Leibniz’s Influence on Kant

First published Fri May 21, 2004; substantive revision Wed May 18, 2022

Kant’s interest in the physics, metaphysics, epistemology, and theology of his predecessor G.W. Leibniz is evident in his writings in the philosophy of natural science as well as in the passages of the Critique of Pure Reason dealing with transcendental ideas and his essays on history and progress. The conventional view that Kant sought to steer a middle course between the rationalism of 18th century German school philosophy initiated by Leibniz’s follower Christian Wolff and the empiricism of David Hume furnishes a useful point of departure for understanding Kant’s intellectual context and his aims and intentions. However, Kant’s aim in propounding his critical philosophy was not merely to transcend the stalemate of dogmatism vs. skepticism in general epistemology, but to address what he regarded as a crisis: the inability of metaphysics, as taught in the Universities, to secure the meta-ethical objectivity of morality and the threat to human confidence and moral discipline posed by the atheism, materialism, and fatalism of contemporary forms of naturalism. Kant took Leibniz’s as a failed dogmatic enterprise in metaphysics and philosophical theology, but as one that was partially redeemed by its parallel treatment of nature and value. He addressed the Leibnizian topics of the nature of substance, the human soul and its powers, space, time, and forces, mechanism and teleology, and divine creation in passages scattered throughout his major and minor writings.

The main features of Kant’s reception of Leibniz are surveyed below under separate headings.

1. Introduction

Leibniz and his follower Christian Wolff were two of Kant’s most cited references. At one time or another, Kant addressed all of Leibniz’s main doctrines, including his defense of living forces against the Cartesians, his attack on absolute space and time against the Newtonians, his immaterial atomism or monadology, his theodicy, and his various principles and laws — the identity of indiscernibles, continuity, non-contradiction and sufficient reason. The challenging tone towards the followers of Leibniz that the young Kant, as an aspiring physicist and cosmologist, and later as a strong advocate of free will, adopted gave way in time to a more respectful engagement with the philosopher himself, as Kant became an increasingly determined critic of materialism.

Yet Kant’s attitude towards his famous predecessor, whose ideas were extensively discussed in French, and later in Prussian intellectual circles after Leibniz’s death in 1716, never reaches equilibrium. This is unsurprising, for Kant’s own texts show an attraction to teleological theories of the whole, as well as to epistemological caution. Kant describes Leibniz as one of the greatest and most successful reformers of the modern era (9:32), along with John Locke, and as a genius, along with Isaac Newton (7.226). Yet he also refers repeatedly to the errors of the Leibnizians, whom he considers “dogmatic” philosophers. Their conviction that human reason could acquire knowledge of supersensible entities, including the soul and God, necessitated, in Kant’s view, a “critique.” Locke had attempted to construct a critical philosophy against the Cartesians but had failed to carry his programme through. At the same time, the attacks of Locke and Hume on metaphysics had “opened the door to Schwaermerei”. So determined were Kant’s contemporaries to find affirmations of immortality and divine justice, that, he believed, many had turned to the occult. “So much there was deceptive, that it is necessary to suspend the whole enterprise and to bring instead the method of the critical philosophy into play. This consists of examining the process of reason itself, of dividing and testing the human knowledge capacity in order to determine how far out its boundaries may be placed” (9.32).

The suspension of the whole enterprise announced by Kant should not obscure the fact that Leibniz and Kant shared an ethico-religious conception of philosophy. Leibniz wrote in an era in which the universities were still dominated by Christian philosophy. Whatever his private leanings towards mystical and philosophical religion, he believed that a strong and unified religious authority was essential to the maintenance of moral and political order, and the content of morality did not strike him as problematic. Kant, though steeped in Protestant theology and moral philosophy, favoured the newer trend towards the academic autonomy of philosophy and secular morality and governance. Yet he had to contend with the rising influence of materialism and deterministic psychology in Germany (10:145); the sentiment- and convention-based accounts of morality and moral motivation of the British school, the attacks on metaphysics and conventional morals of Helvétius, La Mettrie (19:109), and Voltaire (15:336) and the attacks of Hume on religion and the concept of the soul. How could morality be reconciled with Newtonian science and how could the existence of ineluctable duties be established in the face of the variety of human practices and customs established by Montesquieu and the numerous travel writers on whose accounts Kant relied in compiling his lectures on Anthropology? Metaphysics could not provide knowledge of the supersensible, including the existence of God, the possibility of the realization of a highest good in the natural world, or the ability of human beings to realize that good through their endowments. Human aspirations in this regard were transcendent, futile, and “entirely vacuous” (20: 301).

For Leibniz, the Kingdom of Nature and the Kingdom of Grace were parallel orders. Everything in nature happened, as Hobbes and Spinoza maintained, on account of ‘mechanical’ principles. At the same time, Leibniz insisted in his Principles of Nature and Grace based on Reason (1714):

[A]ll minds, whether of men or [spirits], entering into a kind of society with God, by virtue of reason and eternal truths, are members of a City of God, that is members of the perfect state, formed and governed by the greatest and best of monarchs. Here there is no crime without punishment, no good action without proportionate reward, and finally as much virtue and happiness as is possible. (Ariew and Garber, 212)

Referencing Leibniz, Kant adapted this dualistic scheme into his own scheme of transcendental ideas. In nature, everything happened accord to laws, though the course of the world might depend on a somewhat richer ontology, including lawfully-acting generative forces for the formation of plants and animals, than Leibniz had allowed for, forces that human beings might never really understand. At the same time, rational beings, though not other souls or minds, formed a moral community (see Guyer).

To view ourselves, therefore, as in the world of grace, where all happiness awaits us, except insofar as we ourselves limit our share in it through being unworthy of happiness, is, from the practical standpoint, a necessary idea of reason. (KRV A812/B840)

In this community, reward for having lived a morally worthy life in the form of everlasting happiness was intrinsically deserved, but this could only be hoped for and kept in view, not proved (KRV A810–18/B841–46).

Kant denied that the present world contained as much goodness and happiness as possible. Rather, it was definitely progressing towards greater cultural development, and perhaps moral development. Hope and effort, especially in the latter struggle where they were most needed, was itself morally mandated (8:8–32). So the ‘idea of a moral world’ had ‘objective reality’ as a ‘corpus mysticum of the rational beings in it’ even if it was only the sensible world viewed in a different but obligatory way.

