Notes to The Kochen-Specker Theorem

1. One of the main ideas of Bohmian Mechanics is that position is the only basic observable to which all other observables of orthodox QM can be reduced. So, Bohmian Mechanics will qualify VD as follows: “Not all observables defined in orthodox QM for a physical system are defined in Bohmian Mechanics, but those that are (i.e. only position) do have definite values at all times.” Both this modification of VD and the rejection of NC immediately immunize Bohmian Mechanics against any no HV argument from the Kochen Specker Theorem. See sec.s 10 and 11 of the entry on Bohmian Mechanics for further discussion.

2. Note that if we understand the ‘expectation’ values deriving from the hidden states as what someone knowing such a state should expect as the average measurement result, then this claim is correct only given an assumption of faithful measurement (FM). FM is another typical assumption of a realist (or noncontextualist HV) interpretation of QM. The KS argument can be given without FM, since it makes claims about possessed values, not measured values. Only in statistical arguments, like von Neumann’s and Clifton’s, FM must be assumed. We suppress FM in the main text with the exception of Contextuality (see Section 5.3).

3. See Bell (1966: 4) and Jammer (1974: 274, 304); see also Kochen and Specker (1967: 82/322, theorem 3) for a parallel example and criticism of von Neumann. This criticism of von Neumann’s argument was first raised by Grete Hermann (1935). Einstein is also reported to have made the same criticism (see Shimony 1993: 89).

4. Apart from being positive and normalised (μ(id)=1, id the identity operator), a probability measure in Gleason’s sense must be (countably) additive for families of mutually orthogonal projections. This natural assumption is the analogue of KS’s assumption (3) for compatible observables.

5. According to Bell (1987: 167), Kochen did not know of Gleason’s work at the time.

6. It has been claimed that the theorem’s statement requires a third condition:

(KS2)(c): There exists at least one observable X with v(X) ≠ 0.

[…] Without condition KS2c the theorem is actually false — the trivial valuation where for all observables X one sets v(X) = 0 provides an explicit counter-example.

(See Rajan and Visser 2017, p. 2, in Other Internet Resources.) But this is a mistake. The theorem claims the existence of a valuation such that KS1 and KS2 jointly are contradictory. Arguably, this claim can only be proved by explicit examples. Presenting a valuation such that KS1 and KS2 jointly are compatible (non-contradictory) – i.e., the “trivial valuation” – is itself compatible with the theory’s claim but irrelevant to its proof.

7. See Kochen and Specker (1967: 71–72/310–11).

8. By elementary vector algebra, viz.: a·b=|a| |b| cos φ, where a·b is the inner product of vectors a and b and φ is the angle between them.

9. Both arguments, i.e., von Neumann’s and Clifton’s, presuppose faithful measurement (FM) (see also fn 1). Indeed, an eventual failure of FM would be the natural way to explain why a certain constraint on possessed values does not show up in the measurement statistics.

10. A state of a spin-1 particle where prob(v(Sx2)=0)=1 is |Sx=0>. Expanding this state in the eigenvectors of Sx yields

|Sx=0> =
cos φ (1 + sin2 φ) −½ |Sx = 0> + sin φ (1 + sin2 φ) −½ (|Sx = −1> − |Sx = +1>)

Now, with cos φ=1/3, we get:

prob(v(Sx2) = 0) = prob(v(Sx) = 0)
  = (cos φ)2 / (1 + sin2 φ)
  = 1/9 (1 + 8/9)−1
  = 1/17

11. See Redhead (1987: 121). See also Kochen and Specker (1967: 64/299, eq. 4) and Fine and Teller (1978: 631) where the principle appears under the name “functional relation condition”.

12. The argument here is due to Redhead (1987: 132). Redhead himself suggests that there is an internal tension in his argument. He remarks that STAT FUNC, as derived from the QM formalism, is a statement about (probabilities for) measured values, (see his remark that when QM → STAT FUNC, the latter is “understood in terms of the statistics of measurement results”, p. 132), while FUNC talks about “the possessed values of the observables” (p. 121, my italics). This distinction seems to devaluate Redhead’s reasoning to some extent. If there is a real difference between possessed values and measured values and no explicit assumption equating both types of values is made, then STAT FUNC (version 1) derivable from FUNC talks about a statistical relation among functions of possessed values, while STAT FUNC (version 2) is derived from QM, hence by definition talks about the statistics of measured values. The two versions initially are entirely unconnected and FUNC → STAT FUNC (version 1) cannot lend plausibility to STAT FUNC (version 1). Now, don’t we have good reason to carefully distinguish measured and possessed values in QM?

Fortunately, no such distinction is really necessary. First, distinguish a strong sense of possessed values where possessed value are values a system possesses independently from being measured and a weak sense of possessed values where possessed values are possessed simpliciter, i.e. the system just has them, perhaps as a result of measurement, perhaps not. Second, consider the hedge phrase of a system ‘displaying a value’ as a result of a measurement. It is minimally a phrase like this which must go into the description of the events for which the Statistical Algorithm yields probabilities. But the hedge phrase is actually superfluous. Physical systems do not display anything unless they have it. Accordingly, if a system displays a value upon measurement, then it possesses this value (in the weak sense). By contrast, if a system displays a value upon measurement and measurement is faithful, then it possesses that value independently of measurement (thus, possessed it in the strong sense). (See the main text below, § 5.3, for more on faithful measurement; see also Redhead, p. 131 after eq. (11), for the connection between faithful measurement and possessed values.) Now, the weak sense of possessing a value is fully sufficient to formulate FUNC and Redhead’s plausibility argument for STAT FUNC remains untouched. (Indeed, the derivation FUNC → STAT FUNC itself uses the Statistical Algorithm, which would be an illegitimate procedure if the latter did not refer to probabilities for possessed values, in some sense.)

13. It is not exactly true that the QM formalism prescribes any observable to have a value. In fact, the formalism itself is entirely silent about values, apart from the statistical predictions it entails via the statistical algorithm (see Redhead 1987: 8). But a crucial assumption of orthodox interpretations is the eigenstate-eigenvalue link (see Fine 1973: 20): Observable A on a system has value ak iff the system is in state |ak>. The only if direction of this principle which leads to a minimum of value ascriptions is endorsed in van Fraassen’s original version of the modal interpretation (this direction is equivalent to the Eigenvector Rule in Redhead 1987: 73, 120) while it denies the if direction, which prevents that more than a minimum of values are ascribed to a system.

14. This is Redhead’s (1987: 135–36) construal of a proposal by Fine (1974).

15. See Fine and Teller (1978: 636), Redhead (1987: 138) and references therein.

16. What we mean here is the following. A definition of observable f(A) (or observable A + B, or observable A·B, both constructed from observables A and B) would be that it is an observable which takes a value calculated by measuring v(A) (or measuring v(A) and v(B)) and applying f to the result (or calculating v(A) + v(B), or calculating v(Av(B)). FUNC, the Sum Rule and the Product Rule, as restricted to one measurement context, trivially repeat these definitions, and there obviously is no point in testing, e.g., whether v(A·B) really equals v(Av(B), if the former expression is defined by the latter.

17. The proviso ‘in a sense’ comes from the fact that a colourable subset of the set of observables corresponding to all directions in R3, since it is a proper subset of the latter, is not itself continuous in the intuitive sense. We can, however, define a probability function from such a colourable subset into [0, 1] which obeys the usual continuity definition of elementary calculus.

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