Supplement to John of Salisbury

Princely Tyranny and the Liberty of the Church

John of Salisbury describes the proper concord that ought to obtain between a prince and his archbishop, and the benefits that flow therefrom, as well as its opposite, in a letter from Archbishop Theobald to King Henry II:

When the members of the Church are united in loyalty and love, when princes show due reverence to priests, and priests render faithful service to princes, then do kingdoms enjoy that true peace and tranquillity that must always be the goal of our desire. But if they clash, one against the other, in all their might, then the vigour of the secular power will be impaired no less than the ecclesiastical … (JL1: 190).

Half a century earlier, Henry I had been the beneficiary of happy relations between himself and his archbishop, writing to Anselm that he attributed his successful Normandy campaign “to the merits of the concord and peace which had been re-established between [us]” (A&B: 61). Anselm had not, however, enjoyed positive relations with Henry’s predecessor, William Rufus. Anselm had protested being installed archbishop of Canterbury on the grounds that he, a sheep, ought not to be yoked to Rufus, a raging bull (Eadmer History: 37). Emerging from John’s conception of the ecclesiastical soul that resides in and guides the secular body politic, mutuality and balance are necessary pre-conditions to concord. John affirms, of Archbishop Thomas Becket and King Henry II, that “these two [are] the princes of the people, of whom one regulates things spiritual, the other guides things temporal” (JL2: 106–07). Yet, despite their comity during the years in which Becket served as Henry’s chancellor (see, for example, JL1: 221), a virtual state of war characterized their ‘princely’ relationship during Becket’s archiepiscopacy. The fundamental cause of this protracted conflict lay in Henry’s (immoderate) disregard for the proper boundary separating the spiritual from the temporal realm and his consequent incursions upon the liberty of the church.

Although John mentions Becket’s “immoderate youth” in his Life of Thomas Becket, this is a hagiographical commonplace whose roots extend back to the Confessions of St. Augustine. In contrast, Archbishop Theobald’s early assessment of Henry II ought to be regarded more seriously. John reports that Theobald bore concerns over

the young age of the king … and he feared the foolishness and malice of the youths and perverse men by whose advice the king seemed to be guided. (A&B: 76)

In brokering Becket’s appointment to the chancellorship, the archbishop hoped that Becket

might restrain the violent impulse of the new king lest he vent his rage upon the Church … might temper the maliciousness of the advice given to the king, and repress the boldness of officials who … conspired to plunder the property of the Church ….(A&B: 76)

Out of these concerns emerges the clear impression that, even in the early days of his reign, Henry II (and his court) was immoderate in character, in thrall to the passions, and entirely dismissive of the boundary separating the spiritual realm from his own. Nor did Theobald’s hope in Becket’s moderating effect bear evident fruit. Such was Henry’s assessment of Becket’s character that the king arranged his elevation to the archbishopric of Canterbury in the belief that Henry might thereby

more easily rule the whole English Church … [since Becket] would manage everything in ecclesiastical and secular affairs according to the king’s will …. (A&B: 77)

For his part, Becket perceived that, as head of the English church, he could not “comply … with the impulses of the king, nor could he fail to have the king as an enemy” should he properly execute the duties of an ecclesiastical prince and defend the liberties of his new realm (A&B: 78). It did not, in fact, take long for conflict between these heads of church and state to erupt.

Only two years after Becket’s consecration, he found it necessary to escape into exile in France, where John had preceded him some months before. John’s attitude toward the archbishop and the king, and toward the conflict itself, was initially, and equally, unsympathetic, even critical, and, notably, couched in the language of immoderation. On the one hand, Henry was demanding an unwavering and unquestioning acceptance of his dictates incompatible with liberty. In an unflattering assessment, John remarks that

[i]t is the man’s [Henry’s] nature to make light of all the merits of one who for whatever reasons breaks or postpones obedience to a single mandate, no matter what it is. The ‘moderation’ of his requests … is such that it is sometimes necessary to disobey. (JL2: 468–69; translation revised)

On the other hand, John displays an acute awareness of the archbishop’s defects, which he ascribes to a tendency to exceed moderate bounds, such that John found it necessary to

upbraid … the lord archbishop … on the grounds that he has from the beginning inadvisedly provoked the resentment of the king and court by his zeal, since many provisions should have been made for place and time and persons. (JL2: 48–49; translation revised)

Indeed, in the early days of their mutual, though separate, sojourn in France, John opined that “the exile has undoubtably been profitable to the archbishop of Canterbury both for his learning and his character …” (JL2: 48–49). John’s views on the parties to and cause of the conflict changed dramatically over the course of the exile, especially after he failed to reach a personal reconciliation with the king, who demanded secular fealty over ecclesiastical loyalty. (See, e.g., JL2: 48–49, wherein John expresses his desire to find “a formula [of oath to Henry] which will not inflict on me the stigma of treachery or a stain on my honour”.)

