh!”

2. Misspellings or literary conventions that differed in Jefferson’s day (e.g., perceive and it’s, etc.) I do not generally follow throughout by the Latin sic.

3. Jefferson’s thinking here is similar to that of the Scottish philosopher Lord Kames, who states deity has created humans so that their sensory impressions are of utmost use, not that they accord with the nature of things (1758: 113–14).

4. Locke states that we know that deity is “most powerful” and “most knowing” (1690: 379–80).

5. Cf. Hume (1755: 581), for whom “deity … governs every thing by those general and immutable laws, which have been established from the beginning of time.”

6. If not, then that measure added, for a Virginian owning property, to equal 50 acres.

7. “Rights were understood as claims which a person has to be treated in certain ways by others, to be permitted to do certain things without interference, to engage in certain activities and to enter into certain relations with those around him” (Smith 1977: 367–68).

8. The metaphor “wall of separation” continues to be a matter of considerable debate. Is it a one-way wall or a two-way wall? Does it apply both to state legislature as well as to the federal government?

9. See also, TJ to Rev. James Fishback, 27 Sept. 1809; TJ to William Canby, 18 Sept. 1813; TJ to Thomas Parker, 15 May 1819; and TJ to John Adams, 11 Jan. 1817.

10. One must be guarded here, for according to Jefferson, there are no inviolable principles of morality, only generic principles that serve as rough guides of morally correct action (see, TJ to Thomas Law, 13 June 1814). Thus, Sanford’s suggestion that Jefferson viewed men as using reason “to discover and practice the moral law” to expedite moral progress (Sanford, p. 77) is problematic. Jefferson arguably maintained that morally correct action is visceral and incapable of rational codification (see TJ to Carr, 10 Aug 1787; TJ to Rev. James Fishback, 27 Sept 1809).

11. In his “Syllabus of an Estimate of the Merit of the Doctrines of Jesus”, sent with the letter to Rush, Jefferson states that Jesus corrected the Jews’ deism, purified and perfected their moral doctrine, pushed morality beyond actions, and taught of a life after death. See also, TJ to Sam Kercheval, 19 Jan. 1810; TJ to John Adams, 12 Oct. 1813; TJ to Dr. Benjamin Waterhouse, 26 June 1822; and TJ to Jarred Sparks, 4 Nov. 1822; and TJ to George Thatcher, 26 Jan. 1824.

12. E.g., TJ to Thomas Law, 13 June 1814; TJ to George Logan, 12 Nov. 1816; and TJ to Benjamin Waterhouse, 26 June 1822.

13. TJ to John Page, 26 July 1764; TJ to John Adams, 9 Aug. 1816 and 8 Dec. 1818; TJ to John Adams, 8 Jan 1825; and TJ to Francis Adrian van der Kemp, 11 Jan. 1825.

14. For arguments in favor of Jefferson’s belief in an afterlife, see Sheridan 1983: 40–41; Gaustad 1984: 290; and Sanford 1984: 152.

15. Jefferson’s library included the works of the Scotts Hutcheson, Hume, Adam Smith, Adam Ferguson, Stewart, Blair, William Robertson, Cullen, Gregory, and Maclaurin.

16. Adam Smith (1759 [1982]: 321) considers and rejects a moral sense on the grounds of economy. If such a faculty exists, why then has it not been obvious for centuries? Moreover, all the ascribed powers of that faculty, he adds, can be explained by human sympathy.

17. The sentiment is in keeping with Lord Kames’s notion of intuitive perception (1758: 265–75).

18. See also TJ to Maria Cosway, 12 Oct. 1785; TJ to Jean Baptiste Say, 1 Feb. 1804; TJ to James Fishback, 27 Sept. 1809; and TJ to Thomas Law, 13 June 1814.

19. Napoleon, he tells Adams (25 Feb. 1823), is an illustration.

20. That is why Jefferson told his physician, Dr. Vine Utley (21 Mar. 1819), that “I never go to bed without an hour, of half hour’s previous reading of something moral, whereon to ruminate in the intervals of sleep.” He had in mind not formal moral treatises, but sermons (e.g., those of Massillon or Bourdaloue), the Bible, ancient history (e.g., Tacitus) or ancient ethical works (e.g., Antoninus or Cicero), utopian literature (Harrington’s Oceana or Mercier’s L’an 2440), and even uplifting novels (e.g., Sterne’s Tristram Shandy or Cervantes’s Don Quixote).

