Notes to Epistemic Logic

1. In his 1969, Hintikka writes

My basic assumption (slightly oversimplified) is that an attribution of any propositional attitude to the person in question involves a division of all possible worlds (more precisely, all the worlds which we can distinguish in the part of language we use in making the attribution) into two classes: into those possible worlds which are in accordance with the attitude in question and into those worlds which are incompatible with it. (p. 25)

A similar view was held throughout his authorship, echoed in 2007 by

What the concept of knowledge involves in a purely logical perspective is thus a dichotomy of the space of all possible scenarios into those that are compatible with what I know and those that are incompatible with my knowledge. This observation is all we need for most of epistemic logic. (p. 15)

2. In the literature, the valuation is sometimes defined the other way around, i.e., defined not by it assigning to each atom a set of worlds, but by it assigning to each world a set of atoms. In the example, we would thus look at \(V(w_{1})\)the valuation of the world rather than \(V(p)\)the valuation of the atom. \(V(w_{1})\) would be \(\{p,q\}\). The two approaches are equivalent.

A second alternative used, e.g., in the entry on modal logic is to let the valuation be a function from the set of pairs of worlds and atoms \(W\times Atom\) to the set truth values for true and false, \(\{T,F\}\). Then \(V(w_{1},p)=T\) while \(V(w_{2},q)=F\). Again, this approach is equivalent to the one used here.

3. This paragraph refers to weak completeness. For the difference between weak and strong completeness, and for general meta-theoretical results for modal logic, see, e.g., Blackburn, de Rijke, and Venema 2001.

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Rasmus Rendsvig <>
John Symons <>

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