Notes to Legal Interpretation

1. E.g., Fallon 2015, 1299; Marmor 2005, 118, 121; Patterson 1996, 86–88. See Greenawalt 2004, 269. Proponents of this idea may fail adequately to distinguish the pragmatic from the semantic: the fact that people might not typically say that interpretation is required in easy cases may reflect pragmatic considerations rather than what interpretation is.

2. When writers talk about what legal interpretation seeks, they are often best understood as addressing the less fundamental question of which substantive method of legal interpretation is correct. See, for example, Scalia 1997, 16; Alexander and Prakash 2004, 991; Nelson 2005, 348, 351–57; Whittington 2010, 120, 121 fn. 3; Alexander 2013, 540; Soames 2013, 597; Fallon 2015, 1279, 1297; Barak 2005, 8–9.

3. Similarly, after making their often quoted claim that “American courts have no intelligible, generally accepted, and consistently applied theory of statutory interpretation,” Hart and Sacks suggested that “the most that could be hoped for” a theory is that, in addition to being founded in experience and good practice, “it will be well calculated to serve the ultimate purposes of law” (1994, 1169). For more examples of arguments used to evaluate and defend theories of interpretation, see section 5.

4. Scott Soames emphasizes a distinction between the meaning of the statutory text and the content of the statute. But Soames uses “meaning” for semantic content and equates “the content of a statute” with its total linguistic content (Soames 2009, 403). Because Soames takes for granted that legal interpretation seeks the total linguistic content of a statute, he is another example of a theorist who assumes that legal interpretation debates concern the linguistic meaning of legal texts.

5. See section 4.2 for discussion of the basic distinction between semantic content and pragmatically conveyed content. This chapter uses “linguistic content” to encompass both semantic and pragmatic content.

6. To make matters more complicated, theorists sometimes use the term “legal meaning”. See Berman 2009, 18 n.39, 38 n.100; 2011, 409; Berman and Toh 2013, 547–50; Fallon 2015; 2019, 43–50; Solum 2008, 65, 110–11; Balkin 2007, 304; Barak 2005, 6–7. This term could naturally be used to refer to a word’s or phrase’s technical legal sense. But when theorists of legal interpretation write of “legal meaning” they typically do not use the term in this way. In some cases, they probably use “legal meaning” to refer to a provision’s contribution to the content of the law, though they may not be completely clear about the distinction between a provision’s contribution and its linguistic meaning. Under this usage, “legal meaning” is not a kind of linguistic meaning or even symbolic meaning at all. Other writers may presuppose that some kind of linguistic meaning is the kind that the law cares about and intend to use “legal meaning” to pick out that kind. Still others may have some awareness that a statute’s contribution is not a kind of linguistic meaning but think it is some other special kind of meaning. The term “legal meaning” is probably best avoided because it breeds confusion (see Berman and Toh 2013, 549–50 & n.23; Greenberg 2014, 1296–1297, fn. 18–19).

7. Fallon 2015 assumes without argument that the different items that competing theories of legal interpretation seek are all kinds of linguistic meaning. Similarly, Rickless 2005 takes for granted that legal interpretation seeks some kind of linguistic meaning and argues that the relevant kind of linguistic meaning varies.

8. Even the assumption that what is being interpreted in the case of legal interpretation is a linguistic text is overly simplistic. When we interpret a statute, say, what is being interpreted is (at least) the legislature’s enactment of a particular text, not merely the text itself.

9. See, e.g., Lawson 2017, 2155–62; Rickless 2005, 521. A related idea is the common positivist criticism of Ronald Dworkin that he confuses adjudication with ascertaining the content of the law.

10. Primus 2008 argues that different methods of constitutional interpretation – “sources of constitutional authority” – serve different constitutional values and therefore should be used in different kinds of cases.