The dogmatic metaphysicians preceding him, Kant argued, imagined that they could demonstrate the truth of their doctrines in rigorous mathematical fashion, but metaphysical concepts lacked the precision and intelligibility of mathematical concepts. At the same time, they put their trust in intellectual intuition, which was no more certain than the visionary and mystical writings of Emmanuel Swedenborg, who had set down his hallucinations and angelic dictations in twelve volumes of the Arcana Coelestia (1749–56), which Kant read in 1765 and satirized in his Dreams of a Spirit Seer in 1766. Leibniz’s monadology exemplified both errors, for Leibniz thought that, merely by rationally considering the problem of the divisibility of matter, he could demonstrate that the basic constituents of the universe were not material particles obeying the laws of mechanics, but living or at least minded beings with perception and appetite, acting for the good of the universe. At the same time, the details of his picture of the world behind the appearances, incorporating slumbering monads, confused omniscience, and the pre-established harmony, seemed to Kant gratuitous fancies.

Where Leibniz rescued ethics and religion by claiming to discover a hidden reality of immortal, spontaneous souls forming a Kingdom of Grace beneath the material and causally-determined appearances, Kant believed he could accomplish the task of reconciling the scientific view of the world with moral aspiration and accountability by investigating the necessary preconditions of our experience. Necessary forms of thought such as space, time, causality and objecthood would thereby be distinguished from constraints embedded in reality. Though materialism is commonly associated with French Enlightenment figures, Kant considered it an English vice as well. He associated it not however with Hobbes and Locke but with Joseph Priestley (KRV B 773; 4:258), and he was most certainly aware of its German development through Ernst Platner and others (see Rumore). Determinism and materialism seemed to him to support a lax moral philosophy, in which pleasure was conceived as the summum bonum, morality was conventional, and humans were anyway machines devoid of responsibility for their actions. In those not given to dissipation, skepticism and empiricism led, Kant thought, to a sense of moral futility, misanthropy and despair. Kant was determined to attack fashionable, pessimistic, and libertine philosophies, but he had to show that he rejected rationalist demonstration as thoroughly as any empiricist.

His manner of doing so was exceedingly elegant. Kant did not merely challenge the logic of, or poke fun at the extravagances of Leibniz’s metaphysics, though he is not above a joke regarding the monads — potential human lives — he might be swallowing with his morning coffee (2:327). In the antinomies section of the Critique of Pure Reason, he shows that, for every “proof” of an important metaphysical proposition, such as determinism, atomism, or the eternity of the universe, a proof of the contrary proposition, such as the existence of exceptions to mechanical causality, infinite divisibility, or the temporal finitude of the world can be supplied. By attempting to prove too much, human rationality accomplished too little. Traditional metaphysics left reason perturbed, confused, and unfulfilled.

As many of Leibniz’s writings were not published until the 19th or 20th century, an accurate assessment of the relation between the Leibniz and Kant can take into account only those works in circulation in the second half of the 18th century and available to Kant, his teachers and his interlocutors. These comprised the Meditations on Knowledge, Truth and Ideas, the New System of the Nature and Communication of Substances, the Specimen Dynamicum, the Theodicy, the Monadology and the Principles of Nature and Grace, the Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, and the posthumous New Essays, which Kant read four years after their publication, in 1769. A collection of diverse pieces, edited by Pierre Desmaizeaux was published in 1720; followed by the more comprehensive Oeuvres philosophiques edited by Raspé in 1765 , and the Opera Omnia issued by Dutens in 1768. Christian Wolff, who may have had privileged access to some of Leibniz’s unpublished writings, wrote a series of textbooks under the title Vernunftige Gedancken beginning in 1719, reformulating Leibniz’s scattered thoughts on atomism, determinism, pre-established harmony, and theodicy into scholastic format, that served to bring these doctrines into prominence, as did some writings of Alexander Baumgarten and G.F. Meier, Euler’s Letters to a German Princess (1768–1772), and Emilie du Chatelet’s Naturlehre an Ihren Sohn which deal with major Leibnizian themes, including substance, soul-body relations, and the problem of evil. If Kant brooded on Leibnizian topics, however, it was not, except perhaps in the period of the controversy with J.A. Eberhard, in which Kant was concerned to distinguish Leibniz from his followers and to champion what he saw as Leibniz’s special Platonic contributions, with an eye to understanding Leibniz’s system as a whole or extracting the best possible interpretation from it, but rather with an eye to avoiding his errors.

Insofar as Kant professed embarrassment about his pre-1770 essays, it might be tempting to divide his discussion of Leibniz into a pre-critical (before 1770) and a critical phase. Yet this division is not specially illuminating, and recent scholars have questioned the formerly standard periodization (see the entry on Kant’s philosophical development). The True Measurement of Living Forces, (1747), the Physical Monadology (1756), New Elucidation (1755), the Essay on some Treatments of Optimism (1759), Negative Quantities (1763) and the Dreams of a Spirit-Seer (1766) are all technically “pre-critical,” but they are critical with respect to logical, physical, and theological Leibnizian principles and doctrines. It is plausible to see the “silent decade” between 1771 and 1780 as the interval in which Kant decided how to manage the skeptical problem he now saw as threatening morality, arriving finally at the positive philosophy in the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) which steers (perhaps only temporarily, judging by the Opus Postumum) a middle course between visionary and mystical enthusiasm and skepticism. Kant’s further thoughts on Leibniz were developed in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), the polemical essays, On a Discovery According to which any Critique of Pure Reason has been made Superfluous by an Earlier One (1790) and What Progress has Metaphysics Made in Germany since the Time of Leibniz and Wolff?(1791), and in the Critique of Judgement (1790).

