Notes to Latinx Philosophy

1. Except when referring to texts or views that explicitly invoke other terms, this essay follows the relatively recently emerged convention of using Latinxs to refer to those people that have sometimes been identified as Latina/os or Latin@s. Latinxs are typically, but not invariably, understood as a Latin American-descended population within the United States, where this is oftentimes distinguished from populations residing in Latin America. The chief advantage of the current neologism is that it implies no particular gender, which avoids the gender binary embedded in Latinate languages. The ostensibly gender-neutral term in Spanish—latino—is by convention an inclusive but recognizably masculine term, whereas latina is exclusively used for feminine subjects. The usage of “Latinx” remains a contested matter, but it is arguably the preferred term in current academic discourse.

2. For discussion and critique of these and related views, see essays in Gracia & de Greiff (eds) 2000; Gracia (ed.) 2007; Blum 2009; Gracia (ed.) 2011; and Jaksić (ed.) 2015.

3. Accounts of Latinx identity are concerned with categorical questions (inasmuch as such accounts concern the nature of the category “Latinx”) and with substantive questions (inasmuch as they take up relatively first-order questions about social ontology, how ethnic terms are to be understood, and so on). Categorical questions about Latinxs (and other groups, for that matter) are recognizably substantive philosophical questions in their own right. Nothing here is intended to suggest otherwise.

4. As others have noted (e.g., Soldatenko 1996), it both accurate and instructive to use the gendered name of the movement, in part because it helps differentiate it from later Chicana/Xicana developments.

5. The evidential base for Soldatenko’s claim (1996: 182) about Chicano Studies syllabi between 1968–1975 is never provided, so the extent to which his sample was representative of Chicano Studies syllabi is unclear.

6. The afterword is intriguing in its own right. It acknowledges a neglect of philosophy and the humanities among Chicanxs (Carranza 1978: 129), and maintains the need for a philosophical account of the Chicano worldview. In particular, Carranza identifies the urgency of articulating the character and basis of the often-inchoate sense among Chicanxs and others of the moral wrongfulness of discriminating against, as well as ignoring, exploiting, and manipulating Chicanxs (1978: 131). These themes were to have been taken up in a further book on the philosophy of Chicanismo (“well on its way to completion”), entitled Chicanismo As a World View (1978: 129). This latter work seems to have remained unpublished.

7. Indeed, this is a general concern about the term “Latinx”. For discussion, see Mendieta (2011: 518).

8. On a conception of Latinx philosophy as the philosophical work of an ethnic group that includes both Latin Americans and US Latinxs (as in Gracia’s 2008 account), then the origins of Latinx philosophy can straightforwardly be found in the origins of Latin American philosophy. But see §3, below, for reasons to resist this way of thinking about Latinx philosophy.

9. Some of these strands could be understood as constituting a distinctive metaphilosophical critique of the philosophical modernity, the role of Europe, and what alternatives look like for how we understand and pursue philosophy. For some of these themes, see Mendieta 2016.

10. See also connection to Caribbean philosophical thought, e.g., Henry 2000.

11. The discipline of philosophy does not have an uncomplicated history with feminist scholarship. Anecdotally, it has not been uncommon for scholars with PhDs in philosophy and interests in feminism to take their primary academic appointments outside of philosophy. Perhaps as a consequence, feminist philosophers—and maybe Latina feminists in particular—have oftentimes been in conversation with the work of figures in philosophy-adjacent disciplines, including political science (Barvosa 2008) and theology (e.g., Isasi-Díaz, whose work is taken up in Isasi-Díaz and Mendieta 2012 and Gallegos de Castillo 2016).

12. See also the important essays in Moraga and Anzaldúa 1981.

13. For a detailed overview, see Ortega (2015).

14. Particularly significant was a 2013 conference, entitled “Latino/a Philosopher: A National Symposium”. Organized by Eduardo Mendieta—and notably, with some financial support from the American Philosophical Association—the conference brought together a number of junior and senior US Latinx philosophers. The conference both reflected and spurred new discourse around the idea of a field or subject matter of specifically Latino/a philosophy. A striking feature of the conference was that it reflected a wide range of philosophical orientations and preoccupations, especially in comparison to most topic-focused conferences. Historical, analytic, Continental, and Latina feminist approaches were all prominently represented. Also notable was that nearly all the participants had working familiarity with the history of Latin American philosophy, and many had a substantial research footprint in it. In addition to a variety of other more topic-specific conferences within Latinx philosophy (e.g., conferences on immigration and border issues, on Mexican American Philosophy, and so on), there have been subsequent national conferences on Latinx philosophy.

15. Latin Americans can become Latinx in virtue of living in the United States or in other places where Latinx is a recognizable social identity.

16. Interestingly, there is a way of reading Gracia’s (2008) view as compatible with (if not entailing) the following more radical claim: what philosophy is, is settled internal to the standards of an ethnos (see, for example, his remarks about the potential status of the Popul Vuh (2008: 142)). He allows that the Popul Vuh may be an instance of Latino philosophy without it being an instance of non-ethnic, “scientific, universalist philosophy” (2008: 144). If that’s the view, then both Latinx and philosophy end up being terms whose referents are properly settled by the attitudes or standards of the ethnic group.

17. One is tempted to turn Gracia’s contextualist impulse on its head: local standards for “Latinx” (here and now) reserve the term for people who are not residing in Latin America, so internal to a contextualist account of standard of Latinx philosophy, we should not accept Gracia’s picture of Latinx philosophy.

18. For discussion, see González and Stigol 2013; for works that take up aspects of this problem in different ways, see Casanova 1999 [2004]; Ezcurdia 2003; and Rodriguez-Pereyra 2013.

19. Gracia explicitly acknowledges the reforming or revisionist character of his proposal in Gracia (2013).

20. One interesting alternative conception of Latino/a philosophy is given by Millán and Deere (2017), according to which it is “a mode of philosophy that emerges from the practices and experiences of Latina/os writing and thinking within the United States”. I take it that the natural way to read this is as a source-based account, but the account does not actually specify whether the referred to “mode of philosophy” must be produced by Latinxs or whether—once it emerges from Latin practices, experiences, writing, and thinking—it can be done by non-Latinxs. Similarly, Mendieta notes the development of a “filosofía latina” o de los “latinos”. [Latinx philosophy, or a philosophy of Latinxs.] (2011: 519). Mendieta goes on to use the term in a way that suggests he is thinking of the term in a source-based way, although the operative notion is not specified.

21. In actual use within California, “Mexican” is oftentimes indiscriminately extended to anyone of Latin American descent, even when not of any Mexican descent. In these latter cases, those so referred to tend to regard this appellation as erroneous.

22. Gracia and Schutte were born in Cuba, Lugones in Argentina, Alcoff in Panama, and Mendieta in Colombia. See also the discussion in Mendieta 2011: 519.

23. For example, the most comprehensive recent Spanish-language reference work on Latin American philosophy identifies itself as also covering Latino thought (see Dussel, et al. 2011).

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