# Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Fri Jul 19, 2013; substantive revision Wed Aug 11, 2021*

Kant was a student and a teacher of mathematics throughout his career,
and his reflections on mathematics and mathematical practice had a
profound impact on his philosophical thought (Martin 1985; Moretto
2015). He developed considered philosophical views on the status of
mathematical judgment, the nature of mathematical concepts,
definitions, axioms and proof, and the relation between pure
mathematics and the natural world. Moreover, his approach to the
general question “how are synthetic judgments *a priori*
possible?” was shaped by his conception of mathematics and its
achievements as a well-grounded science.

Kant’s philosophy of mathematics is of interest to a variety of scholars for multiple reasons. First, his thoughts on mathematics are a crucial and central component of his critical philosophical system, and so they are illuminating to the historian of philosophy working on any aspect of Kant’s corpus. Additionally, issues of contemporary interest and relevance arise from Kant’s reflections on the most fundamental and elementary mathematical disciplines, issues that continue to inform important questions in the metaphysics and epistemology of mathematics. Finally, disagreements about how to interpret Kant’s philosophy of mathematics have generated a fertile area of current research and debate.

- 1. Kant’s Pre-Critical Philosophy of Mathematics
- 2. Kant’s Critical Philosophy of Mathematics
- 3. Commentary on Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Kant’s Pre-Critical Philosophy of Mathematics

In 1763, Kant entered an essay prize competition addressing the question of whether the first principles of metaphysics and morality can be proved, and thereby achieve the same degree of certainty as mathematical truths. Though his essay was awarded second prize by the Royal Academy of Sciences in Berlin (losing to Moses Mendelssohn’s “On Evidence in the Metaphysical Sciences”), it has nevertheless come to be known as Kant’s “Prize Essay”. The Prize Essay was published by the Academy in 1764 under the title “Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality” and stands as a key text in Kant’s pre-critical philosophy of mathematics.

In the Prize Essay, Kant undertook to compare the methods of
mathematics and metaphysics (Carson 1999; Sutherland 2010). He claimed
that “the business of mathematics…is that of combining
and comparing given concepts of magnitudes, which are clear and
certain, with a view to establishing what can be inferred from
them” (2:278). He claimed further that this business is
accomplished via an examination of figures or “visible
signs” that provide concrete representations of universal
concepts that have been synthetically defined (Dunlop 2014, 2020). For
example, one defines the mathematical concept <trapezium> by
arbitrary combination of other concepts (“four straight lines
bounding a plane surface so that the opposite sides are not parallel
to each
other”^{[1]}),
accompanied by a “sensible sign” that displays the
relations among the parts of all objects so defined. Definitions as
well as fundamental mathematical propositions (that space can only
have three dimensions, for example) must be “examined
*in concreto* so that they come to be cognized
intuitively”, but such propositions can never be proved since
they are not inferred from other propositions (2:281). Theorems are
established when simple cognitions are combined “by means of
synthesis” (2:282), as when, for instance, it is demonstrated
that the products of the segments formed by two chords intersecting
inside a circle are equal. In the latter case, one proves a theorem
about any and all pairs of lines that intersect inside a circle not by
“drawing all the possible lines which could intersect each other
within [the circle]” but rather by drawing only two lines, and
identifying the relationship that holds between them (2:278). The
“universal rule” that results is inferred via a synthesis
among the sensible signs that are displayed, and, as a result, among
the concepts that the sensible signs illustrate.

Kant concludes that the mathematical method cannot be applied to
achieve philosophical (and, in particular, metaphysical) results, for
the primary reason that “geometers acquire their concepts by
means of *synthesis*, whereas philosophers can only acquire
their concepts by means of *analysis*—and that completely
changes the method of thought” (2:289). Yet at this pre-critical
stage, he also concludes that, even lacking synthetic definitions of
its primary concepts, “metaphysics is as much capable of the
certainty which is necessary to produce conviction as
mathematics” (2:296). (Later, in the critical period, Kant will
expand the notion of synthesis to describe not only the genesis and
combination of mathematical concepts, but also the act of unifying
manifold representations. He will also, of course, use the terms
“synthetic” and “analytic” to distinguish two
mutually exclusive ways in which the subject and predicate concepts
relate to one another in distinct judgments of any kind, and he will
emphasize an expanded sense of this distinction that encompasses a
methodological contrast between two modes of argumentation, one
synthetic or progressive and the other analytic or regressive. These
various senses of the analytic/synthetic distinction will be addressed
briefly, below.)

