Notes to Kant’s Views on Space and Time

1. See, inter alia, Buchdahl 1969, 587–9; Kemp Smith 1918, 140–2; Paton 1936, 1: 171–6; Broad 1978, 50–1; Heidegger 1962, 155; Martin 1955, 12–15; Wolff 1963, 4–8; Allison 1983, 12, 107–111; Guyer 1987, 350–6; and, van Cleve 1999, 114.

2. In §1 of the Jäsche Logic (Ak 9: 91), Kant writes: “All cognitions [Erkenntnisse], that is, all representations consciously referred to an object, are either intuitions or concepts. Intuition is a singular representation (repraesentatio singularis), the concept is a general (repraesentatio per notas communes) or reflected representation (repraesentatio discursiva).” For an illuminating discussion of these issues, see Thompson 1972, 323 and Allais 2007.

3. One of the clearest recent discussions of intuition, sensation and the representation of space in the first Critique can be found in Allais 2009. She argues that intuition provides us with representations of particulars--of things with spatial locations--independently of concepts, urging that we distinguish this claim about representation from the famous Kantian thought that we cannot achieve cognition without both intuitions and concepts (Allais 2009, 390).

4. For several influential accounts that differ in the details, see Thompson 1972, Friedman 1992, Parsons 1992, and most recently, Posy 2000.

5. Hence some interpreters have understood intuition as providing us with singular direct reference—see especially Posy 2000 for an illuminating understanding of that, and several related, ideas.

6. It does so because in Kant’s terminology, <desk> contains <furniture> which means, in turn, that <desk> is a species of the genus, <furniture>. It is also possible to read Kant as arguing that concepts represent objects mediately not because of the higher-level genus of which they are a species, but because of the lower-level species for which they serve as a genus. I do not have the space to explore the details of that reading here, but see A68–9/B93–4.

7. In recent years, there has been considerable scholarly interest in the question of what is sometimes called "nonconceptual content" following a prominent discussion in John McDowell’s Mind and World. Many scholars have then applied this question to the first Critique, asking whether Kant believed in such content. One might wonder in particular: does Kant’s analysis of intuition in the Transcendental Aesthetic imply that we can have representational content without the employment of concepts, or do his remarks in the Transcendental Deduction about judgment and experience undermine that view? Since these questions do not specifically concern Kant’s view of space and time, we cannot delve into the complexities involved in answering them in this entry. However, there are many intriguing treatments of the topic in the recent scholarly literature: see, e.g., Ginsborg 2008, Grüne 2017, and Tolley 2013.

8. Commentators sometimes think that Kant’s use of Begriff here presents a problem, since Kant himself tries to show that the representation of space is not begrifflich (conceptual) in character (see below). But Begriff also has the general meaning of a notion or a representation, which seems to be the usage here. The term has a technical meaning in the Kantian vocabulary—one noted above—but the two should not be conflated. For a helpful discussion of Kant's idea of an "exposition" and its difference from a definition, see Dunlop 2012, 94–94 and also Messina 2015, 422.

9. The full passage reads as follows (L 5: 47):

I will show here how men come to form the notion [la notion] of space. They consider that many things exist at once and they observe in them a certain order of co-existence, according to which the relation of one thing to another is more or less simple. It’s their situation or distance. When it happens that one of those co-existent things changes its relation to a multitude of others, which do not change their relation among themselves; and that another new thing acquires the same relation to the others, as the former had, this change we call a motion in that body wherein is the immediate cause of the change. And though many, or even all, the co-existent things should change according to certain known rules of direction and swiftness, yet one may always determine the relation of situation, which every co-existent acquires with respect to every other co-existent; and even that relation which any other co-existent would have to this, or which this would have to any other, if it had not changed, or if it had changed any other way. And supposing, or feigning, that among those co-existents there is a sufficient number of them which have undergone no change, then we may say, that those which have such a relation to those fixed existents, as others had to them before, now have the same place which those others had. And that which comprehends all those places, is called space. Which shows, that in order to have the idea of place, and consequently of space, it suffices to consider these relations and the rules of their changes, without needing to form an absolute reality [réalité absolue] out of the things whose situation we consider.

