Supplement to Legal Rights

Extensional Adequacy of Theories of Rights

A. Challenges to The Will Theory of Rights

Descriptively, the will theory does not capture various types of widely recognized legal rights (Hart 1982: 188–193). For instance, it has difficulty accounting for the rights of entities that altogether lack a will or the capacity to choose in the relevant sense. Obvious examples include the rights of infants and animals. The will theory also does not straightforwardly account for the rights of entities lacking the competency to exercise their will, such as young children, seriously inebriated or incapacitated people, people with dementia, or the dead (MacCormick 1982: 154–66; Kramer 1998: 69–70; 2001: 47–57).

Another shortcoming of the will theory is its myopia to legal rights considered unwaivable. For instance, paternalistic (claim-)rights to minimum wage, the right to a fair trial, and rights against serious assault, torture, or enslavement. The same is true of unwaivable immunities, such as the inability to waive the legal disability of others to transform one’s legal status into that of a slave (MacCormick 1977: 196–9; Kamm 2002: 482). In response, following Kant, arguably the will theory allows for unwaivable rights when waiver undercuts the same will the right is designed to further (Ripstein 2009: 133–143).

Possibly, the will theory also does not account for claim-rights correlative with duties which are civilly and criminally unenforceable as a matter of law. Because if a right is entirely unenforceable, it is not clear in what sense the right-holder has the power to waive it (Kramer 2001: 65–73).

Rights under criminal law also pose a challenge to the will theory (MacCormick 1977: 197; Kramer 1998: 71–73; 2013: 249–250). Assuming (contestably) that criminal law vests legal rights in those it protects (Lyons 1994:, 33–35; Kramer 1998: 71), those rights—and the duties correlating to them (i.e., criminal prohibitions)—are mostly not subject to the will of the putative individual right-holder; holding neither the power to waive, annul, enforce, or transfer many such rights (and their correlative duties), nor the power to prosecute those who committed crimes against them.

More generally, there is something askew in equating the core function of rights not with claims but with the normative control over those claims (Wellman 1985: 75). So many legal rights are oriented first and foremost—both in their practice and in their primary justification—towards the protection of right-holders than towards empowering them to waive those protections. For example, even if waivable, the tort of false imprisonment seems much more about protecting the right-holder’s freedom of movement and far less about one’s capacity to waive that protection. The same is true of contractual rights, which appear oriented much more towards securing and enforcing contractual expectations than towards the power to waive those protections.

B. Challenges to The Interest Theory of Rights

The interest theory has been charged with under-inclusivity. For instance, even when rights further some of a right-holder’s interests, they do not necessarily further her overall well-being. For example, on balance an inheritance can be more trouble than it’s worth. Yet, this does not obviate one’s legal right in the inheritance (MacCormick 1977: 202). Relatedly, there are instances of widely recognized rights that do not at all benefit right-holders (Raz 1986: 180). For example, it is possible to be completely oblivious or even to welcome breaches of contract, battery, or theft. Yet, the absence of any relevant interest does not seem to obviate legal rights against such trespasses (Hart 1982: 76). Similarly, assuming that free speech protections are justified on the grounds of the interests of listeners or of the common good, it seems to follow from the interest theory that those protections do not bestow a right on any individual speaker. At least so long as the person whose speech is protected does not herself benefit from her own free-speech protections (Harel 2005: 196). This seems implausibly under-inclusive, certainly as a matter of law.

One path around these objections is describing the function of legal rights as only typically or normally furthering a right-holder’s overall well-being (MacCormick 1977: 202–204; Raz 1986: 180; Kramer 1998: 93–97; 2001: 79; 2013: 246). Moreover, legal rights are regularly understood based on the specific type of interest that they are considered tailored to protect, not on their overall benefits to right-holders. For example, the tort of nuisance is explicitly considered specifically protective of property owners’ interest in reasonably using and enjoying their land, not of their overall well-being; and contractual remedial rights, to give another example, are generally oriented specifically towards expectation and reliance interests. Finally, in assessing the negative impact of a right-violation to the right-holder, law mostly tends to look to the proximate impacts of the relevant protected interests. For instance, if fraudulently induced to buy a property at an inflated price, later arguing that given market forces the property serendipitously rose in value will not likely reduce the damages awards.

