#### Supplement to David Lewis’s Metaphysics

## Physical Magnitudes

Lewis looks to science—really, to physics—to tell us
what perfectly natural properties there are. But observe that he
presupposes that the things about which physics will inform us are
*properties*—and that is a category that physics has not
used for several centuries. Rather, physics trades in *physical
magnitudes*. This is not a mere terminological quibble. Consider
mass. On Lewis’s conception, *having mass 5 kg* and
*having mass 7 kg* should be viewed as distinct perfectly
natural properties, or so one would naturally assume. They are also to
be understood as non-modal. That would seem to mean, among other
things, that whether a particular has mass 5 kg places no logical or
metaphysical constraints on whether it has mass 7 kg. But that seems
crazy: it seems, quite to the contrary, that the claim that a given
particular has mass 5 kg *logically implies* that it does
*not* have mass 7 kg. At the very least, we should be suspicious
of a philosophical position that automatically forbids us from
understanding the logical relations between these claims in this
way.

The same point emerges in a more dramatic fashion when we turn to
spatiotemporal relations—or, to keep things simpler, just spatial
relations. Several authors (e.g. Bricker 1993; Maudlin 2007a) make the
following observation: spatial relations obey the triangle inequality,
and appear to do so as a matter of at least metaphysical—and,
plausibly, *logical*—necessity. If the distance between
points \(A\) and \(B\) is \(x\), and the distance
between \(B\) and \(C\) is \(y\), then the
distance between A and C cannot be more than \(x + y\). But why should this
constraint hold, if the spatial relations between \(A\) and \(B\), and \(B\) and \(C\),
on the one hand, place no constraints on the spatial relations between
\(A\) and \(C\), on the other?

There is also trouble for the minimality thesis. Suppose that point
\(A\) is 5 meters from point \(B, B\) is 5 meters
from \(C, C\) is 5 meters from \(D\),
and \(A\) is 15 meters from \(D\). It *follows* that \(A\) is 10 meters from
\(C\). So, in order to include just enough information to completely
characterize these points, we do not need to mention that \(A\) is 10
meters from \(C\): doing so would introduce an unwanted redundancy.
Consider then a set of spatial relations that simply *left one such
relation out*—say, the relation *being 10 meters
from*. For the reason just indicated, this set will contain enough
spatial relations for their distribution among the fundamental
particulars to fully and determinately fix the spatial nature of
reality. But it surely cannot follow that while some spatial relations
deserve the elite status of “perfectly natural”, others
don’t. After all, which ones could those be?

Finally, an argument advanced by Maudlin (2007a; see also Bricker
1993) reveals trouble for the thesis that perfectly natural
properties/relation are *intrinsic* to the particulars that
instantiate them. We should, Maudlin points out, ask *why* the
triangle inequality holds. It could, of course, be accepted as a bare
metaphysical posit. But there is another answer, which is to treat
distance as a *derived* relation, defined thus: the distance
between points \(A\) and \(B\) is the length of the shortest continuous path
through space that connects them (where the *spatial metric*
integration over which yields length along a path can be treated as a
primitive feature of the space). This definition yields the triangle
inequality as a trivial consequence—which seems a point in its
favor. Notice, however, that distance relations so understood are
*not* intrinsic to the points that exhibit them: for
“paths” are certain kinds of sets (or sums—it
doesn’t matter which) of spatial points, so to say that \(A\) is
such-and-such a distance from \(B\) is to *imply* that there are
points other than \(A\) and \(B\). That violates one aspect of the traditional
conception of “intrinsic”, since the instantiation by some
particulars of some intrinsic relation is, according to this
conception, supposed to be entirely independent of whatever else
exists. (See for example Langton & Lewis, 1998.)

