Notes to The Limits of Law

1. Both Hart and Alexander would surely not deny the point made in the text, viz. that wrongdoing or immorality, for the legal moralist, makes for a prima facie or pro tanto ground, rather than a conclusive one. But, as stated in the text, no formulation of the position should omit this as it is central to the legal moralism of Devlin, Moore, and others.

2. Both Devlin and Hart use the term “prima facie”, rather than “pro tanto”, which is more normally used today (e.g., Tadros 2016a: 100). Pro tanto is preferred today for the term prima facie can be ambiguous. “Prima facie” is sometimes used to mean: “on the face of it”, or “on initial appearances”, or some such. This implies that the aspect of a situation that grounded the right or obligation or whatever, may turn out on fuller inspection to be illusory. But this is not what Devlin or Hart had in mind, so this meaning must be put to one side. The other meaning—that which is now more commonly associated with the term pro tanto—in no way implies that the immorality that grounds the right or whatever may turn out to have been a mirage. What may happen instead is that it may be defeated when all things are considered. There is an obligation or right etc “inasmuch as there is this or that aspect of the situation, but … suspending the all-in verdict.” (Blackburn 1994: 301). Hence, if one were to say on this view queue jumping is wrongful but should not be criminal because not sufficiently serious, too expensive to enforce, intrusive in people’s everyday lives etc, the immorality turns out not to have sufficient strength to be made criminal, but the wrongness subsists—it was no illusion.

3. But see Tadros (2016a: 91–134), for a largely sceptical exploration of all principles of the sort, be they from proponents of the harm principle, legal moralists or others.

4. Bowers v. Hardwick, 478 U.S 186 (1986), in which a Georgia law against sodomy was upheld by the U.S Supreme Court. The Supreme Court subsequently overturned the decision in Lawrence v Texas, 539 U.S. 558 (2003).

5. In 1967 the Sexual Offences Act was passed by the UK Parliament, decriminalizing (for England and Wales) adult homosexual conduct in private. This followed a decade of debate—notably including Hart and Devlin—over the government-commissioned Wolfenden Report (1957), which recommended decriminalization. It is not widely appreciated in the literature that two years before the 1967 Act became law—also the year of publication of Devlin’s Enforcement of Morals—Devlin publicly joined with a group of other law lords to urge Parliament to implement Wolfenden and decriminalize (Devlin, Birmingham et al. 1965). In the Enforcement of Morals itself, Devlin officially declines to state a view on the decriminalization of homosexuality, though he hints at his view in favour, as he confirms in the Preface (Devlin 1965: ix—see the paragraph ending with the words; “and that is the point of the paragraph”; see also Sackar 2020: 203–209). But with the occasional exception (e.g., Moffat 2005) it is widely and erroneously held in the literature that Devlin actively opposed decriminalization. Thus, Leslie Green and Brian Leiter take it that Devlin opposed as a matter of policy the decriminalization of consensual gay sex (Green & Leiter 2005). Wendy Donner thought, for Devlin, criminalization of homosexuality was “required” (Donner 2008: 157); Martha Nussbaum in two monographs speaks of Devlin’s “most famous recommendation”, namely “the prohibition of consensual homosexual acts” (Nussbaum 2004: 351) and asserts that Devlin “strongly opposed” the Wolfenden Commission’s proposal “to decriminalize consensual same-sex sexual acts” (Nussbaum 2010: xiii); according to Chad Flanders, Devlin “would not in the end adopt the point of view of the Wolfenden Report” (Flanders 2016: 49). Vincent Chiao speaks of the “acts of [sexual deviance] Devlin would have us consider criminal” (Chiao 2019: 169). And Gerald Dworkin—sympathetic enough to Devlin’s wider argument to write a paper entitled “Devlin was Right”—regrets that, on the policy question, Devlin opposed the implementation of Wolfenden, adding:

I side with Hart, against Devlin, in believing that the conduct in question (i.e., homosexual sex) should not be criminalized. (G. Dworkin 1999: 928)

But on that question Devlin sided with Hart too! None of the above authors appear aware of Devlin’s 1965 public advocacy of decriminalization. Robert Moffat, who was aware of it, assumes Devlin changed his mind on the question, an assumption that is contradicted by Devlin himself in his private correspondence (Moffat 2005: 1107; Sackar 2020: 203, 209). In short, Devlin’s view (whatever one thinks of it) was that the criminal law should tolerate gay sex in private, not—as is widely thought—that it should not tolerate it. On toleration in this and other contexts, see Green 2008.