In the essays “Concerning the Ultimate Ground of the
Differentiation of Directions in Space” and “On the Form
and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World [Inaugural
Dissertation]” of 1768 and 1770, respectively, Kant’s
thoughts about mathematics and its results begin to evolve in the
direction of his critical philosophy as he begins to recognize the
role that a distinct faculty of sensibility will play in an account of
mathematical cognition (Carson 2004; Carson 2017; Posy 2020). In
these essays, he attributes the success of mathematical reasoning to
its access to the “principles of sensitive form” and the
“primary data of intuition”, which results in “laws
of intuitive cognition” and “intuitive judgments”
about magnitude and extension. One such judgment serves to establish
the possibility of an object that is “exactly equal and similar
to another, but which cannot be enclosed in the same limits as that
other, its *incongruent counterpart*” (2:382) (Buroker
1981; Van Cleve and Frederick 1991; Van Cleve 1999). Kant invokes
such “incongruent counterparts” in “Directions in
space” to establish the orientability and actuality of a
Newtonian-style absolute space, the object of geometry as he then
understands it. He invokes the same example in the “Inaugural
Dissertation” to establish that spatial relations “can
only be apprehended by a certain pure intuition” and so show
that “geometry employs principles which are not only indubitable
and discursive, but which also fall under the gaze of the mind.”
As such, mathematical evidence is “the *paradigm* and the
means of all evidence in the other sciences” (2:403). (Later, in
the critical period’s *Prolegomena*, he will invoke
incongruent counterparts to establish the transcendental ideality of
space, thereby disavowing his earlier argument in support of absolute
space.)

## 2. Kant’s Critical Philosophy of Mathematics

### 2.1 Kant’s theory of the construction of mathematical concepts in “The Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use”

Kant’s critical philosophy of mathematics finds fullest
expression in the section of the *Critique of Pure Reason*
entitled “The Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use”,
which begins the second of the two main divisions of the
*Critique*, the “Transcendental Doctrine of
Method.” In previous sections of the *Critique*, Kant has
subjected pure reason “in its transcendental use in accordance
with mere concepts” to a critique in order to “constrain
its propensity to expansion beyond the narrow boundaries of possible
experience” (A711/B739). But Kant tells us that it is
unnecessary to subject mathematics to such a critique because the use
of pure reason in mathematics is kept to a “visible track”
via intuition: “[mathematical] concepts must immediately be
exhibited *in concreto* in pure intuition, through which
anything unfounded and arbitrary instantly becomes obvious”
(A711/B739). Nevertheless, the practice and discipline of mathematics
does require an explanation, in order both to account for its success
at demonstrating substantive and necessary truths, and also to license
its invocation as a model of reasoning. Kant thus directs himself, as
he did in the pre-critical period, to the question of what accounts
for the “happy and well grounded” mathematical method, and
also of whether it is useful in any discipline other than mathematics.
To answer this latter question in the negative, Kant must explain the
uniqueness of mathematical reasoning.