2. The Principle of Contradiction

Leibniz gives various formulations to his Principle of Contradiction or Law of Identity, but the central idea is that a proposition and its negation cannot both be true (G 7: 299). Leibniz hoped to be able to construct a logical calculus that would enable all significant truths to be demonstrated, since every concept must include, be included in, or exclude every other. A concept such as ‘human,’ he maintained, included the concepts ‘animal,’ ‘rational,’ ‘bipedal,’ etc., so that a true statement such as ‘Humans are animals’ was true in virtue of the inclusion of the predicate in the subject. Though the magnitude of Leibniz’s contribution to combinatorial mathematics and logic remained unknown until the twentieth century, Kant offers some skeptical remarks to what he takes to be the Leibnizian programme in Section II of the New Elucidation. Later, he offers two specific criticisms of the Principle of Contradiction taken not in a logical, but in an ontological sense:

First, Kant claims, the Principle is too weak to ban nonentities from theories. In Sect 28 of the Inaugural Dissertation (1770), he complains of “fictitious forces fabricated at will, which, not finding any obstacle in the principle of contradiction are poured forth in multitudes by those of speculative mind.” These fictitious forces presumably included extrasensory powers of perception and the direct action of souls on souls. Second, the Principle of Contradiction is too strong. Leibniz’s Neoplatonic leanings induce him to see creatures as fragments of the divine, whose imperfections are mere lacks. There are, in his ontology, no beings or forces opposing God (Theodicy, §20). Kant’s orientation is more Manichaean; he thinks that acceptance of the Principle leads the theorist to underrepresent the extent of conflict in the world and its constructive aspects. Kant insists that opposing forces, “hindering and counteracting processes” operate ceaselessly in nature and in history. The opposition of attractive and repulsive forces in physics produces the phenomena of matter (4: 508 ff); the opposition of good and evil principles in the human soul produces morality, (6:1–190); and antagonism and conflict in geopolitics produce peace and progress (6:24). Kant denies the Leibnizian claim that all evil follows from the limitations of creatures (KRV A 273/B. 329).

3. The Identity of Indiscernibles

The Leibnizian principle that “there are never two things in nature which are exactly alike and in which it is impossible to find a difference that is internal or founded on an intrinsic denomination” is enunciated in the Monadology (G 6: 608), as well as in the Correspondence with Samuel Clarke (G 7: 372). Leibniz had abandoned his earlier view that two entities could be distinguished by place alone when he came to his view of real substances as infinitely complex and unique and space as ideal. Kant found the Principle arbitrary. To insist that any two objects presented to us in experience must be qualitatively different in some respect was, Kant said, to take appearances for intelligibilia (KRV A 264/B320). We cannot have two concepts — concepts of two things — that are alike in all their specifications, but we can certainly have two empirical objects that are exactly alike. Why should we not be able to imagine two identical water droplets? (20:280). It is sufficient for there to be two that they present themselves to us (veridically) in our visual space as two. Leibniz’s blunder on this score was, for Kant, an indication that Leibniz had failed to grasp an important feature of sensory experience, namely that it, unlike thought in general, is always spatial.

4. Substance and “Matter”

Leibniz’s metaphysics was developed within, and in part as a reaction to the mechanical philosophy of the mid-to-late 17th century, revived by Galileo, Descartes, Gassendi, Boyle, Newton, and Locke. While the term “substance,” meaning the indestructible stuff of the universe, was retained by Descartes in his discussions of res extensa, the mechanical philosophers adopted a corpuscularian theory in which objects were temporary aggregates of solid, indestructible particles with various figures and motions, and most though by no means all change occurred through their contact, pressure, collision, entangling, and so on. Leibniz contested the corpuscularian image, insisting that it was insufficiently profound and inherently self-contradictory (G 4: 480), and holding that matter was a ‘phenomenon’ founded upon the reality of “metaphysical points” or, as he later termed them, monads: qualitatively unique,indestructible and indivisible units that also perceived and strove (G 6: 608).

Kant accused Leibniz, along with Spinoza, of ‘taking appearances for things in themselves’ (KRV A264/B320). One can see his point with respect to water droplets as noted, but it is nevertheless a somewhat mixed-up claim. As Kant understood him, in failing to distinguish between intellectual representation and sensory perception, Leibniz believed we saw aggregates of monads as empirical objects. But Leibniz distinguished sharply between the everyday perceptual world of living beings and inanimate objects and the invisible monadic order. Unextended monads were non causally interacting but enjoyed (in a confusedly omniscient manner) the universal pre-established harmony of perceptions, while empirical humans perceived individually subvisible empirical objects such as animalcula and fine powders through causal mechanisms in a confused manner (GM III:546–7; AG IV:426). But Leibniz was not clear about how the unextended monads projected into a visible world and neither were his later commentators. After his critical turn, Kant had decided that “things in themselves” that compose external reality are not perceived at all. They are not in causal contact with us, though they affect us in such a way that we experience a sensory world structured according to the categories of time, space, causality and objecthood. The impact driven, push and pull of the appearances therefore did not, in Kant’s view, preclude the possibility of the origination of free actions by a noumenal subject.

Matter, Kant could readily agree with Leibniz, cannot be a thing in itself, stuff possessed of characteristics and qualities independent of human perception; what we call matter is an appearance (4:507). The true nature of mind-independent external reality cannot be described by reference to shape, contact or movement, which characterize only the objects presented to us (A265–6/B 321–2). He understood Leibniz’s reasoning in favour of monads as follows: It is impossible to conceive two material atoms as both different from one another and as simple, i.e partless; yet possible to conceive two souls that are both different and partless (20:285). Therefore, if substances are manifold and partless, they must have representational capacities. The crucial error in this reasoning lay in supposing that our abstract conceptions are a guide to reality behind the spatio-temporal appearances. Yet properly understood, he maintained, Leibniz’s monadology was not an attempt to explain appearances but the expression of a “Platonic” view of the world, considered apart from our sensory experience of it (4:507; 8:248). In this regard, he did grasp that Leibniz did not after all take appearances for things in themselves.