10. One of Leibniz’s points seems to be that his relationalism is perfectly compatible with the contention that the representation of space is empirical (for the view that some of the arguments in the Metaphysical Exposition are intended to undermine Leibnizian relationalism, see Guyer 1987, 349; Wojtowicz 1997, 79, 84, 87; Brandt 1997, 96–7; Walker 1978, 42–4; Parsons 1992, 68). He apparently employs this tactic to show that perceivers can obtain a representation of space via the perception of spatial relations among objects without recourse to the view that space is ontologically independent of objects. This parallels Locke’s attempt to show that one can obtain an Idea of space while having distinct ideas of space and of body. So the idea—popular among Newton’s supporters like Locke—that the representation of space is empirical in origin is perfectly compatible with relationalism. Indeed, Locke’s view may very well have been on Leibniz’s mind when he argued for the compatibility of an empiricist conception of the representation of space with his relationalist conception of space’s ontological status because of his considerable interest in Locke’s theory of ideas. This is a clever tactic on Leibniz’s part: when writing to Newton’s most prominent defender in England, Samuel Clarke, he accepts an empiricist view of the representation of space in order to show that this acceptance does nothing to upset his defense of the relationalist conception of space’s ontological status.

11. For differing accounts of this issue, see, for instance, Parsons 1992, 68 and Collins 1999, 68–9, 191 note 9.

12. On this point, see especially Leibniz’s letter to Arnauld of 30 April 1687 in Leibniz 1890, 2: 101. See also New Essays, 110 and L5: 32. For an illuminating discussion of reification, see Cassirer 1902, 247, 254.

13. See “Vienna Logic,” Ak 24: 910–913 and “Jäsche Logic,” §§7–9, Ak 9: 95–98 and Ak 9: 40. The most detailed and helpful discussion of Kant's understanding of the difference between conceptual and intuitive representation is Anderson 2015 (see, e.g., 65–68 for a discussion of extension and intension). Anderson very helpfully situates Kant's view within the crucial Wolffian background in which Kant first began philosophizing in the 1740s and 1750s (see 2015, 81–88).

14. However, there is no consensus on this point. For instance, Messina argues that in fact the Metaphysical Exposition provides an analysis of the essence of space itself, rather than of the representation of space (Messina 2015).

15. Of course, a Leibnizian would deny this point, and it is unclear that Kant has any argument against an alternate view—this may represent a bedrock disagreement. For discussion, see Friedman 1992, 62–8 and Posy 2000, 161–2.

16. Kant’s contention that space is represented as an infinite given magnitude has generated substantial scholarly discussion. For a helpful analysis of recent scholarship on that question, see Patton 2011 and also Posy 2008. In a recent paper, Guyer argues that according to Kant’s considered view in the Critique, we do not represent space as an infinite given magnitude because space is not an object – and therefore not an infinite object – but rather merely a form of intuition, so it actually has no determine magnitude (Guyer 2018, 189, 191, 196). There is also the question of how to understand the relation between the claim in the Aesthetic that space and time are infinite given magnitudes and the discussion of spaces and times in the Axioms of Intuition. For instance, in the former Kant seems to suggest that there is a priority of the whole over the parts for space and time, but in the latter, the suggestion seems to be that since space and time are intuitions and all intuitions are magnitudes, it follows that there is a priority of the parts over the whole, as for all magnitudes. These puzzles, and many related issues, are deftly handled in Daniel Sutherland’s recent book, where he distinguishes between Kant’s analysis of space and time per se and his analysis of particular spaces and times (Sutherland 2022, 36–40). More generally, Sutherland provides a detailed analysis of Kant’s general view that mathematics is the science of magnitudes.

17. See the so-called Physical Monadology at Ak 1: 479ff; for a discussion of this aspect of Kant’s pre-critical views, see Friedman 1992, 7–9.

18. For a distinct interpretation, one according to which this may not be possible after all, see Buroker 1981, 8–9, 22.

19. On this point, see especially the “Amphiboly of the Pure Concepts of Reflection,” which serves as an Appendix to the Transcendental Analytic in the first Critique—A260–92/B316–49.

20. These ideas are discussed and clarified in Adams 1994, 181–2, 246–7 and Langton 1998, 93–121. Langton in particular attempts to provide a reading of Leibniz’s metaphysics—especially its treatment of relations and of space and time—that helps to illuminate Kant’s transcendental idealism.