The central thesis of Kant’s account of the uniqueness of
mathematical reasoning is his claim that mathematical cognition
derives from the “construction” of its concepts: “to
**construct** a concept means to exhibit *a
priori* the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741)
(Friedman 1992, 2010; Shabel 2006). For example, while the concept
<triangle> can be discursively defined as a rectilinear figure
contained by three straight lines (as is done in Euclid’s
*Elements*), the concept is *constructed*, in
Kant’s technical sense of the term, only when a
corresponding intuition is exhibited; in this case, the corresponding
intuition is a singular and immediately evident representation of
a three-sided figure. Kant argues that when one so renders a triangle
for the purposes of performing the auxiliary constructive steps
necessary for geometric proof, one does so *a priori*, whether
the triangle is produced on paper or only in the imagination. This is
because in neither case does the object displayed borrow its pattern
from any experience (A713/B741). Moreover, one can derive universal
truths about all triangles from such a singular display of an
individual triangle since the particular determinations of the
displayed object, e.g., the magnitude of its sides and angles, are
“entirely indifferent” to the rendered triangle as an
exhibition of the general concept <triangle> (A714/B742).
Kant’s account must thus be defended against the commonly held
position that universal truths *cannot* be derived from
reasoning that depends on particular representations (Friedman 2012,
2020). Relatedly, the less than perfectly straight sides of an
empirically rendered triangle are similarly “indifferent”
to the general concept <triangle> and so such an empirical
intuition is considered adequate for geometric proof. This raises
questions about how one can be sure that an intuition adequately
displays the content of a concept (Dunlop 2012); the relation between
pure and empirical intuition (Friedman 2012; Shabel 2003); and,
in particular, which of the intuitively displayed features can safely
be ignored (Friedman 2010, 2012). These features of Kant’s
theory of construction also invite discussion about the acquisition
conditions of mathematical concepts (Callanan 2014); the role of
construction in indirect *reductio* proofs (Goodwin
2018); the relation between construction and definition (Heis
2014, 2020; Nunez 2014); and the role of imagination in construction
(Land 2014).

Ultimately, Kant claims that it is “only the concept of magnitudes” (quantities) that can be constructed in pure intuition, since “qualities cannot be exhibited in anything but empirical intuition” (A714/B742) (Sutherland 2004a, 2004b, 2005a, 2021). This leads to a principled distinction between mathematical and philosophical cognition: while philosophical cognition is confined to the results of an abstract conceptual analysis, mathematical cognition is the result of a “chain of inferences that is always guided by intuition”, that is, by a concrete representation of its objects (Hintikka 1967; Parsons 1969; Friedman 1992; Hogan 2020). Kant strains somewhat to explain how the mathematician constructs arithmetic and algebraic magnitudes, which are distinct from the spatial figures that are the object of geometric reasoning. Drawing a distinction between “ostensive” and “symbolic” construction, he identifies ostensive construction with the geometer’s practice of showing or displaying spatial figures, whereas symbolic construction correlates to the act of concatenating arithmetic or algebraic symbols (as when, for example, “one magnitude is to be divided by another, [mathematics] places their symbols together in accordance with the form of notation for division…”) (A717/B745) (Brittan 1992; Shabel 1998).

Kant claims further that the pure concept of magnitude is suitable for
construction because, unlike other pure concepts, it does not
represent a synthesis of *possible* intuitions, but
“already contains a pure intuition in itself.” But since
the only candidates for such “pure intuitions” are space
and time (“the mere form of appearances”), it follows that
only spatial and temporal magnitudes can be exhibited in pure
intuition, i.e., constructed. Such spatial and temporal magnitudes can
be exhibited qualitatively, by displaying the shapes of things, e.g.
the rectangularity of the panes of a window, or they can be exhibited
merely quantitatively, by displaying the number of parts of things,
e.g., the number of panes that the window comprises. In either case,
what is displayed counts as a pure and “formal intuition”,
inspection of which yields judgments that “go beyond” the
content of the original concept with which the intuition was
associated. Such judgments are paradigmatically synthetic *a
priori* judgments (to be discussed at greater length below) since
they are ampliative truths that are warranted independent of
experience (Shabel 2006).

Kant argues that mathematical reasoning cannot be employed outside the
domain of mathematics proper for such reasoning, as he understands it,
is *necessarily* directed at objects that are
“determinately given in pure intuition *a priori* and
without any empirical *data*” (A724/B752). Since only
formal mathematical objects (i.e. spatial and temporal magnitudes) can
be so given, mathematical reasoning is useless with respect to
*materially* given content (though the truths that result from
mathematical reasoning about formal mathematical objects are
fruitfully applied to such material content, which is to say that
mathematics is applicable to and *a priori* true of the
appearances (Shabel 2005). Consequently, the “thorough
grounding” that mathematics finds in its definitions, axioms,
and demonstrations cannot be “achieved or imitated” by
philosophy or physical sciences (A727/B755).