Maudlin extends this argument to other physical magnitudes, showing
that a certain kind of path-dependence characterizes magnitudes
familiar from modern physics. A quick sketch of the argument must
suffice: Suppose that particle \(A\) has a certain value of a physical
magnitude, and particle \(B\) likewise has a value for that physical
magnitude. Now, many magnitudes that appear in contemporary physical
theories are *vector-valued*, let that be the case with this
example. Given the traditional conception of intrinsicness, it
should—if the possession by \(A\) of its value for the magnitude is
intrinsic to it, and the possession by \(B\) of *its* value for the
magnitude is intrinsic to \(it\)—be fully determinate
whether \(A\) and \(B\) have the *same* value for the magnitude. But in
the case of vector-valued
magnitudes^{[14]}
this is simply not so. It amounts to saying
that it must be fully determinate whether \(A\)’s and \(B\)’s
vectors are *pointing in the same direction*. That will be true,
*provided* that space is Euclidean. But not, in general,
otherwise.

What has gone wrong? I do not have anything like an adequate answer to
that question, but there does seem to be a significant error built
into the conception of natural properties that Lewis and many others
are working with—traceable, as hinted earlier, to the undue
influence of first-order logic. Recall a muddle that Wittgenstein gets
himself into in the *Tractatus*. All implication, he thinks,
must at bottom be truth-functional implication. Well, what about the
implication from “\(A\) is red all over” to “\(A\) is not
green all over”? (He could have used, as a much cleaner example,
the implication from “\(A\) has mass 5 kg” to “\(A\) does
not have mass 7 kg”.) Wittgenstein claims, bizarrely,
that *on analysis* this will turn out to be a truth-functional
implication. Nonsense. A vastly more sensible reaction is to
recognize that the logic Wittgenstein saddles himself with is not
built to handle this kind of implication. How, after
all, *would* first-order predicate logic handle it? Only by
introducing a relation “— has mass — kg”, along
with *non-logical axioms* such as
“\(\forall x\forall y\forall z ((x \text{ has mass } y \amp x \text{ has mass } z)
\rightarrow y = z)\)”.

I do not really mean to suggest that logic itself needs reform. But
what *does* need reform is a tendency to think that the basic
kinds of implication captured in the logic with which we are familiar
must exactly mirror the basic *metaphysical* connections that
characterize the structure of our ontology. It would, that is, be a bad
mistake to reason in the following way: “The fundamental
ontological structure of the world must be fully describable by some
first-order language, whose names will therefore correspond one-one
with the fundamental particulars (or: whose variables will therefore
range over the fundamental particulars), and whose predicates will
correspond one-one with the fundamental properties and relations.
What’s more, since any two atomic sentences of this language will
be logically independent of one another, it follows that the facts to
which these sentences correspond must be *metaphysically*
independent of one another. Hence, whether a given particular has a
given property places no metaphysical constraints on whether that or
any other particular has any other property.” That line of
reasoning leads, as we’ve seen, to a conception of fundamental
ontology that cannot properly accommodate the lessons of modern
physics. It is, finally, reasonably clear where Lewis’s
sympathies lie, with respect to this conflict (and even if he was not
properly aware of their significance): on the side of physics.

So a certain amount of reform is necessary in the conception Lewis
works with of perfectly natural properties and relations—a reform
we might signal by saying that this should *really* be a
conception of perfectly natural *magnitudes* (some monadic, some
dyadic, etc.). Switching our focus from properties and relations to
physical magnitudes removes the silly worry we saw above about the
minimality thesis: for we can now view that thesis as requiring that
there are just enough *magnitudes* for the distribution of their
values across all particulars to fix the nature of reality. And it
allows us to maintain that these magnitudes are non-modal, in the sense
that the value possessed by one particular for one magnitude places no
constraints of a logical or metaphysical kind on either (i) the value
possessed by that particular for any *other* magnitude, or (ii)
the value possessed by any other particular for any magnitude.

But once these reforms are carried out, we’re still not done:
there remains the problem Maudlin highlights for thinking of possession
of a value for a magnitude as something *wholly intrinsic* to
the possessor. Here it is much less clear to me how to proceed, and I
will simply flag this as an interesting and important open
question.