Another challenge of over-inclusivity is that under the interest theory it would seem that criminal law grants legal rights to those it protects: the norms of criminal law often not only protect individuals, but are also intended to do so, and, moreover, breaching them is often conditioned on harming those same individuals. Nevertheless, arguably a key difference between criminal law and private law is that the benefits of criminal law and the legal duties securing them are not—as a matter of law—owed to their beneficiaries, but rather to the state or the public (Blackstone 1765–1769: 3:1; Austin 1869: xvii; Hart 1982: 186). Thus, while criminal law perhaps protects certain moral rights of individuals, it does not grant those individuals legal rights in said legal protections (Hart 1982: 192–193).

A challenge of either under- or over-inclusivity involves the rights of third-party beneficiaries of contracts (i.e., beneficiaries of a contract that are not parties to that contract). Introduced by Hart (1955: 180; 1962: 314; 1982: 187–188), elaborated on by Steiner (1998: 284–286), and further developed by Sreenivasan (2005, 2017), the challenge is roughly based on the following scenario: X (promisee) contracts with Y (promisor) that Y pay Z $100; Z’s grandmother has an interest in Z’s welfare (such as in Y conforming to his obligation to pay Z); similarly, X’s grandfather has an interest in X’s welfare (such as in Y living up to his obligation to X). Assume that neither grandparent relies on the contract nor do the parties to the contract intend or expect the grandparents to benefit from it.

Given that the benefit of the contractual obligation is entirely Z’s, seemingly the interest theory entails that X (promisee) has no right against Y to the performance of the contract. This is clearly out of line with the law. In response, arguably promisees do have interests in the performance of contractual promises made to them for the furtherance of a third-party they likely wished to benefit (Raz 1986: 173–176; Lyons 1994: 36–44; Kramer 1998: 79–80). Yet, accepting that X has such an interest arguably overcomes under-inclusivity at the price of committing the interest theory to over-inclusivity. Because if X’s grandfather’s interests in X’s welfare were to include an interest in Y performing his contractual obligations to X, that would entail X’s grandfather also holds a right against Y to the performance of the contract. Which seems morally implausible. And, as a matter of law, only certain types of third-party beneficiaries (sometimes labeled “intended beneficiaries”) hold a right to enforce contracts. While there are variations in the legal rules over time and across jurisdictions, clearly mere incidental beneficiaries hold no such right (Farnsworth 2004: 7–27, 44–47; Treitel (Chitty) 2018: 1474–1479). Z’s case is less problematic for the interest theory, given that she is an explicitly intended beneficiary of the contract. As such, she likely holds legal rights against Y for the performance of the contract (Lyons 1994: 39–41). Yet, like Z’s grandmother (who has an interest in Z’s welfare), most third-party beneficiaries are not situated so proximately to the contract and to the parties’ intentions, making it far less likely that they hold legal or moral rights to the contract’s performance (Feinberg 1966: 131–138), further increasing the pressure on the interest theory, which can seem committed to the rights of all beneficiaries.

Addressing such worries over the scope of the interest theory, Bentham (see Hart 1982: 176–179; Lyons 1994: 27–30) and his intellectual descendants have attempted to refine it. For instance, stipulating that beneficiaries of norms are only right-holders under those norms if they are somehow intended or designated by the norm as its beneficiaries (Lyons 1969: 176; Hart 1982: 180–181). Later refinements of “Bentham’s test” have roughly argued for some version of the following: A (necessary or sufficient) condition for X holding a right under a norm is that harm to X is a necessary condition for breaching that norm.

Debates over the interest theory are ongoing. Some noteworthy contributions not yet mentioned include Kramer (2010: 36–37), Kramer & Steiner (2007: 301–308), Kurki (2018: 438–450; 2021), and McBride (2020a; 2020b).

Copyright © 2023 by
Ori Herstein <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free