While Kant’s theory of mathematical concept construction can be
thought of as providing an explanation of mathematical practice as
Kant understood
it^{[2]},
the theory is intertwined with Kant’s broader commitments to
strict distinctions between intuitions and concepts, as modes of
representation (Smyth 2014); between synthetic and analytic judgments
(Anderson 2004, 2015; Hogan 2020); between the roles of different
cognitive faculties (Land 2014; Laywine 2014); and between *a
priori* and *a posteriori* evidence and reasoning (Anderson
2015). Ultimately, the picture of mathematics developed in the
“Discipline of Pure Reason in Dogmatic Use” depends on the
full theory of judgment that the Critical philosophy aims to
provide, and crucially on the theory of sensibility that Kant offers
in The Transcendental Aesthetic (Parsons 1992; Carson 1997; Risjord
1991), as well as in corresponding passages in the
*Prolegomena*’s Main Transcendental Question, First Part,
where he investigates the “origin” of the pure sensible
concepts of mathematics, and the “scope of their validity”
(A725/B753).^{[3]}

### 2.2 Kant’s answer to his question “How is Pure Mathematics Possible?”

Kant asks two related leading questions of his critical philosophy:
(1) How are synthetic judgments *a priori* possible?; and, (2)
How is metaphysics possible as a science (B19; B23)? Mathematics
provides a special avenue for helping to answer these questions by
providing a model of a codified scientific discipline the possibility
of which is clear and, moreover, guaranteed by its own achievement of
cognition that is both synthetic and *a priori* (Anderson
2015). In other words, an explanation of how synthetic *a
priori* judgments are affirmed in mathematical contexts, together
with the resulting and related explanation of how a systematic body of
demonstrable knowledge comprises such judgments, allow mathematical
truth to be invoked as a paradigm of the substantive yet necessary and
universal truths that metaphysics hopes to achieve. Kant’s
theory of mathematical concept construction (discussed above) can only
be fully appreciated in conjunction with his treatment of such broader
questions about the very nature and possibility of mathematical and
metaphysical knowledge (Jauernig 2013).

In both the Preamble to the *Prolegomena to Any Future
Metaphysics* and the B-Introduction to the *Critique of Pure
Reason*, Kant introduces the analytic/synthetic distinction, which
distinguishes between judgments the predicates of which belong to or
are contained in the subject concept and judgments the predicates of
which are connected to but go beyond the subject concept,
respectively. In each text, he follows his presentation of this
distinction with a discussion of his claim that all mathematical
judgments are synthetic and *a
priori*.^{[4]}
There he claims, first, that “properly mathematical judgments
are always *a priori* judgments” on the grounds that they
are necessary, and so cannot be derived from experience (B14). He
follows this with an explanation of how such non-empirical judgments
can yet be synthetic, that is, how they can serve to synthesize a
subject and predicate concept rather than merely explicate or analyze
a subject concept into its constituent logical parts.

Here Kant famously invokes the arithmetical proposition “7
+ 5 = 12” and argues that such a judgment is synthetic. He
argues negatively, claiming that “no matter how long I
analyze my concept of such a possible sum [of seven and five] I will
still not find twelve in it”, and also positively, claiming that
“One must go beyond these concepts [of seven and five], seeking
assistance in the intuition that corresponds to one of the two,
one’s five fingers, say…and one after another add the
units of the five given in the intuition to the concept of
seven…and thus see the number 12 arise” (B15). He takes
it to follow that the necessary truth of an arithmetic proposition
such as “7 + 5 = 12” cannot be established by any method
of logical or conceptual analysis (Anderson 2004, 2015), but
*can* be established by intuitive synthesis (Parsons 1969).
Recently, discussions of Kant’s theory of arithmetic have
shifted focus from questions about the syntheticity and apriority of
arithmetic judgments to investigations into Kant’s account of
number. Topics that arise here include ordinality and cardinality
(Sutherland 2017, 2020); real numbers (Tait 2020; van Atten 2012);
finitism (Tait 2016; Sieg 2016); infinity and infinitesmals (Brittan
2020; Smyth 2014, 2021; Warren 2020); and the centrality of the
concept of number in Kant’s conception of the possibility of
experience (Carson 2020).

