Notes to The Analysis of Knowledge

1. M. Kaplan 1985 and Dutant 2015 are helpful in laying out the history here.

2. Hazlett takes this to motivate divorcing semantic considerations about the verb “to know” from knowledge, the state of traditional epistemic interest. Even though “knows” is, according to Hazlett, not a factive verb, even Hazlett accepts that knowledge itself is a state that can only obtain if its content is true.

3. One possible objection to the truth condition (noted by Nicholas Maxwell) is that we seem to have knowledge of false empirical theories, like Newtonian Physics. But this doesn’t show that knowledge doesn’t require truth. Remember, the JTB theory is a theory of propositional knowledge, not knowledge by acquaintance. One might know Newtonian Physics (just as one might know Isaac Newton)—it is much more dubious that one could know that Newtonian Physics is true.

4. Gettier 1963 considered three slightly different tripartite analyses, which differed in how the belief condition was articulated; one was given in terms of “believes”, one in terms of “accepts”, and one in terms of “is sure that”. Epistemologists have tended to follow Gettier in treating these as effectively equivalent. For further discussion, see McGlynn 2014: 25–9 and Ichikawa forthcoming-a: §7.1

5. This is not necessarily to say that the subject must have engaged in an activity of justifying, or attempted to show that p is true. Rather, what the justification condition requires is merely that a belief that qualifies as knowledge have the property of being justified. It can have that property even if S did not engage in the activity of justifying her belief that p. Consider an ordinary person’s belief that five and five is ten. Most people have never attempted to justify this belief, and probably would be at a loss as to how to go about justifying it. But for most people, that belief would qualify as an instance of knowledge. The importance of the distinction between the activity of justifying and a belief’s property of being justified is emphasized by William Alston in the following passage:

To turn to justification, the first point is that we will be working with the concept of a subject S’s being justified in believing that p, rather than with the concept of S’s justifying a belief. That is, we will be concerned with the state or condition of being justified, rather than with the activity of justifying a belief. These concepts are sometimes conflated in the literature. The crucial difference between them is that while to justify a belief is to marshal considerations in its support, in order for one to be justified in believing that p it is not necessary that one have done anything by way of an argument for p or for one’s epistemic situation vis-à-vis p. Unless one is justified in many beliefs without arguing for them, there is precious little one can justifiably believe. (Alston 1991: 71)

For an alternative view, see Almeder 1999: 90 and 123. Almeder defends the view that,

as a matter of ordinary discourse, “being justified” is not something we can always separate from the activity of giving, or being able to give, reasons when the question “How do you know?” is appropriately asked. (Ibid: 92)

6. See Feldman & Conee 1985 and Conee & Feldman 2004 for a general presentation of their “evidentialist” view; see Feldman & Conee 2001 for a distinctive focus on their internalism. For criticisms of evidentialism, see DeRose 2000, and Plantinga 1996a: 358–361, and the essays of Dougherty 2011; for criticisms of internalism more generally, see Goldman 1999 & 2009b.

7. This is a simplified statement of reliabilism; a more precise one distinguishes conditionally reliable mechanisms (like inference) from unconditionally reliable ones (like perception). See Goldman 1979.

8. Finer distinctions are sometimes drawn; for example, one might consider ex ante justification (in a position to have a justified belief) as distinct from both doxastic (having a justified belief) and propositional (having reason to believe) justification. For one such motivation, see Ichikawa & Jarvis 2013: 162–4. For another example, Lowy 1978 articulates a notion of personal justification that is importantly distinct from doxastic justification.

9. This talk of “sufficient reason” is intended to be consistent with the idea that in some cases, no reasons are needed to suffice for propositional justification—that some justification comes “for free”, not dependent on the possession of any reasons at all. See e.g., Lyons 2009, Wright 2004. In such cases, the null set of reasons constitutes “sufficient” reason.

10. Externalists about doxastic justification, of course, will think that whether a belief is in the relevant sense “appropriate” is settled in part by external factors.

11. See Chisholm 1977, chapter 6. Chisholm’s strategy of building a degettiering clause into the justification condition is difficult to understand, given Chisholm’s deep commitment to internalism. Since degettiering is an external matter, this strategy makes justification an external property.

12. See, for example, Armstrong 1973: 152 and Clark 1963. For further references, see Shope 1983: 24. This monograph provides a comprehensive discussion of the Gettier literature up to 1980. For a shorter helpful discussion of the Gettier problem, see the Appendix in Pollock 1986.

13. This case is similar to Chisholm’s (1989) “sheep on a hill” case.

14. More sophisticated articulations of a sensitivity condition will relativize it to bases or methods. See Nozick 1981: 179. The argument against sensitivity given in the main text should apply equally well to these subtler formulations.