21. Cf. Adam Smith (1759 [1982]: 319–21), who concedes that reason “is undoubtedly the source of the general rules of morality”, but adds that the first perceptions upon which the rules are founded are reason-independent.

22. E.g., TJ to Tench Coxe, 1 June 1785; TJ to Rev. Charles Clay, 27 Jan. 1790; TJ to Thomas Pinckney, 29 May 1797; TJ to Dr. Joseph Priestley, 21 Mar. 1801; TJ to Dr. Walter Jones, 5 Mar. 1810; TJ to Samuel Kercheval, 12 July 1816; TJ to Benjamin Waterhouse, 3 Mar. 1818; and TJ to John Adams, 4 Sept. 1823.

23. Alignment of a government by the will of the people with science—ensuring that the will of the people was progressive—was Jefferson’s way of sidestepping the problem of the turbulence of government in the hands of the people—the chief problem of a Jeffersonian republic (e.g., TJ to Edward Carrington, 16 Jan. 1787, and TJ to James Madison, 30 Jan. 1787).

24. Writes Merrill Peterson (1965: 518), “Democracy [for Jefferson] was less a form of government than a principle opposed to government, a code of restraints on sovereignty whether exercised by the few or the many.”

25. See also TJ to David Rittenhouse, 19 July 1778.

26. Cf. Jefferson’s uncompromising faith in the moral discernment of the people with Montesquieu (1758: 13–14).

27. For more, see Sloan 1993.

28. He follows mortuary tables of Buffon to arrive at this number.

29. It was also designed to promote general prosperity, as there would be no lengthy debts and the wars of one generation would not be the wars of the next.

30. Jefferson does acknowledge applicative retroactive scenarios. What of lands given to churches, hospitals, colleges, and orders of chivalry? What of ecclesiastical or feudal privileges affixed to lands? What of hereditary offices, authorities, and jurisdictions? What of perpetual monopolies in business and the arts and sciences? Reimbursement here is a matter of generosity, not right.

Madison’s objections to Jefferson’s notion of usufruct come in a letter the following year (4 Feb. 1790), and they are substantive. To offer one example, is it always possible for a country, ravaged by a debilitating war that was not of its own doing, to repay debts in 19 years?

31. Scholar Charles Arrowood (1930: 58–59) says, “Jefferson’s distinctive contribution to theory of education grew out of his most characteristic political doctrine”, which entailed governmental non-intervention is citizens’ affairs, distrust of political power, and government by the people.

32. Colleges for Jefferson were schools between elementary schools and the university.

33. Of these bills, Jefferson scholar Gilbert Chinard writes, “One may state here without fear of contradiction that no system so complete, so logically constructed and so well articulated had ever been proposed in any country in the world” (1929: 99).

34. That part of the bill concerning the college’s financial stability was the work of Pendleton.

35. See also [N]: 147; [BG]: 365; and TJ to James Madison, 20 Dec. 1787; TJ to Gouveneur Morris, 30 Dec. 1792; TJ to John Breckenridge, 29 Jan. 1800; and TJ to Caesar A. Rodney, 10 Feb. 1810.

36. Writes Lucia Stanton (2009: 87): “Jefferson pursued the improvement of the human condition as a passionate Baconian, gathering information with the aid of his watch, ruler, and scales. He applied his measuring mind to plantation projects in a search for economy and efficiency. He enveloped his unwieldy operations in the consoling security of mathematical truths.”

37. That he devoted such great time to and found such pleasure in reading ancient Greek and Latin authors in the original language shows that Jefferson believed the ancient languages were indispensable for a happy, tranquil life.

38. For a sampling of the literature on Jefferson, race, and slavery, see McColley (1964), Jordan (1968), Cohen (1969), Miller (1977), Dawidoff (1993), Finkelman (1994), O’Brien (1996), Temperly (1997), Onuf (2007), Wiencek (2012), Neem (2013), and Helo (2013).

39. All such naturalists were monogenecists, who, following the account of a first couple in the Bible, maintained that the different races were formed environmentally and gradually over time.

40. For more on “race”, see James (2012).

41. Here perhaps Jefferson is following Ferguson (1773: 5), who argues that the study of men in an unnatural condition is like studying “the anatomy of the eye which had never received the impressions of light, or … an ear which had never felt the impulse of sounds.”

42. Jefferson’s lifelong obsessions with taking meteorological readings and essaying to form meteorological networks among scientists were without question in large part motivated by refuting Buffon.

Copyright © 2015 by
M. Andrew Holowchak <>

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