Kant follows his discussion of arithmetic reasoning and truth with
corresponding claims about Euclidean geometry, according to which the
principles of geometry express synthetic relations between concepts
(such as between the concept of the straight line between two points
and the concept of the shortest line between those same two points),
neither of which can be analytically “extracted” from the
other. The principles of geometry thus express relations among basic
geometric concepts inasmuch as these can be “exhibited in
intuition” (Shabel 2003; Sutherland 2005a). Elsewhere, Kant
also includes geometric *theorems* as the sorts of propositions
(in addition to geometric principles) that count as synthetic, and
offers thoughts about geometric proof (A716–7/B744–5) (Friedman
1992, 2010; Shabel 2004). One way to understand the syntheticity
of geometric theorems is by recognizing an indispensable diagrammatic
role for intuitions in geometric proof (Shabel 2004, 2004).

Notably, the scope of Kant’s claim that geometric theorems are
synthetic is not transparent. Having denied that the
*principles* (Grundsätze) could be cognized analytically
from the principle of contradiction, he admits that mathematical
inference of the kind needed to establish geometric *theorems*
does proceed “in accordance with the principle of
contradiction”, and also that “a synthetic proposition can
of course be comprehended in accordance with the principle of
contradiction” though “only insofar as another synthetic
proposition is presupposed from which it can be deduced, never in
itself” (B14). So, while he is clear that all mathematical
judgments, including geometric theorems, are synthetic, he is less
clear about exactly what it means for such propositions or the
inferences that support them to “accord with” the
principle of contradiction, derivability from which he takes to be the
paradigm test of *analyticity* (Hogan 2020). This
leads to an interpretive disagreement as to whether demonstrable
mathematical judgments follow from the synthetic principles via
strictly logical or conceptual inference—and so in strict
accordance with *only* the principle of contradiction—or
whether they are deduced via inferences that are themselves reliant on
intuition, but which do not violate the law of contradiction. There is
thus disagreement over whether Kant is committed merely to the
syntheticity of the axioms of mathematics (which transmit syntheticity
to demonstrable theorems via logical inference), or is also committed
to the syntheticity of mathematical inference itself. The former
interpretive position is originally associated with Ernst Cassirer and
Lewis White Beck; the latter position with Bertrand Russell (Hogan
2020). Gordon Brittan (Brittan 2006) conceives both such positions
“evidentialist”, which is his label for any interpretation
according to which intuitions provide indispensable evidence for the
truth of mathematics, whether that evidence is provided in support of
axioms or inferences, or both (Brittan 2006).

Attention to this interpretive issue in Kant’s philosophy of
mathematics is vital for the light it sheds on the more general
question of what makes synthetic *a priori* cognition possible,
the central question of Kant’s *Critique of Pure Reason*.
With respect to this more general question, it is important to
differentiate Kant’s use of the terms “analytic” and
“synthetic” to mark a logico-semantic distinction between
types of judgments—which Kant uses to defend the distinctive
thesis that mathematical cognition is synthetic *a
priori*—from his use of the same terms to mark a traditional
mathematical distinction, between analytic and synthetic
*methods*. He deploys the latter distinction in order to
identify two distinct argumentative strategies for answering the
question of the “possibility of pure mathematics.” The
analytic method is characterized by reasoning that traces a given body
of cognition, such as mathematics, to its origin or sources in the
mind. By contrast, the synthetic method aims to derive real cognition
directly from such original cognitive sources, which sources or powers
are first explicated independently of any particular body of cognition
(including mathematics) that the powers might ultimately produce. Kant
adopts the former method in his *Prolegomena*, arguing from the
synthetic and *a priori* nature of mathematical judgment to the
claim that space and time are the forms of human sensibility; he
adopts the latter method in the *Critique of Pure Reason*,
arguing that the forms of human sensibility, space and time, provide
the basis from which to derive synthetic and *a priori*
mathematical judgments (Shabel 2004). These arguments, together with
the details of his account of the synthetic and *a priori*
nature of all mathematical judgment, provide an answer to the question
of the possibility of mathematics: the practices that yield the
paradigmatically synthetic and *a priori* judgments of the
science of mathematics are grounded in and explained by the very
nature of human sensibility, and, in particular, by the
spatio-temporal form of all (and only) the objects of human experience
(Van Cleve 1999). But, this answer raises further questions, in
particular about how to distinguish between metaphysical and geometric
representations of space (Carson 1997; Friedman 2000, 2015, 2020; Onof
and Schulting 2014; Tolley 2016).