Despite his warnings about the limited powers of human reason, Kant too believed it possible to deduce some features of matter, as physical science must theorize it, a priori. There are no material atoms; matter is divisible to infinity and its parts are all material (4:503f). Yet Kant recognized, first in the Physical Monadology, then in the Metaphysical Foundations, particles in the form of centres of attractive and repulsive forces that account for the space-filling property and impenetrability of matter (4: 533ff). This relatively dogmatic treatment co-exists with his critical claim that matter is the appearance of a perfectly unknown substratum. As he explains it in the Critique of Pure Reason, the rainbow is a mere appearance relative to rain drops which, in a physical sense, are things-in-themselves and not mirages. Yet thinking further, we realize that the raindrops too are mere appearances, and that “even their round form, indeed, even the space through which they fall are nothing in themselves, but only mere modifications or foundations of our sensible intuition; the transcendental object, however, remains unknown to us.” (KRV A 45f/B 63f). “About these appearances, further, much may be said a priori that concerns their form but nothing whatsoever about the things in themselves that may ground them.” (KRV A49/B66). This suggests that the stuff which is divisible to infinity and bears attractive and repulsive forces is an appearance of something unknown and unknowable. “We can understand nothing except what brings with it something in intuition corresponding to our words. When we complain that we do not see into the inner nature of things, this can mean no more than that we cannot grasp, through pure reason, what the things that appear to us might be in themselves…. Observation and division with respect to the appearances take us into the interior of nature, and we cannot say how far this will proceed. But every transcendental question that takes us beyond [perceptible] nature can never be answered…” (KRV (A277f/B333f).

5. Space and Time

Leibniz held a relational theory of space and time. Without things there would be no space, and without events there would be no time. Space and time are not containers into which things and events may be inserted but which could have remained empty. In the Third Letter to Clarke (G 7:364), Leibniz maintains that “without the things placed in it, one point of space does not absolutely differ in any respect whatsoever from another point of space.” An even more ambitious positive proposal makes space the “order of co-existents” and time the “order of successions” (G 7: 363), or a “well-founded phenomenon.”

Despite his admiration for Newton, his presentation of a purported proof of absolute space in the essay On the Basis of the Difference of Regions in Space of 1768 (2: 378), and his claim in the First Critique that two distinct but absolutely identical portions of space were possible (KRV A 264/ B320), Kant rejected absolute space and absolute motion in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Consistently, however, he rejected Leibniz’s claim that space was founded on the order of relations of substances. To the claim that space emerged somehow from the underlying monadic reality seemed to Kant to imply that the truths of mathematics—in this case three-dimensional geometry—depended on the existence of a world of things and events, which was absurd. Leibniz, Kant, suggests, had noticed that things appear to interact causally and to determine one another’s behaviour. This led him to insist that space was “ a certain order in the community of substances, and… time… the dynamic sequences of their states,” confusedly apprehended (KRV A 275f/B 331f). However, the composition of bodies from monads as basic elements presupposes their juxtaposition in space (20:278). If we confusedly perceive monads as physical objects in space, what would it be like to apprehend the monads distinctly as not in space but as the foundation of space? (4:481f)

Kant’s conviction that the existence of incongruent counterparts proved that “space in general does not belong to the properties or relations of things in themselves” (4: 484) is not easy to understand, but his basic argument in the 1768 essay is that Leibniz’s view does not enable one to distinguish between a left handed glove and a right handed glove, insofar as the relations of all the parts to one another are the same in both cases. Yet if God had created just one glove, it would have been one or the other. Hence space does not depend on relations between things in space. Newton’s conception of space as a huge container does not contribute to the solution of the problem: Consider a container in which a single glove is floating. Is it a right-handed glove or a left-handed glove? We can insert various new items into this space-container, e.g., an anorak, a scarf, a shoe, but only the insertion of a human observer into the space will permit an answer. Space, Kant, decides, is related to directionality or orientation. The human observer experiences himself as intersected by three planes and as having three sets of “sides”, which he describes as up and down, back and forward, and right and left. Right-handedness and left-handedness are not merely anthropic concepts since nature itself insists on handedness in twining plants and the shells of snails (2: 380). But which direction is right and which is left can only be established by a conscious, embodied being. As he expresses it in the Prolegomena, “The difference between similar and equal things which are not congruent…cannot be made intelligible by any concept, but only by the relation to the right and left hands, which immediately refers to intuition” (4: 286). How spheroid beings with hands would distinguish between “front” and “back” is not however clear. It is not clear whether this orientational analysis implies that wherever there is space there must also be sentient beings with pairs of incongruent parts, as well as top-bottom and back-front asymmetry.

In the Inaugural Dissertation §15, Kant tries to move beyond the dichotomy of taking space and time to be either substances or phenomena, taking space instead to belong to the “form”of sensible intuition. As he expresses it in the Critique of Pure Reason, “Space and time are [our sensibility’s] pure forms…” (KRV A42/B60). They are “merely subjective conditions of all our intuition.” (ibid., A 49/B 66). [See the entry on Kant’s views on space and time.]

For Leibniz, each monad experiences an individual succession of appetites and experiences that God has endowed it with from the creation of the world. Being fated in this way, though acting always under their own “spontaneous” power, the monads would seem to be deprived of meaningful agency and beneficiaries or victims of seemingly unjust rewards and punishments. Kant believed that locating space and time in us rather than in the world was an absolute barrier against the determinism that threatened the notion of moral responsibility (A 5:97–8; 102).

6. Perception and Thought

Kant’s rejection of Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles is related to his complaint that the Leibnizians treated perception and thought as a single representational faculty that was “logically” (by which Kant meant “qualitatively”) distinguished in terms of the clarity of the representation, rather than “transcendentally.” With their theory of a single cognitive faculty, Kant maintained, Leibniz and Wolff “abolished the distinction between phenomena and noumena to the great detriment of philosophy.” Leibniz treated the senses according to Kant as an inferior mode of cognition, the senses having only the “despicable task” of confusing and distorting the representations of reason (KRV B. 332).

The basis of this accusation was Leibniz’s attribution to the soul of only two basic faculties: perception, the representation of multiplicity in a simple soul, and appetition, which he defines as “the action of an internal principle which brings about change or the passage from one perception to another” (G 6: 608–9). Perceptions, in Leibniz, as in Descartes, are thoughts — presentations in the mind. The perceptual thought that there is a green tree in front of me is not absolutely unlike the mathematical thought that triangles have three angles. Perception of material objects is “confused” because — according to the Cartesian tradition — corporeal substance has no colours or other sensory properties — which come into being through the interaction of the mind and tiny, single imperceptible, uncoloured corpuscles of matter. Though Leibniz denied the existence of purely material corpuscles and the possibility of causal influx or even interaction between real substances, he agreed that, from the perspective of what he sometimes terms mere physical science, perception required interaction, and that corpuscular motions were involved in the perception of sensory qualities such as light and colour. Perception can therefore be said to confuse what reason delivers to us clearly (A 132, 219, 403). Though we are unable to grasp the sufficient reason of particular colours, there is nothing arbitrary in their connection with their underlying causes (A 382f).