. And see further s2.2 and 3 in the main text.

6. It is nevertheless interesting to note how demanding a test Devlin appeared to think this was. For the beliefs about homosexuality that he is assuming are those of Britain in the late 1950s. It is interesting to compare what we can surmise about those beliefs with the corresponding beliefs in Britain today. Authoritative twenty-first century opinion, in the shape of the publication British Social Attitudes, suggests around two thirds—and the figure continues to rise—of the British population believes homosexuality is not morally wrong at all (Curtice et al. 2019: 9). There were no such figures from 1959, but as late as 1983, nearly a quarter of a century after Devlin was writing, the figure had only just passed one sixth of the population—a paltry 17% of the population thought gay sex not morally “wrong at all”. Had there been a 1959 figure, then, it would probably have been in single figures. Despite this, Devlin did not consider the late 1950s/early 1960s moral beliefs widespread or intense enough to put consensual homosexual sex beyond toleration (Devlin, Birmingham, et al. 1965). By contrast, as stated in the text, he did think such beliefs widespread and intense enough in relation to animal cruelty.

7. “Negative liberty is the absence of obstacles, barriers or constraints. One has negative liberty to the extent that actions are available to one in this negative sense. Positive liberty is the possibility of acting— or the fact of acting—in such a way as to take control of one’s life and realize one’s fundamental purposes.” (Carter 2019).

8. Devlin did not seem to realize that the educated elite espousing “rationalist morality” could raise the question of whether there can be moral expertise (Ryle 1958; McGrath 2019). He does not then consider a range of possible ways his concern with the ordinary jury member as decision maker could be accommodated, for example, as in potential reflective equilibrium with the standards identified by the “rationalists”.

9. But see Lukes and Devyani 2012, who argue that a related argument by Emile Durkheim, criticized by Hart together with his critique of Devlin, can be understood and defended as an empirical thesis, at least in part.

10. As far as natural law theories are concerned, they are not always easy to categorize as legal moralist theories or versions of the harm principle. John Finnis, for example, claims that Aquinas argued for a principle that was not “readily distinguishable” from Mill’s harm principle (Finnis 1998: 228). Finnis also reads Aquinas as asserting that

those vices of disposition and conduct which have no sufficient relationship, direct or indirect to justice and peace are not concerns of government or law. (Finnis 1998: 228)

There are also, of course, divine command theories. As we have seen Devlin simply assumed, without argument, impartiality in matters of religion. Robert Adams, a leading exponent of divine command theory, supports something close to Raz’s version of the harm principle—which we examine below (Adams 1999: 318–350).

11. Raz allows that some offensive behaviour can be by its nature harmful and therefore a candidate for coercion on that basis, but he disallows offence as an independently valid ground. Judith Thomson suggests that Feinberg might be better off taking a similar line (Thomson 1986). Simester and Von Hirsch have argued, like Feinberg, for the independent validity of the offence principle, but suggest significant changes to Feinberg’s position (Simester and Von Hirsch, 2002).

12. “Pennant makes Birmingham comeback”, BBC Sport, published 2 April 2005. [Reprint available online].

13. Devlin is at his most instrumentalist in the following passage:

The arm of the law is an instrument to be used by society, and the decision about what particular cases it should be used in is essentially a practical one. Since it is an instrument, it is wise before deciding to use it to have regard to the tools with which it can be fitted and to the machinery which operates it. (Devlin 1965: 20)

Copyright © 2022 by
John Stanton-Ife <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free