### 2.3 Kant’s conception of the role of mathematics in Transcendental Idealism

Kant’s theory of mathematical practice connects not only with his theory of intuition and sensibility (as described above) but also with other aspects of the doctrine of Transcendental Idealism, as it is articulated throughout Kant’s critical works.

In the Transcendental Analytic, Kant deduces the table of twelve
categories, or pure concepts of the understanding, the first six of
which he describes as “mathematical” (as opposed to
“dynamical”) categories because of their concern with
objects of intuition (B110). The concept of number is treated as
“belonging” to the category of “allness” or
totality, which is itself thought to result from the combination of
the concepts of unity and plurality (Parsons 1984; see 2.2 above for
other topics related to Kant’s account of number). But, Kant
claims further that difficulties that arise in the representation of
infinities—in which one allegedly represents unity and plurality
with no resulting representation of *number*—reveal that
a concept of number must require the mediation of “a special act
of the understanding” (B111). (This special act is presumably
the *synthesis* that Kant describes as a function of both
imagination and understanding, and which it is the business of the
full theory of judgment—including the Transcendental Deduction
and the Schematism—to explain (Carson 2017; Longuenesse 1998).)
So, though he also claims that arithmetic “forms its concepts of
numbers through successive addition of units in time” (4:283),
it is misleading to infer that arithmetic is to time as geometry is to
space, since a formal intuition of time is inadequate to explain the
general and abstract science of
number.^{[5]}
In fact, Kant declares mechanics to be the mathematical science that
is to time what geometry is to space (Sutherland 2014).

In the Schematism, Kant undertakes to identify the particular
mechanism that enables the pure concepts of the understanding to
subsume sensible intuitions, with which they are heterogeneous. The
categories must be “schematized” because their
non-empirical origin in pure understanding prevents their having the
sort of sensible content that would connect them immediately to the
objects of experience; transcendental schemata are mediating
representations that are meant to establish the connection between
pure concepts and appearances in a rule-governed way. Mathematical
concepts are discussed in this context since they are unique in being
pure but also sensible concepts: they are pure because they are
strictly *a priori* in origin, and yet they are sensible since
they are constructed *in concreto*. (Kant further complicates
this issue by identifying number as the pure schema of the category of
magnitude (Longuenesse 1998).) There arises an interpretive question
as to whether mathematical concepts, whose conceptual content is given
sensibly, require schematization by a distinguishable “third
thing”, and, if so, what it amounts to (Leavitt 1991; Young
1984). More broadly, the question arises as to how the transcendental
imagination, the faculty responsible for schematism, operates in
mathematical contexts (Domski 2010).

Finally, in the Analytic of Principles, Kant derives the synthetic
judgments that “flow *a priori* from pure concepts of the
understanding” and which ground all other *a priori*
cognitions, including those of mathematics (A136/B175). The principles
of pure understanding that are associated with the categories of
quantity (i.e., unity, plurality and totality) are the Axioms of
Intuition. Whereas mathematical principles proper are “drawn
only from intuition” and so do not constitute any part of the
system of principles of pure understanding, the explanation for the
possibility of such mathematical principles (outlined above) must be
supplemented by an account of the highest possible transcendental
principles (A148–9/B188–9) (Shabel 2017). Accordingly, the
Axioms of Intuition provide a meta-principle, or principle *of*
the mathematical principles of quantity, namely that “All
intuitions are extensive magnitudes” (A161/B202). Most
commentators interpret Kant here to be indicating why the principles
of mathematics, which have to do with pure space and time, are
applicable to the appearances: the appearances can only be represented
“through the same synthesis as that through which space and time
in general are determined” (A161/B202). So, *all*
intuitions, whether pure or empirical, are “extensive
magnitudes” that are governed by the principles of mathematics.
(For an alternative view of the Axioms, see Sutherland
2005b).