Leibniz’s interpreters, Wolff and Baumgarten, enunciate more dogmatically the theory that there is a single faculty of representation in the soul, with perception and cognition corresponding to its lower and higher parts. It was this view that Kant presented as entirely opposed to his own teaching with regard to the faculties of the soul. Sensibility, for Kant, is the “receptivity of the subject by which it is possible for the subject’s own representative state to be affected in a particular way by the presence of some object.” Thought is “the faculty of the subject by which it has the power to represent things which cannot by their own quality come before the sense of that subject” (2:392). Thought implies an ability to experience representations of another type not involving the forms of sensibility — space, time, and causality. Spatio-temporal features are attached to all our perceptions and to our perceptual thoughts, but not to the concepts we entertain descriptively. We can think of things in themselves, and even of God, the soul, and other such entities, acknowledging their existence and even their powers, but we do not perceive them and we cannot represent them in sensuous form.

In his late philosophy, Leibniz distinguished between “simple monads,” which despite their representational and appetitive faculties, merely experienced something like our swoons and dreamless sleeps; “souls,” belonging to animals with sensory organs that had awareness of an environment and desires; and “spirits,” who were able to grasp necessary truths and experience more complex appetitions such as desiring the good (G 6: 610–12). All monads, according to Leibniz, are confusedly omniscient (G 6: 604). Kant was scornful of what he regarded as transcendental reverie. The “slumbering monad” with its dim presentations, is, he complains, “not explained, but made-up” (2.277). The notion that the slumbering monads might awake to climb the ladder of awareness recalls, he said, “a kind of enchanted world” (20:285). However, Kant was favourably disposed, at least in his early years, towards Leibniz’s doctrine of confused omniscience, and he essentially accepts Leibniz’s conception of the mind as innately stocked with, as Leibniz expresses it, “inclinations, dispositions, tendencies or natural potentials” (A 52). In his early essay on Negative Quantities, Kant remarks “There is something great and I think, very correct in Leibniz’s notion that the soul embraces the entire universe with its representational powers, although only an infinitely small part of this representation is clear……Outer things can carry the condition of their presentation, but not the force to bring themselves into existence for us. The powers of thought of the soul must have real grounds…” (2.199). Though Kant later professed agnosticism as to whether perception and mentality in general were explicable mechanically, the emphasis on the active powers of the mind by contrast with the passivity of matter remains important in his theory of mind.

The distinction between perception and thought signaled Kant’s break with rationalist metaphysics but enabled him to deploy a divide-and-conquer strategy against dogmatic claims. By showing how each mode of apprehension involved certain necessary and distinct limitations on its employment, Kant was able to show that certain kinds of assertion in theology and metaphysics could not be genuine knowledge-claims. Perception was limited by the kinds of bodies we had and the manner in which we could be affected by external objects. We could not acquire scientific knowledge of the origins of the universe, or of our condition after death. Pure reason could not fill in details that were beyond all possible experience. The claims of metaphysics had to be synthetic, informative and not true by definition, yet a priori true. Arithmetic and geometry supplied synthetic a priori truths in abundance, and natural science supplied synthetic a posteriori truths, as well as exhibiting synthetic a priori propositions, such as the conservation of force.

Already in his prize essay of 1764, the Investigation of the Intelligibility of the Fundamental Principles of Natural Theology and Morals, Kant claimed that moral and theological principles were not capable of demonstration, since their terms, unlike mathematical terms, lacked precise definition. Geometrical concepts lend themselves to use in demonstrations because they are constructed and presented to intuition, which is impossible with respect to metaphysical concepts such as the soul. In the Critique of Pure Reason, he says: “If anyone were to pose the question to me: What is the constitution of a thing that thinks? then I do not know the least thing to answer a priori, because the answer ought to be synthetic…But for every synthetic solution, intuition is necessary; but this is entirely left out of so universal a problem” (KRV A 398). The Prolegomena returns to the question how metaphysics can, like natural science and mathematics, employ synthetic judgments when its concepts are not given in experience and are not constructed. Kant’s answer is that metaphysical judgments do not point to objects existing beyond all possible experience, but posit objects needed to “complete” our understanding, that is, to make our thinking systematic and untroubled by gaps and aporias. The soul is not a supersensible object of whose faculties and powers we can acquire knowledge but an idea that makes our practice of ascribing experiences to ourselves intelligible.

7. Soul and Body

For Leibniz, “I” am a substance, and my mind, as a “dominant monad,” rules over, or expresses more distinctly than they do,the subordinate monads composing my body. Thus all happenings in all parts of the body are felt distinctly or indistinctly, the sensory organs collect and concentrate the impressions of the external world, and the soul experiences them. Though commentators disagree over whether the referent of “I” is a corporeal substance — a soul-body composite — since Leibniz did not believe separated souls without organic bodies were possible — or, alternatively, a single dominant monad, an immaterial substance outside space and time, “I” assuredly named a thing that was indivisible and imperishable (G 6: 598–600). Kant eschews dogmatism both with respect to whether the soul is an immaterial substance and whether it is immortal. The use of the term “I” presupposes that my thoughts and perceptions are experienced as bound up together and as belonging to a single entity. Matter, with its properties of extension, impenetrability, etc., cannot be conceived as producing thought. But matter is only an appearance; whatever supersensible thing it is that gives rise to the appearance of matter, that thing may well be the same as whatever supersensible thing it is that gives rise to the experience of an experiencing self (KRV A 358f/B 428f).

Leibniz’s theory of soul-body pre-established harmony set out in his New System of the Nature and the Communication of Substances of 1695 is not easy to reconcile with the interpretation of his monadology according to which what we call bodies are appearances in visual space founded upon spiritual substances lying underneath the spatio-temporal order. Yet the pre-established harmony was at least consistent with Leibniz’s claim that substances do not interact with one another and that what we call “causal interaction” does not involve a flow of power or force, but merely a regular sequence of changes in two observable things, in the case of mind and body, the experiences of perception and appetition and states of the sensory organs (G 4:76–7). Kant points to the tension between the theory of pre-established harmony and the monadology; “Why should one admit bodies, if it is possible that everything happens in the soul as a result of its own powers, which would run the same course even if entirely isolated?” (8:249).

