Supplement to Kant's Transcendental Idealism

Phenomenalist Identity Readings and the Problem of Illusion

While the combination of an Identity view (appearances and things in themselves are numerically identical) with a “phenomenalist” account of appearances (sketched in the main text) has been attractive to many readers of Kant, it is subject to an apparent problem. If the appearance/thing in itself distinction is a distinction between the properties objects appear to have, and the properties they really have, it follows that for any property we cognize of an object, that object does not really have that property in itself. This means that, for instance, our representation of objects as spatial is systematically mistaken, the very consequence Kant derides as “empirical idealism”.

However, this objection is not nearly as damaging as is sometimes thought. For, drawing on the distinction between perception and universal experience from section 3, the phenomenalist identity reader can distinguish two different ways in which a representation can be illusory:

  • (1) x is perceived as F but is not F
  • (2) x is represented in universal experience as F but is not F

The phenomenalist then has two options: she can either argue that (2) is impossible, or she can argue that (2) is not a case of illusion, i.e., that

  • (3) An illusion is a case in which an object x is perceived to be F but represented in universal experience as being F.

In other words, the phenomenalist can draw a distinction between illusion and veridical perception in terms of the content of perception and universal experience itself. I will discuss the first strategy first.

In denying the possibility of (2), the phenomenalist is denying that, for the range of properties that can appear in the content of experience, it is possible for an object to lack those properties if it is experienced as having them. The most natural ways of explaining this is to claim that the possession of such properties by empirical objects is grounded in our universal experience of them as possessing such properties, i.e.,

  • (4) For any experienceable property F and any object x, if x has F, then this is so in virtue of the fact that universal experience represents x as F.

Two points need to be made about this. One, it requires the phenomenalist to alter slightly their view from my initial formulation. The distinction between the appearance and the thing in itself is not a distinction between the properties the object appears to have and those it has; it is the distinction between the properties of the object, the possession of which are grounded in experience of the object, and those which are not. In contemporary terms, it is a distinction between the mind-dependent and the mind-independent properties. Secondly, the phenomenalist needs to explain what universal experience is, and what its contents are. I explored one such interpretation of “universal experience” in section 3 above.

The alternate strategy for the phenomenalist identity reader would be to claim that it is not a case of illusion if we experience an object as F but that object is not F. The phenomenalist might draw a distinction between “transcendental illusion” and “empirical illusion” as follows:

Transcendental illusion. Transcendental illusions are cases in which universal experience represents objects as having certain properties but they lack those properties.

Empirical illusion. Empirical illusions are cases in which a subject perceives an object as having a property but universal experience does not represent it as having that property.

The phenomenalist, once again, owes us an account of what “universal” experience is, and what its content is, but even without this we can see the point of the distinction. Transcendental illusion is opposed to cases in which we veridically experience the properties objects really have, which Kant, on this reading, takes to be impossible. So universal experience is a systematic illusion, but only in the transcendental sense. Empirical illusion is opposed to cases in which our perceptions cohere with one another according to the a priori laws that constitute universal experience. In denying that the spatiality of objects is an illusion, Kant is merely denying that it is an empirical illusion; given that space is the form of outer sense, we know a priori that, whatever its specific content, universal experience will represent objects as in space. And that coherence among our perceptions is all that is needed to ground the empirical judgment that objects are in space.

Copyright © 2016 by
Nicholas F. Stang <>

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