It is also notable that key passages in the *Critique of the Power
of Judgment* deal with mathematics and the “mathematical
sublime” (Fugate 2014; Breitenbach 2015). See especially
[5:248ff].

## 3. Commentary on Kant’s Philosophy of Mathematics

### 3.1 History of the Field

Kant’s conception of mathematics was debated by his
contemporaries; influenced and provoked Frege, Russell and Husserl;
and provided inspiration for Brouwerian Intuitionism. His conception
of mathematics was rejuvenated as worthy of close historical study by
Gottfried Martin’s 1938 monograph *Arithmetik und
Kombinatoric bei Kant* (Martin 1985). Despite the very different
positions that contemporary commentators develop as to how best to
understand Kant’s thought, they are broadly united in opposing a
long-standard story (perhaps originally promoted by Bertrand Russell
in his *Principles of Mathematics* and by Rudolph Carnap in his
*Philosophical Foundations of Physics*) according to which the
development of modern logic in the 19^{th} and 20^{th}
centuries, the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries, and the
formalization of mathematics renders Kant’s intuition-based
theory of mathematics and related philosophical commitments obsolete
or irrelevant. Contemporary commentators seek to reconstruct
Kant’s philosophy of mathematics from the vantage of
Kant’s own historical context and also to identify the elements
of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics that are of eternal
philosophical interest (Parsons 2014).

English language scholarship in the analytic tradition on
Kant’s philosophy of mathematics (the focus of this
article) has been influenced most strongly by an enduring debate
between Jaakko Hintikka and Charles Parsons over Kant’s view of
the role of intuition in mathematics, leading to what have
come to be known as the “logical” and
“phenomenological” interpretations; by Michael
Friedman’s seminal book, *Kant and the Exact Sciences*
(Friedman 1992), as well as his now classic articles
“Kant’s Theory of Geometry” and “Geometry,
Construction and Intuition in Kant and his Successors” (Friedman
1985, 2000); and by the papers collected in Carl Posy’s volume
*Kant*’*s Philosophy of Mathematics: Modern
Essays* (which includes contributions by Hintikka, Parsons
and Friedman, as well as by Stephen Barker, Gordon Brittan, William
Harper, Philip Kitcher, Arthur Melnick, Carl Posy, Manley Thompson,
and J.Michael Young, all of which were published more than twenty five
years ago (Posy 1992).)

### 3.2 Interpretive Debates

The interpretive debate over how to understand Kant’s view of the role of intuition in mathematical reasoning has had the strongest influence on the shape of scholarship in Kant’s philosophy of mathematics; this debate is directly related to the question (described above) of the syntheticity of mathematical axioms, theorems and inferences. In his general discussion of mental representation, Kant implies that immediacy and singularity are both criteria of non-conceptual, intuitive representation, the species of representation that grounds synthetic judgment. In a series of papers, Charles Parsons (Parsons 1964, 1969, 1984) has argued that the syntheticity of mathematical judgments depends on mathematical intuitions being fundamentally immediate, and he explains the immediacy of such representations in a perceptual way, as a direct, phenomenological presence to the mind. Jaakko Hintikka (Hintikka 1965, 1967, 1969), developing an idea from E.W. Beth’s earlier work, counters that the syntheticity of mathematical judgments instead depends only on the singularity of their intuitive constituents. Hintikka assimilates mathematical intuitions to singular terms or particulars, and explains the use of intuition in a mathematical context by analogy to an application of the logical rule of existential instantiation. These two positions have come to be known as the “phenomenological” and “logical” interpretations, respectively.