Kant initially preferred “influx” theories of soul-body relations to the “parallelist” theories of occasionalism and pre-established harmony, but he eventually decided that dualism was incoherent. Already in the Measurement of Living Forces, he was grappling with the problem of the location of the soul and the nature of its action. Anatomists had long speculated that some region of the brain, e.g., the pineal gland (Descartes 1650) or the corpus callosum (Euler 1763), was the site of interaction between soul and body. For a time, Kant seems to have believed that souls were positioned in space and could act outside themselves and be acted upon by bodies. Later he became convinced that souls were not localized in space, though they could effect changes, deciding that that neither medicine nor metaphysics could illuminate the question. He denies that we can understand the entry of the soul into body at conception or its relation to the body throughout life, or its exit and separate existence after death. Because all our experience is experience of ourselves as living beings — when soul and body are bound together — we cannot know what a separated soul would experience. Leibniz compared existence after death to a deep sleep or a swoon, but to investigate these matters is, Kant says, like standing before a mirror with your eyes closed to see what you look like when you are asleep (20:309).

8. Freedom and Agency

Leibniz believed that every phenomenon could be explained. His Principle of Sufficient Reason states that “nothing takes place without a sufficient reason; in other words,…nothing occurs for which it would be impossible for someone who has enough knowledge of things to give a reason adequate to determine why the thing is as it is and not otherwise.” Though not everything possible happens (and, therefore not everything that happens is necessary), everything that happens has a sufficient reason in an antecedent state of the world. God’s necessary existence is the only state of affairs that is caused and does not have a sufficient reason in an antecedent state. Not only does everything have a sufficient reason, but all phenomena and events, including celestial motions, the formation of plant and animal bodies, and the processes of life, are regulated by the laws of mechanics, as the movements of the hands are regulated in a watch (G 7:417–8).

Leibniz’s Principle was incompatible with the existence of an open future and with free will. His followers recognized this aspect of his system, though his Discourse on Metaphysics, in which determinism is tied to his inclusion theory of predicate-subject relations remained unpublished until the twentieth century. Though Leibniz tried to avoid contradicting the theological dogma of free will outright, he denied that any creature could choose between alternatives to which it was indifferent, and he agreed with Locke that we are powerfully and necessarily motivated by disquiet and restlessness, which are, in Leibniz’s view, sometimes unconscious or subliminal (A 188f). My body is a machine in a wider mechanical system, and my thoughts and desires, including my “petites perceptions,” cannot but harmonize with or parallel states of that machine. “The organized mass in which the point of view of the soul is located, being expressed more immediately by it, [is] reciprocally ready to act on her account following the laws of the corporeal machine, at the moment when the soul wills it, without one disturbing the laws of other, the animal spirits and blood taking on, exactly the motions required to correspond to the passions and the perceptions of the soul” (G 4: 484). Yet, for Leibniz, the infinite complexity and uniqueness of any living machine make human actions unpredictable, and the truth of determinism is consistent with our experiences of self-control, self-management, and behavioural reform (A 195f). For a variety of reasons, Leibniz did not see determinism or mechanism as a threat to morality.

Kant did. His perception was facilitated by a series of attacks on Leibniz’s disciple Christian Wolff by theologians alarmed by what they saw as the horrific consequences of Sufficient Reason, attacks that led to Wolff’s banishment from the University at Halle. Leibniz’s “spiritual automaton,” moved by its presentations, has a freedom, Kant claims in his second critique, the Critique of Practical Reason, that is only “psychological and comparative.” If Leibniz is right, we have no more than a “freedom of the turnspit” (5: 97), wound up to run by itself. In that case, Kant thought, man is a “marionette” (5:101), and morality is but a figment of the imagination. To know that the moral law is not a figment and is genuinely binding, it might seem that we would have to know that we have the power to redirect the forces of nature. Of course we cannot know this, but, on the other hand, we cannot prove that no such power exists. [See the entry on Kant (Sect 5.2) and the entry on Kant’s moral philosophy (Sect. 10).]

Reason presents compelling arguments for the inevitable nature of every event. Reason also presents compelling arguments that the human will can influence the course of nature (KRV A 445/B 473). The antinomy is dissolved, Kant now maintains, by recognizing that causal relations must structure outward phenomena. Our investigations of nature presuppose that they do, insofar as they are scientific. Human agency is not, however, an outward phenomenon, and the assumption of determinism is not required. We can view ourselves as machines, responding to the environment in predetermined ways. However, we are not compelled to do so, and we are able to regard ourselves as agents who initiate trains of events, and who can resist (not just experience resistance to) the desires, sensations, and impulses driving the bodily machine to certain actions. Since we can do so, Kant decides, we should: we need not in that case be driven to or fall into libertinage on the basis of speculative doctrine. What reason cannot settle theoretically, she can nevertheless decide on “practical” grounds, i.e., deciding to believe one thing rather than another to preserve satisfaction (by contrast with anxiety and despair), and to give support to our sense that morality is not a figment. We ought therefore to conceptualize our possession of free will as an exemption from the laws of nature; the power of “doing and forbearing.” (5: 95).

9. Mechanism and the Order of Nature

Kant was perturbed by Hume’s criticisms of causal relations in nature, implying that there were no laws of nature for science to rely on, and by the antitheological application Hume made of his causal skepticism in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. [See the entry on Kant and Hume on causality.] He sought a third way between the Leibnizian “dogmatic” assumption that the universe is a single mechanical system of deterministically interacting physical parts, designed and set going by God, and the empiricist assumption that causality corresponds to a human feeling of anticipation with respect to some sequence of ideas. For scientific purposes, Kant thought, we must represent inorganic nature to ourselves as just such a unified mechanical system. The resolve to represent it as such is facilitated (or perhaps dictated?) by our inability to experience a world unstructured by spatial, temporal, and causal relations. If Leibniz erred by ascribing to unknown noumena the properties of causal closure belonging to phenomena, Hume erred by being unaware of the inbuilt constraints on our representational capacity. But must we represent only inorganic nature — stones, stars, nebulae, planets, billiard balls — as a set of mechanically interacting mechanical systems, or earth’s plants and animals as well? Leibniz was fully committed to the Cartesian claim that plants and animals are machines, no different in principle from automata built from wood and metal parts; though, impressed by the detail revealed by the early microscope, he described them as infinitely complex machines, “machines in their smallest parts, into infinity” (G 6: 618), another indication of the divine origins of nature. Generation and growth were on his view, mechanical processes, for, according to the doctrine of preformation, which he shared with Malebranche, generation is just growth.