11. For examples of this trend in originalist and textualist writings, see the discussion in the text below. More generally, see Berman and Toh 2013; Berman 2018; Baude and Sachs 2017; 2019; Barzun 2017; Greenberg 2017a.

12. Larry Solum (2010), however, cannot be understood in this way: he carefully distinguishes linguistic meaning from the content of the law and explicitly urges the use of the term constitutional interpretation for ascertaining the former and constitutional construction for ascertaining the latter (see Berman and Toh 2013; Greenberg 2016 7–8 & n.6).

13. On the use of “textualism” as a term for a method of constitutional as well as statutory interpretation, see section 4.2.

14. For a useful classificatory scheme for different types of originalism, see Berman 2009.

15. Molot (2006, 65) cites Eskridge and Frickey (1990, 321) for the divide “between the ‘grand’ theory that pervades academic writing and the ‘eclectic’ approach that dominates the work of practicing lawyers.”

16. Posner earlier advocated a specific form of intentionalism that appeals to what the legislature would have intended had it considered the relevant issue (Posner 1986). See below, section 4.1.3.

17. See, e.g., Radin 1930, 870–72; Brest 1980, 214–22, 230–31; Moore 1981, 246–70; Easterbrook 1983, 547–48; 1988, 62–66; 1994, 68; Dworkin 1985, 162–64; 1986, 317–21; Hurd 1990, 969–976; Waldron 1995, 645–56; Manning 2003, 2408–19; Solum 2008, 14–15; Scalia and Garner 2012, 391–96.

18. On the distinction between semantic content and pragmatically conveyed content, see section 4.2.

19. At best, legal intentions may be highly indirect and unreliable evidence of communicative intentions, which, as noted, themselves have an important bearing on speaker meaning.

20. See, for example, Knapp and Michaels 1982; 1983; 2005; Campos 1993; Alexander and Prakash 2004, 974–78; Alexander 2011; 2013, 539–40; Fish 2005; 2008; Goldsworthy 2005; Nino Graglia 1992; Richard Kay 1988; 1989; see also Whittington 1999, 177–179.

21. Even if word meaning could ultimately be reduced to speaker meaning, as Paul Grice (1968) famously argued, it would not follow that words mean whatever a speaker on a given occasion intends them to mean or whatever a speaker means in uttering the words. See entry on Paul Grice.

22. A few theorists, influenced by philosophy of language and linguistics, have argued that legal interpretation must seek the total pragmatically conveyed content of the legal texts because that is what linguistic interpretation normally seeks (Neale 2008; Soames 2009; Ekins 2012; 2017; Alexander 2011). Because of the central role of the speaker’s communicative intentions in determining pragmatically conveyed content, the resulting position is very similar to that discussed in the text. The position suffers from the problem described in the text; it attempts to move without argument from claims about linguistic interpretation to claims about legal interpretation. This is another example of intentionalism motivated by appeal to a proper understanding of language.

23. Textualism is often used specifically for a position on statutory rather than constitutional interpretation. But there is a corresponding position with respect to constitutional interpretation, and I will generally discuss them together. In principle, textualism is distinguishable from originalism because one could focus on the text without privileging its original meaning. In practice, textualists care about original meaning rather than what the words mean or would be taken to mean at a later time, so constitutional textualism is in practice a form of originalism that claims that the relevant original aspect of a constitutional provision is its original meaning. See Scalia 1997, 37–38. The “new originalists” are one prominent camp that emphasizes “original public meaning.” See sections 3 & 4.2.

24. This chapter will use the term “semantic content” in the standard way. Unfortunately, but understandably, legal theorists use the term differently. For example, John Manning (2006) seems to use “semantic content” or “semantic meaning” for some form of pragmatically conveyed content (see also Berman and Toh 2013, 548; 562). Readers in this area must be wary of this difference in usage given that “semantic content” in philosophical usage is standardly opposed to pragmatically conveyed content. One complication that can be set aside here is that there is a further distinction between standing word meaning and semantic content. According to a common view, for example, the speaker’s semantic intentions determine such matters as the sense of ambiguous expressions and the referent of demonstratives, thereby yielding semantic content.

