Notes to The Language of Thought Hypothesis

1. Fodor (1987: 16) calls the conjunction of (1) and (2) the representational theory of mind (RTM). However, it seems better to reserve that name for the more general view that mental representations exist. One can accept the general view while rejecting (1) and (2). For example, one can say that mental representations figure in subpersonal perceptual activity but deny that they figure in thought.

2. Fodor and Pylyshyn (2015: 28) claim that pictures have parts but not constituents. They argue on that basis against imagistic theories of thought.

3. Hume analyzed complex ideas in associationist terms: a complex idea arises when associative bonds form between simple ideas. In his words:

’tis impossible the same simple ideas should fall regularly into complex ones… without some bond of union among them, some associating quality, by which one idea naturally introduces another. (1739 [1978] I.i.4)

As Fodor (2003: 93) emphasizes, Hume conflated complex ideas with causal sequences of ideas. For example, there is a fundamental difference between your belief that John is tall and a causal sequence during which you think about John and then as a result think about tallness. Your belief is evaluable as true or false. The causal sequence is not; it expresses no truth-evaluable content. Associative bonds between simple ideas can give rise to causal sequences of ideas, but they cannot on their own give rise to truth-evaluable mental states. In particular, the capacity to form associative bonds does not explain the capacity for predication (e.g. the capacity to predicate tallness of John). Thus, the associationist approach seems unable to explain the compositional mechanisms instantiated by human thought. The basic point here goes back to Kant (1781 [1998]). For further discussion, see the entry on associationist theories of thought.

4. Fodor (1975: 174–194) advances some Wittgenstein-inspired objections to imagistic theories of thought. He claims that a picture on its own does not express any truth-evaluable content. For example, a picture of a man climbing up a hill could just as well be a picture of a man sliding down a hill. Based on such examples, Fodor urges that “[p]ictures aren’t the kind of things that can have truth-values” (1975: 181). Only when we supplement a picture with additional descriptive information (e.g. the man is climbing rather than sliding) does it become truth-evaluable. Since propositional attitudes are truth-evaluable, Fodor concludes that mental pictures/images could not serve as the direct objects of propositional attitudes. The thesis that pictures taken on their own are not truth-evaluable is also present in Frege (1918 [1997: 326–327]). In more recent literature, it is widely disputed (Burge 2018; Greenberg 2013).

5. Gibson (1979) insists that perceptual psychology should abjure mental representations. He advances a non-representationalist framework for the scientific study of perception. Fodor and Pylyshyn (1981) argue convincingly that Gibson’s non-representational framework fails to explain very basic phenomena, such as perceptual illusions, that are readily explicable on a representational approach.

6. Let SEM1 be the thesis that some transitions between computational states are sensitive to semantic properties. SEM1 concerns computational dynamics. It should be distinguished from doctrines that concern computational individuation. Let SEM2 be the thesis that semantic properties inform the individuation of some computational states. For example, one might hold that certain mental computations are implemented only by physical systems with appropriate semantic properties. Let SEM3 be the thesis that semantic properties inform the individuation of all computational states. SEM3 entails SEM2, but not vice-versa: one might hold that some computations are individuated semantically (SEM2) and that others are individuated in a purely syntactic fashion (¬SEM3). Rescorla (2014b) defends SEM2 + ¬SEM3. Shagrir (forthcoming) defends SEM3. Piccinini (2008) defends ¬SEM2. SEM1 is compatible with SEM3 and with SEM2 + ¬SEM3. However, neither SEM2 nor SEM3 entails SEM1: one might hold that semantic properties bear upon the nature of computational states, and hence play an individuative role (SEM3), but that computational transitions are not sensitive to semantic properties (¬SEM1). Fodor (1981: 226–227; 1998: 9–11) advocates ¬SEM1 + SEM3. In the main text, the phrase “semantic conception of computation” is used for SEM1. That phrase and similar phrases are sometimes instead used for SEM2 or SEM3.

7. In later work, Fodor distinguishes between “innate” and “unlearned” (2008: 144–145).

8. Some memorable passages in Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations (1953: §§243–271) contain what is known as the private language argument. In these passages, Wittgenstein considers and rejects the possibility of a private language:

The words of this language are to refer to what can be known only to the speaker; to his immediate, private, sensations. So another cannot understand the language. (§243)

For several decades, the private language argument was regarded by some philosophers as a devastating refutation of the very idea of a mental language. From a contemporary vantage point, it is unclear what argument if any Wittgenstein intended, or whether any cogent argument can be extracted from what Wittgenstein says. Wittgenstein’s discussion certainly poses little evident threat to LOTH (Fodor, 1975: 68–73). A private language as defined by Wittgenstein differs fundamentally from the mental language as postulated by LOT theorists from the medieval era to the present day. Words in a private language denote only the speaker’s “immediate, private sensations”. Mentalese words can denote anything that natural language words can denote: dogs, cities, quarks, numbers, etc. In denying the possibility of a private language, Wittgenstein does not engage with LOTH.

9. The problem is a version of Quine’s (1951 [1980]) celebrated attack upon the analytic/synthetic distinction. A version of the problem also arises for molecular versions of functional role semantics (Fodor 1990: ix–xi).

10. One might hold that, in some cases, a Mentalese word has certain aspects of its meaning essentially but does not have its denotation essentially. Consider Mentalese indexicals. One might posit a Mentalese indexical here that necessarily refers to the thinker’s present location. On this view, here does not have its denotation essentially. The location denoted by here changes as the thinker moves through space. Nevertheless, here has a kind of meaning essentially. It expresses a fixed character, in Kaplan’s (1989) sense.

11. Prompted by Frege cases, Fodor (1994) recruits Mentalese words to serve as modes of presentation. He individuates the words in formal syntactic fashion. Fodor’s approach differs significantly from Frege’s, because it flouts the Fregean doctrine that “sense determines reference”. Semantically permeated individuation is closer in spirit to Frege’s approach, since it takes the Mentalese word to determine a unique denotation.

Copyright © 2019 by
Michael Rescorla <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free