Kant was not so sure. By the late 18th century, the theory of inorganic nature, thanks to Laplace, Black, Priestley, Franklin, and other chemists and electricians was flourishing, but so too was the study of physiology, embryology, and natural history, thanks especially to Bourguet, Boerhaave, Haller, and Buffon. Newtonian forces acting over a distance were no longer seen as incompatible with a commitment to mechanism, opening the door to the supposition of vital forces that might act in a lawlike fashion. Preformation was no longer a credible doctrine; the possibility of self-assembling “organic molecules,” working according to “organic mechanism,” was much discussed. Epigenesis reduced the need for a divine creator. Kant addresses the ensuing intellectual-theological crisis in the Critique of Judgment, a two-part essay dealing with beauty, beautiful forms in nature, and forms in nature generally. He tries to show that we are caught up in an antinomy. We are strongly disposed to view visible nature as a unity in which a single set of mechanical forces operates, not to divide it into an inorganic realm that came to be by the forces inherent in nature and an organic realm of plants and animals evidencing design and supernatural creation. Yet we cannot envision explaining generation or organic growth mechanistically. The solution to the dilemma is to adopt teleology as a regulative principle. We should not positively declare that organic beings could not have arisen and cannot reproduce themselves from the forces of nature, or that God must have a hand in their genesis; nevertheless, in investigating them, we look for the function and interrelation of parts, as though they were designed and built intelligently (5: 416ff). The claim that the parts of a living creature are organized in infinitum as Leibniz supposed is however, “something that cannot be thought at all.” (KRV A 526/B 554).

Leibniz was often mistakenly credited in the 18th century with the view that organic nature contained no gaps, i.e., between any two different-looking organisms, another can be found. Though such a view might seem consistent with Leibniz’s Principle of Plenitude — that the universe is as full as possible — and his Law of Continuity — his denial that nature makes leaps (GM 6: 240) — it is inconsistent with his view that not everything possible exists, but only what is compossible with other existents, and Leibniz held no such view in any case. Kant describes the idea of perfect continuity in any case as mere intellectual prejudice, since observation of nature does not objectively support it. However, he allows the “law of the ladder of continuity among creatures” has regulative importance in natural history (KRV A 668/ B 696).

10. Theology and Theodicy

Leibniz’s philosophy is theocratic. God is a king, and the world is his kingdom. Ours is the best of all possible worlds, with respect to variety, order, location, place, time, efficiency, and “the most power, knowledge, the greatest happiness and goodness in created things” (G 6: 603). For God can choose to realize any world he wishes, and it would be inconsistent with his goodness and power to realize a world that is not as good as possible. Our world metes out justice for all in the hereafter and is constantly improving. The “kingdom of nature,” in which everything happens for mechanical reasons, is at the same time, a “kingdom of grace” in which everything that happens exemplifies God’s wisdom and justice (G 6:622). Yet, though Leibniz maintained frequently that the order and regularity of nature hinted at or pointed to a divine creative hand, and suggested that the existence of anything at all implied the existence of a necessary being (G 4: 106), he produced only one actual argument for the existence of God. This was a version of Anselm’s ontological argument. Leibniz maintained that God’s existence could be deduced from the maximal concept of God as the sum of all perfections, only if it was first demonstrated that God was a possible, not an impossible object. Certain maximal concepts, such as “the greatest speed” are, he pointed out, fundamentally incoherent, and the term denotes nothing (G 4: 359–60). Leibniz saw nothing incoherent in the maximal notion of “the most perfect being” and concluded that God existed. It was unclear however, why, so long as God is possible, the Ontological Argument survives the familiar criticisms of Aquinas. The inference from possibility to necessity seems to depend less on the logic of concepts than on Leibniz’s esoteric idea that concepts, or possible objects, strive to come into existence with a tendency to exist proportional to their perfection (G 7:303).

Kant criticized arguments for God’s existence (presumably brought to his attention through Wolff’s Theologia Naturalis) that departed from the premise that the concept of God is noncontradictory as fallacious hyperrationalism. The Leibnizian argument rested, he thought, on the uncritical notion that every noncontradictory concept was a possible thing (20:302), though it is unclear why he attacks this claim in particular. Kant did not think any rationalistic proofs for the existence of God actually worked, though, at least before the mauling it received at the hands of Hume, he considered the physico-theological argument the best available. He noted perceptively the arbitrariness of merging into one theological idea a creator and a judge. Without revelation, we might be drawn to the ideas of a creator God, but why would we suppose this same being to have the power of reward and punishment after death? Taking a page from Locke, Kant decided that, since the existence of God was unknowable, philosophical effort should be directed to the idea of God, especially the separate functions that the idea of God plays in regulating our moral conduct ( judge concept) and our mode of address to the problems of form and function in the organic realm (creator concept). The distinction between the realm of grace and the realm of nature, one standing under moral laws of reward and punishment, the other under natural laws, Kant describes as a “practically necessary idea of reason” (KRV A 812 f/B 840). We conceive the world both as a community of active spirits, willing and representing, and as an aggregate of objects in mechanical interplay and shift perspectives as needed.

Physical and increasingly moral evil were topics much discussed in the 18th century, and pessimism over the condition of the world, especially its violence and suffering, was understood to be a tempting yet in some ways deplorable option.. As befit a celebrated optimist, Leibniz had a sanguine view of human beings. Most of us, he appeared to think, are morally decent people, and evil men are best dealt with by good laws and effective legal institutions. A good education and some degree of censorship are also helpful. Posthumous divine retribution will take care of what human institutions cannot. Leibniz explained the appearance of evil in the world as consistent with God’s goodness in various ways. He claimed that evil derives from the portion of inertia or nullity present in all non-divine creation; that it is a necessary accompaniment of good, or a stimulus to action, that it is an illusion based on narrow or temporally limited experience (G 4: 120f, 196, 231). Moreover, the world has not declined since the Fall, but, on the contrary, the entire universe “takes part in a perpetual and most free progress, so that it is always advancing toward greater culture (cultivation)” (G 7: 308).