25. Semantic content does not depend on communicative intentions at all, though it depends on semantic intentions, e.g., about which word to use (see previous note). For discussion of context sensitivity, see Greenberg 2020, 117–121.

26. Of course, what speakers can intend to communicate will depend on what they believe the intended audience will be able to recognize in the context. Unless you are crazy or there is a special background, you can’t use words that mean “the cat is on the mat,” intending to communicate that Sherlock Holmes lives on Baker Street.

27. Scalia mischaracterizes what the example shows. See below. For another example of reliance on the model of ordinary communication, see Manning 2001, 111–112 n.434.

28. On the other hand, they also endorse the use of canons of interpretation and interpretive practices and conventions that are not ways of ascertaining linguistic meaning of any sort. E.g., Manning 2003, 2466–67, 2470. Scalia 1997, 27–28; 2012.

29. Textualists and non-textualists often quote Justice Scalia on objectified intentions as if Scalia were endorsing the position, though it is unclear that he means to do so: “We look for a sort of ‘objectified’ intent – the intent that a reasonable person would gather from the text of the law, placed alongside the remainder of the corpus juris.” See, e.g., Barnett 1999, 620–21; Richard Fallon 2015, 1275; John Manning 2006, 79; Alexander and Prakash 2004, text accompanying note 5). Because contemporary purposivism and textualism are best understood as appealing to constructed content – “objectified intentions” – there is an important question how they differ (see Molot 2006; Manning 2006). As suggested in the text, while theorists are not always consistent and do not explicitly recognize the relevant distinctions, purposivists tend to appeal to legal or policy intentions, while textualism may be best reconstructed as appealing to communicative intentions. According to John Manning (2006, 91): “Textualists give primacy to the semantic context – evidence about the way a reasonable person conversant with relevant social and linguistic practices would have used the words. Purposivists give precedence to policy context – evidence that goes to the way a reasonable person conversant with the circumstances underlying enactment would suppress the mischief and advance the remedy.”

30. See note 22 above.

31. Much less common is an argument that a particular method of interpretation is required by substantive legal standards. See, e.g., Baude and Sachs, 2017; 2018.

32. For qualifications, see section 5.2.

33. Legal facts are relative to a legal system and a time, but for brevity I omit these qualifications.

34. The term “determine” is ambiguous between a metaphysical sense and an epistemic sense. In the metaphysical sense, to determine the content of the law is to make the content of the law what it is. In the epistemic sense, to determine the content of the law is to ascertain or figure out what the content of law is. To avoid confusion, I will use the term determine (determination, determinant, and so on) exclusively in the metaphysical sense.

35. To say that the content of the law is determined in a particular way at the most fundamental level is to say that the content of the law is determined in that way and that it is not the case that it is determined in that way because of some further determinant. Jurisprudential theories like those of Hart and Dworkin offer accounts of how the content of the law is determined at the fundamental level.

36. For more detail, see Greenberg, 2006, 271–73.

37. Or that there is a chain of criteria of validity leading back to the rule of recognition. This refinement will not affect the argument, so I will set it aside for the most part.

38. For expository purposes, this section simplifies by assuming that the correct theory of legal interpretation is simply one that treats legal sources as contributing to the content of the law in the way that they in fact contribute to the content of the law. As discussed in section 5.2, this assumption requires qualification.

39. For fuller discussion, see Greenberg 2017a, 114–17.

40. This family of theories has recently attracted a great deal of interest. For discussion and citations, see Greenberg 2017b.

41. Evidentiary considerations may be relevant here as well. For example, given the biases and tendencies of judges, they may do a better job of accurately identifying a provision’s contribution to the content of the law if they do not consider certain kinds of evidence.

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Mark Greenberg <>

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