From this point forward, John views the dispute as a “conflict of power and justice” (JL2: 128–29), in which Becket is fighting for the most “righteous cause … the Church’s liberty” (JL2: 236–37). Consonant with this reorientation, John’s stance toward Becket becomes supportive and advisory, encouraging him to display virtuous moderation in his negotiations with his opponents:

With moderation write and state the conditions [of a reconciliation], since it seems to be certain that the souls of the enemies of God’s church are so hardened that they will admit no condition at all (JL2: 168–69)

At the same time, John dedicates himself to the tireless promotion of Becket’s cause against Henry—or rather, of the church’s persecution at the hands of a “tyrant”—penning myriad letters to prelates and clerics throughout western Christendom. (For a detailed discussion of John’s epistolary activites during this period, see Bollermann and Nederman 2015.) So highly did John regard Becket’s steadfast devotion to the defense of the church’s liberty that John numbers Becket among holy Canterbury archbishops of the past:

I should not dare to place him who is now set over us [Becket] on a par with his predecessors who are glittering with miracles in our church. But the cause which he defends I think no whit inferior to theirs, for it is the same, since both for him and them the fight was for the freedom and safety of the church. (JL2: 304–07)

John, of course, could have had no idea that, only a few years later, Becket would become Canterbury’s most famous martyr-saint.

John’s praise of Becket and the rightness of his cause stand in stark contrast to his increasingly critical opinion of Henry II. John’s letters are replete with references to Henry as a “tyrant” (see, e.g., JL2: 237–38, 429–30, 455–58), as well as with accounts of the specific ways in which his tyranny, often fueled by excessive rage, is expressed. The king’s actions following Becket’s clandestine departure for France provide an early example and proved to be a harbinger of things to come. Not only did Henry order the confiscation of all of Canterbury’s, Becket’s, and his men’s property, but

what is unheard of anywhere in history, he sentenced to exile all the archbishop’s kinsmen and all who were connected to him by friendship or any other pretext at all, without distinction of rank or order, of status or fortune, of age or sex, for both women lying in childbirth and infants waiting in their cradles were driven into exile. His savage fury and cruelty … proceeded farther, for … it was forbidden for anyone to assist the archbishop, even by the aid of prayers (A&B: 87).

Henry’s unbounded rage and excessively punitive actions appear all the more vicious when set against the “moderate” conditions of exile that Archbishop Theobald had endured under King Stephen, which John relates in the Historia Pontificalis:

The archbishop alone suffered … his friends were free to come and go as they wished and even … to bring him material assistance for his needs. (HP: 42)

Bearing in mind the fact that John wrote this text not long after Becket’s exile had commenced, the implication that he intended this account to be read as a critique of Henry II seems inescapable. The last words are especially poignant, as many of John’s exilic letters plead for financial support from members of the English church for Becket and his fellow ex-patriots.

Not only does John consistently portray Henry II as a tyrannical oppressor of the church, John explicitly connects him to Emperor Frederick Barbarossa, who had “turned from prince to tyrant, and from catholic emperor became a schismatic and a heretic” on account of his efforts to install the anti-pope Victor (JL2: 216–17). Now that God has exacted his vengeance on Barbarossa and his realm (JL2: 216–17, 273–74), John predicts a similarly dire consequence for Henry II, who presently “walks in Frederick’s paths” (JL2: 574–75), unless he reconciles with his archbishop and restores to the English church her sovereign liberties. While immoderation on the part of an ecclesiastical prince, as John had initially charged Becket, could lead to unnecessary and disruptive strife in the realm, immoderation on the part of a secular prince led invariably to a fundamental violation of the church’s liberty, placing the well-being of the entire realm in serious peril and, as a necessary corollary, rendering the prince a tyrant.

Copyright © 2016 by
Karen Bollermann <>
Cary Nederman <>

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