15. The term “abominable conjunction” is from DeRose 1995: 27–28.

16. Note that a sensitivity condition, being only a necessary condition on knowledge, does not itself imply the nonskeptical claim. A skeptic could commit to a sensitivity condition without admitting abominable conjunctions.

17. See Williamson 2000: ch. 7 for a more detailed discussion.

18. This is one of several formulations of safety Sosa offers.

19. Ichikawa 2011 offers a semantics for counterfactuals in which, pace Sosa, sensitivity and safety are equivalent.

20. Suppose S truly believes that p. Then the uniquely nearest possible world in which S believes p is the actual world; by stipulation, p is true in that world. Therefore, if S were to believe that p, p would not be false.

21. Some contemporary contextualists, including Lewis 1996, Schaffer 2004, Blome-Tillmann 2009b, and Ichikawa forthcoming-a, are naturally thought of as endorsing versions of the relevant alternatives theory (where which alternatives are “relevant” for a given use of “knows” depends on the context of utterance). See §13.

22. E.g., Goldman 1967, 1976; Armstrong 1973; Dretske 1981. See also Sturgeon 1993. Kornblith (2008, 7) suggests that the decline in attention for such views is attributable to Goldman’s 1979 shift from his previous position to one in which knowledge requires justification, where the latter is understood as reliability, but questions the motivation for Goldman’s move.

23. For examples of reliabilist approaches to knowledge, see: Armstrong 1973, Dretske 1981, and Nozick 1981.

24. Note that process reliabilism is an example of a view that requires a “causal condition” in a weaker sense: features of the process that caused the belief are important for justification. As the term is used here, “causal theories” require a causal connection between the belief and the truth of the proposition believed.

25. Gaṅgeśa Upādhyāya articulated an early version of the causal theory in the 14th century CE. Phillips & Ramanuja Tatacharya 2004.

26. Dretske’s own information-theoretic account of knowledge, given in ch. 4 of his 1981, is more complicated than Simple K-Reliabilism. Dretske claims (1981: 97) that his view avoids Gettier problems, but this is controversial. For some discussion of what Dretske would say about the barn facades case, see Dretske 2005: 24, note 4.

27. For an example of a reliability condition amended with an eye toward the Gettier problem, see Goldman 1976 and Goldman 1986: 46–7.

28. Scott Sturgeon 1993 made a similar observation, pointing out that any non-conclusive justification will permit Gettier cases. He endorsed an externalist conception of justification that entailed truth, defending a simpler “JB” theory of knowledge.

29. Whether it also entails the third will depend on one’s particular theory of justification. Alternatively, another analysis in this spirit, following the lead of the views discussed in §6, could simply omit the justification condition.

30. This example was first brought to the attention of one of the authors (Jonathan Ichikawa) by Joshua Schechter, who suggested it may be due to Gilbert Harman.

31. For more on distinct notions of epistemic luck, see Pritchard 2005, Steglich-Petersen 2010, and McKinnon 2013.

32. Sosa characterizes the relevant skill in reliabilistic terms; a belief is adroit if and only if it is produced by a mechanism that tends to produce true, rather than false, beliefs. But the AAA model, and the corresponding account of knowledge, does not obviously depend on this reliabilism. One could characterize skill differently, and still define knowledge in terms of skill as Sosa does.

33. This is how Sosa characterizes a particular kind of knowledge, which he calls “animal knowledge”, distinguishing another, more ambitious state of “reflective knowledge”. See Sosa 2007: 24.

34. Alan Millar seems to be defending one or both of these strategies in Pritchard, Millar, & Haddock 2010: 129–30. Greco (2009) seems to be defending the first.

35. Sutton 2007 and Bird 2007 each offer an approach to justification given in terms of knowledge.

36. In favour of something like the knowledge-first stance, see Williamson 2000, Nagel 2013, Miracchi 2015, or Ichikawa forthcoming-a; against, see McGlynn 2014 and many of the essays in Greenough & Pritchard 2009.

37. The term “pragmatic encroachment” was first used by Jon Kvanvig on the Certain Doubts weblog: (“Pragmatic aspects of knowledge?” June 12, 2004)

38. Owens (2000) gives an early defense of pragmatic encroachment; see his 2000: 29 et seq. Note that talk of “sameness of epistemic position” must be understood carefully. There is a sense of course in which knowing that p is part of one’s epistemic position; when we say that Sandra and Daniel are in the same epistemic position, this cannot be the sense that we intend. One might—and some epistemologists do—say that Sandra and Daniel have the same (or equivalent) evidence. This will suffice only if pragmatic encroachment does not extend to evidence as well; it will not if, for example, Williamson (2000) is right that a subject’s evidence consists in one’s knowledge, or if Stanley (2005: 124) is right that encroachment extends to all interesting epistemic notions.

Copyright © 2017 by
Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa <>
Matthias Steup

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free