Notes to Law and Language

1. John Rawls wrote that ‘notions of meaning and analyticity play no essential role in moral theory as I conceive of it’ (Rawls 1999, xx). On the notion that legal philosophers are political philosophers, see Edmundson 2014.

2. This point is actually more complicated than I have said, because a written constitution may itself be created by the linguistic act of a law-making authority that already has legal power in the system. But the complication does not matter.

3. This general premise can be restated to apply to any use of language with the effect of creating or changing legal relations, such as the making of a contract or a will; the phrase ‘law maker’ in the text below can be understood widely to apply to persons or agencies that use language to make contracts (and so on) as well as to legislatures.

4. Here is one illustration of such a qualification: suppose that the general criminal law provides a defence of necessity, and a legislature creates a new criminal offence; then the law made by the legislature’s communicative act is subject to a defence of necessity, even if the legislature said nothing about such a defence.

5. Assuming that the tire is well manufactured. A more complete statement of the first premise that the argument requires could be made by describing the condition of a tire that is not bald.

Copyright © 2016 by
Timothy Endicott <>

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