Michael Friedman’s original position (Friedman 1985, 1992) with
respect to the role of intuition in mathematical reasoning descends
from Beth’s and Hintikka’s, though it is substantially
different from theirs and has been modified in his most recent
writings. In his *Kant and the Exact Sciences *(Friedman 1992),
Friedman takes the position that our modern conception of logic ought
to be used as a tool for interpreting (rather than criticizing) Kant,
noting that the explicit representation of an infinity of mathematical
objects that can be generated by the polyadic logic of modern
quantification theory is conceptually unavailable to the mathematician
and logician of Kant’s time. As a result of the inadequacy of
monadic logic to represent an infinity of objects, the
eighteenth-century mathematician relies on intuition to deliver the
representations necessary for mathematical reasoning. Friedman
explicates the details of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics on
the basis of this historical insight.

Friedman has modified his original position in response to criticism from Emily Carson (Carson 1997), who has developed an interpretation of Kant’s theory of geometry that is Parsonsian in its anti-formalist emphasis on the epistemological and phenomenological over the logical role for intuition in mathematics. In recent work (Friedman 2000, 2010), Friedman argues that the intuition that grounds geometry is fundamentally kinematical, and is best explained by the translations and rotations that describe both the constructive action of the Euclidean geometer and the perceptual point of view of the ordinary, spatially oriented observer. This account provides a synthesis between the logical and phenomenological interpretive accounts, in large part by connecting the geometrical space that is explored by the imagination via Euclidean constructions to the perspectival space that is, according to Kant, the form of all outer sensibility. More specifically, Friedman reconciles the logical interpretation with the phenomenological by “[embedding] the purely logical understanding of geometrical constructions (as Skolem functions) within space as the pure form of our outer sensible intuition (as described in the Transcendental Aesthetic)” (Friedman 2012, n.17). Additionally, Friedman has argued against diagrammatic interpretations of Kantian intuition (Friedman 2012) and has marshalled evidence from the B-Deduction to support his understanding of the connections among geometrical construction, the space of perception, and physical space (Friedman 2020), and the relation between geometry and experience (Friedman 2015).

### 3.3. Current State of the Field

New generations of scholars contribute to a lively, fertile and
ongoing discussion about the interpretation and legacy of Kant’s
philosophy of mathematics that originated with the literature
mentioned in 3.1 and 3.2, above. However, recent work is not easily
categorized as landing on either side of one or another interpretive
debate; most scholars are using the field’s foundational
discussions as a springboard from which to explore the variety of ways
in which mathematics plays a role in the critical philosophy. In 2020,
Carl Posy and Ofra Rechter published the first volume of a two-volume
successor to Posy’s 1992 collection, entitled
*Kant*’*s Philosophy of Mathematics, Volume I: The
Critical Philosophy and Its Roots*. This first volume includes
twelve essays on topics that range from the pre-critical origins of
Kant’s philosophy of mathematics to his critical thoughts on
mathematical method, logic, geometry and arithmetic. The essays in the
forthcoming second volume will focus on the reception and influence of
Kant’s philosophy of mathematics. Also notable is a collection
of articles first published in a special issue of the Canadian Journal
of Philosophy, *Kant: Studies on Mathematics in the Critical
Philosophy*, edited by Emily Carson and Lisa Shabel (Carson and
Shabel 2014). The nine contributions collected here aim to explore the
centrality of mathematics in Kant’s overall philosophical
system. Daniel Sutherland has recently written a book-length
treatment of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics,
*Kant*’*s Mathematical World: Mathematics, Cognition,
and Experience* (Sutherland 2021), in which he focuses on
Kant’s theory of magnitudes as the key to Kant’s account
of our cognition and experience of the world. A second volume is
forthcoming.

## Bibliography

References to Kant’s texts follow the pagination of the Academy
edition (*Gesammelte Schriften*, Akademie der Wissenschaften
(ed.), Berlin: Reimer/DeGruyter, 1910ff.) References to the
*Critique of Pure Reason* employ the usual A/B convention.
Translations are from the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel
Kant.

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Concepts”,
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