21. Other passages corroborate the impression that this sentence leaves. For instance, in the first passage in the Aesthetic in which Kant claims that transcendental idealism is correct, he writes: “Space represents no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relation of them to each other, i.e., no determination of them that attaches to objects themselves and that remains even if one abstracts from all subjective conditions of intuition” (A26/B42; cf. A39/B56). And in a later passage in the Critique, after describing transcendental idealism, Kant adds (in a section of the text quoted above): “To this idealism is opposed a transcendental realism, which regards time and space as something given in themselves (independent of our sensibility)” (A369; the passage is retained in the second edition).

22. In a recent paper, Jauernig (2008) presents a markedly different interpretation in part in an attempt to indicate that Kant’s criticisms in the Critique are often intended to undermine various Leibnizian positions that Leibniz himself did not embrace. In the course of presenting this interpretive perspective, Jauernig provides a very helpful reading of the so-called Amphiboly, the text in which Kant discusses Leibnizian philosophical views in the most depth.

23. The contention that transcendental idealism and transcendental realism differ in their conceptions of the relation between space and intuition, rather than space and the mind, is significant. For as we have seen, Leibniz does not think that space is real in the sense of being independent of the mind per se; space is a relational order and relations are dependent on “the understanding.” Rather, on Kant’s reading, he thinks space is independent of intuition per se.

24. Yet if Leibniz thinks that space is a relational order, that relations are mind-dependent, and that our <space>confused is dependent upon sense perception, is he committed to the idea that space itself is somehow dependent upon sense perception? If so, it is not clear that Kant’s characterization of him through the lens of transcendental realism is fair. First, as Kant well knew, Leibniz contends in the New Essays that relations are not merely mind-dependent, but in fact dependent on the understanding, rather than on sense perception. This may suggest that when we consider space through the lens of the understanding—when we focus on our <space>clear & distinct—we find that space is a relational order that depends upon the understanding because it depends upon relations, which in turn are “added” by the understanding to the objects that exist. Perhaps the suggestion here is that relations themselves are not an aspect of our <space>confused but in fact are an aspect of our <space>clear & distinct. One might think our confused representation of space represents space as a kind of independent entity, and not as a relational order, since for Leibniz, the ordinary conception is mistaken in its portrayal of space as a kind of quasi-entity. Of course, space is not actually a quasi-entity, and therefore the correct view of the origin of our representation of space, outlined in Leibniz’s last letter to Clarke, should not present space in that fashion. Instead, the correct view of the origin of our representation of space ought to presuppose that space is merely a relational order, and ought to be able to explain that origin while making that presupposition, despite the fact that the representation itself represents space as something other than a relational order. When we focus on our <space>clear & distinct, we find that space is represented as a relational order, and as we have seen, those relations are dependent upon the understanding.

25. He makes a similar charge elsewhere in the Aesthetic:

For if one regards space and time as properties whose possibility must be found in things in themselves [Sachen an sich], and considers the absurdities in which one is then entangled, in that two infinite things [Dinge], which are not substances nor something actually inhering in substances, must yet exist, nay, must be the necessary condition of the existence of all things, and also must remain even if all existing things are removed,– one cannot blame the good Berkeley if he degraded bodies to mere illusion [bloßem Schein]… (B70–1; cf. Inaugural Dissertation, Ak 2: 403–4).

26. See, e.g., A172–5/B214–17 and Metaphysical Foundations, Ak 4: 534–5, 563–5.

27. Vorländer reprints the review in his edition of the Prolegomena (Kant 1920) at 167–74, along with letters between Garve and Kant from 1783 at 175–88.

28. It is certainly possible to read this passage differently, and to regard Berkeley as a transcendental realist in Kant’s schema. If transcendental realism is the view that we can obtain knowledge of things in themselves, and if Berkeley can be understood as arguing that we know things in themselves to be nothing but concatenations of ideas—and the remaining things to be minds, and perhaps God—then he can be understood as a transcendental realist.

29. This seems to be Kant’s interpretation of Berkeley, despite some obvious shortcomings. Kant seems to ignore the fact that for Berkeley, the mind—and also God—are independent of intuition, or of sense perception. In other words, Berkeley surely takes God and minds to be real entities in the sense that they, unlike everything else, are not mere congeries of ideas.

30. There is also some contemporary support for reading Leibniz as a kind of idealist—see especially the interpretation in Adams 1994.

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