Taken to ridiculous lengths by Wolff, Leibnizian optimism was targeted and satirized by Voltaire, who, however, took the problem of evil seriously. Kant as well was little inclined to make fun of evil and suffering, and he viewed liberation from theology as a precondition of better morals and politics. There are both optimistic and pessimistic strains in his philosophy. In his pre-critical writings, the Nova Dilucidatio and the Essay on Some Considerations on Optimism, he seemed inclined towards the best of all possible worlds position, but in his critical period he denied that cosmic justice is an item of knowledge. The conviction that moral goodness not only deserves reward but is rewarded is nevertheless an article of faith and hope that sustains morality.

11. Ethics and Politics

Kant’s ethics and political theory overlap with but also depart from Leibniz’s. Leibniz argued that justice requires not only that one forebear from harming others or giving them cause for complaint; justice also requires helping them by seeking their good and preventing evil when doing so is not too difficult. (Riley ed. 53–5). He suggested a variety of social improvements and measures for the remediation of poverty and anticipated the universalist formulations of Kant’s maxim-test from the Groundwork. “Put yourself in the place of another, and you will have the true point of view for judging what is just or not.” Although it is ‘impossible to act so that the whole world is content,’ the affected ones can be made as content as possible (Riley ed. 56–7). Kant’s ethics by contrast does not make the enhancement of welfare or the avoidance of harm criteria of moral goodness or rectitude, though some commentators would insist that his universalization test implicitly depends on such criteria. He acknowledges a traditional duty to benevolence but gives no socio-political examples of welfare policies and shows himself distinctly sceptical about what he considered exaggerated, tender-hearted utilitarianism (25:504–5).

Leibniz considered some forms of slavery just, insofar as some humans were similar to dumb, ineducable animals, and because slavery is contingent and temporary because life is eternal (Riley, 78). Kant insisted on a sharper animal-human divide, was not sure about immortality, but he considered only the enslavement of criminals just (6: 332–3). American aboriginals and Africans are also described as ‘fit only to be slaves’ (XV:181). The inferior races would die out or be exterminated ( (XV: 878). White, male, Christian Europeans could, he hoped, in time bring civilization to the entire world. Leibniz’s early views were no more savoury; ‘barbarians,’ whom he considered ‘beasts’ (see Perkins, 111), could be destroyed in order to civilize them. Leibniz’s racism reflects the snobbery of the courtier, which is at any rate courteous to women, while the Kantian tendency to pathologize the other flowed rather from an excess of moral fervour and his vigorous antifeminism. True to his rejection of the Principle of Contradiction, Kant saw the human soul as the battleground of animalistic instincts vs. moral duties. Self-indulgence, credulity, and indolence, which were unfortunately built into the character of women and nonEuropeans were to be combated by moral rectitude, education and critique, and industry.

Yet the deprivations that had to be endured by a person of strong moral fibre exercising a good will were, Kant recognized, real deprivations. If the struggle for self-mastery and self-improvement that he urged on his readers was not to seem, and indeed to be a pointless exercise, then knowledge, as he expressed it in the Preface to the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, had to be denied in order to make room for faith (B xxx). Alarmed by colonial depredations, Kant nevertheless saw social and geopolitical conflict as necessary, at least until his second thoughts in his 1795 essay on ‘Perpetual Peace’. Like Leibniz, he tried to find redeeming aspects to group aggression and interracial conflict as preconditions of pacification, civilization, and progress. His own concept of development, of the unfolding of latent potentials, is central to his anthropology and his philosophy of history. Development was, however, as much of a duty as an inevitability. He accepted Leibniz’s teleology of history: “We should be content with providence and with the course of human affairs as a whole, which does not begin with good and then proceed to evil, but develops gradually from worse to better…” (8:123). In his 1795 work, he arrived at the view that warfare was a scourge that would eliminate itself when exhausted and enlightened people would finally refuse to finance the rivalries and glory of princes. Leibniz, too, even more dependent than Kant on the favour of rulers, seems to have abandoned his earlier militarism in old age (see Wilson).

For Kant, philosophy is a stern discipline frequently calling for graceless prose. After publishing several floridly written popular works, and after acquiring his knowledge of physics through such accessible expositions as Bernard Fontenelle’s Dialogues on the Plurality of Worlds (1696), Emilie du Chatelet’s Institutions of Physics (1740), and Euler’s Letters to a German Princess (1768–72) (7:229–30), Kant traded literary charm for technicality, rigor, and repetition, especially in the first two Critiques. The enchanting views of the Monadology which Leibniz himself may have regarded as a jeu d’esprit were antithetical to philosophy’s true purpose. Yet Kant finally aestheticizes Leibniz, claiming that he meant only to express a view of the world that is true in its own way. The history of philosophy, Kant suggests, is not to be assessed in terms of right and wrong doctrines. To accuse Leibniz or Plato of errors is to take them as authorities, as one takes Cicero as the standard for Latin, and this is a confusion; for “there are no classical authors in Philosophy” (8: 218).


Primary Sources

  • References to Leibniz’s texts are to C.I. Gerhardt, ed., Die Philosophische Schriften von Leibniz, 7 vols., Hildesheim: Olms, 1965.
  • Page references to the New Essays cited as “A” are to volume IV Reihe 6 of the still incomplete Academy edition of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Sametliche Schriften und Briefe, ed. Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1923–.
  • References to Ariew and Garber are to G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays, Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber (tr. and ed.), Indianapolis, Hackett, 1989.
  • References to Riley are to Patrick Riley (tr. and ed.), Leibniz: Political Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • References to Kant’s texts follow the Academy edition (Gesammelte Schriften, ed., Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: Reimer, de Gruyter, 1900–) by volume and page.
  • References to the Critique of Pure Reason (KRV) are to the first (A) and second (B) edition. Where the current English translation, tr. and ed. by Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998, was directly cited, it is noted as CPR.

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