# Logic in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Tue Apr 19, 2011; substantive revision Wed Mar 10, 2021

The exercise of reasoning and the practice of argument are recorded in the early texts of India. Preoccupation with the nature of reason and argument occurs in the earliest philosophical texts, where their treatment is intimately connected with questions of ontology, epistemology and dialectics. These questions continued to be at the center of philosophical discussion through the classical and medieval period of Indian philosophy. This article will chronicle the answers Indian philosophers gave to these questions during the preclassical and classical period.

## 1. Reasoning and Logic

Humans reason: that is, taking some things to be true, they conclude therefrom that other things are also true. If this is done in thought, one performs an inference; and if this is done in speech, one makes an argument. Indeed, inference and argument are but two sides of the same coin: an argument can be thought, and hence become an inference; an inference can be expressed, and hence become an argument.

Logic, at least as traditionally conceived, seeks to distinguish good reasoning from bad. More particularly, it seeks to identify the general conditions under which what one concludes is true, having taken other things to be true. These conditions can be sought in the nature of things. One asks, then, under what conditions do certain facts require some other fact. This perspective on reasoning is an ontic perspective. Next, insofar as facts are grasped in thought, one can also ask under what conditions does knowledge of some facts permit knowledge of another fact. Such conditions, once identified, would distinguish good inferences from bad inferences. This perspective on reasoning is an epistemic one. A third perspective is a dialectic one. Here one asks under what conditions does the acceptance by someone of some stated facts require him or her to accept some other stated fact. Such conditions distinguish good arguments from bad arguments. Finally, since an argument is an expression of an inference, and to that extent, expressed in a language, it is natural to use the forms of linguistic expressions to identify forms of inferences and arguments, thereby distinguishing forms of good inferences and arguments from forms of bad inferences and arguments. This perspective is a linguistic one. The study of reasoning in India has been from the ontic, epistemic and dialectic perspective, and not from the linguistic perspective, the perspective best known to modern thinkers.

## 2. Preclassical Period

The fact that humans reason is no guarantee that those who do reflect on which reasoning is good and which is bad. Clearly, the activity of reasoning, on the one hand, and the activity of reflecting on which reasoning is good and which is not, on the other, are distinct, though naturally they are intimately related. The exposition here, while reporting primarily on what is explicit, will also report on what is implicit. In looking at the origins of reasoning in India, it is natural to begin with the practices in which reasoning played a role and which, as a result, were likely candidates for reflection. The obvious starting points for such practices are all forms of rational inquiry.

Rational inquiry comprises the search for reasons for publicly accepted facts, subject to public and rational scrutiny. This activity involves people both severally and collectively. It involves people severally insofar as people, individually, are the locus of inference. It involves people collectively insofar as arguments, the public manifestation of inferences, are sharpened by the scrutiny of others.

Though the origins in India of public debate (pariṣad), one form of rational inquiry, are not clear, we know that public debates were common in preclassical India, for they are frequently alluded to in various Upaniṣads and in the early Buddhist literature. Public debate is not the only form of public deliberations in preclassical India. Assemblies (pariṣad or sabhā) of various sorts, comprising relevant experts, were regularly convened to deliberate on a variety of matters, including administrative, legal and religious matters. As reported by Solomon (1976 ch. 3), much of the legal vocabulary for such deliberations includes the well-known terms of debate and argument found in the philosophical literature. (See also Preisendanz 2009.)

By the fifth century bce, rational inquiry into a wide range of topics was under way, including agriculture, architecture, astronomy, grammar, law, logic, mathematics, medicine, phonology and statecraft. Aside from the world’s earliest extant grammar, Pāṇini’s Aṣṭādhyāyī, however, no works devoted to these topics actually date from this preclassical period. Nonetheless, scholars agree that incipient versions of the first extant texts on these topics were being formulated and early versions of them were redacted by the beginning of the common era. They include such texts as Kṛṣi-śāstra (Treatise on agriculture), Śilpa-śāstra (Treatise on architecture), Jyotiṣa-śāstra (Treatise on astronomy), Dharma-śāstra (Treatise on law), Caraka-saṃhitā (Caraka’s collection), a treatise on medicine, and Artha-śāstra (Treatise on wealth), a treatise on politics.

Two texts from this period which are especially noteworthy for the study of the history of reasoning in India are Kathā-vatthu (Points of controversy), attributed to Moggaliputta Tissa, and Milinda-pañha (Questions of King Milinda). These texts date from around the third century bce. The latter text comprises a dialogue between the Greek Bactrian king Menander (Pali: Milinda), and the Buddhist monk Nāgasena. In it, King Milinda puts questions to Nāgasena concerning various aspects of Buddhist doctrine. The answers typically employ analogies, some very elaborate. In some cases, the king adduces pairs of statements of Buddhist doctrine which, he says, contradict each other. The monk typically replies by trying to show the alleged contradictions to be merely apparent. In a few cases, one or the other party makes an argument, typically an analogical one.

In contrast, Kathā-vatthu is filled with arguments designed to show the inconsistency of some two hundred propositions which are at odds with the views of the Sthaviravādins, a school of Buddhist thought. For example, in the passage below, the Sthaviravādin questions his opponent, here a Pudgalavādin, about whether or not the soul is known truly and ultimately.

 Sthaviravādin: Is the soul known truly and ultimately? Pudgalavādin: Yes. Sthaviravādin: Is the soul known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact? Pudgalavādin: No. Sthaviravādin: Acknowledge your refutation, If the soul is known truly and ultimately, then indeed, good sir, you should also say that the soul is known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact. What you say here is wrong: namely, that we ought to say (a) that the soul is known truly and ultimately; but we ought not to say (b) that the soul is known truly and ultimately just like any ultimate fact. If the latter statement (b) cannot be admitted, then indeed the former statement (a) should not be admitted. It is wrong to affirm the former statement (a) and to deny the latter (b).

One easily abstracts from this the following form,

 Sthaviravādin: Is A B? Pudgalavādin: Yes. Sthaviravādin: Is C D? Pudgalavādin: No. Sthaviravādin: Acknowledge your refutation, If A is B, then C is D. What you say here is wrong: namely, that A is B but that C is not D. If C is not D, then A is not B. It is wrong that A is B and C is not D.

Indeed, this form is repeatedly instantiated throughout Book 1, Chapter 1.

Three features of this text are important to note from the point of view of the history of logic. First, as the schema above shows, arguments are put into a canonical form. While we have no record that semantic ascent had taken place, there is no doubt from the arguments are intended to satisfy a certain form. Second, the sentences of the argument are logically related. The author takes for granted that the sentences assented to are inconsistent, corresponding to an instance of the following inconsistent propositional schemata of $$\alpha$$, $$\neg \beta$$, $$\alpha \rightarrow \beta$$. He also takes it for granted that it is wrong to hold inconsistent propositions. And he finally presupposes that, if a sentence corresponding to propositional schema $$\alpha \rightarrow \beta$$ is true, then the sentence corresponding to the propositional schema $$\neg \beta \rightarrow \neg \alpha$$ is also true; that is, he presupposes the natural language counterpart to one direction of the equivalence of a conditional and its contrapositive. (See Ganeri 2001 for the most recent attempt to explicate the dialectic implicit in the text.)

## 3. Classical Period

The first five hundred years of the common era also saw the redaction of philosophical treatises in which proponents of diverse philosophical and religious traditions put forth systematic versions of their world views. These latter works bear witness, in a number of different ways, to the intense interest in argumentation during this period. Among the diverse forms of argument from this period, one emerges as a canonical one. In this section, we first review the texts relevant to the development of logic from the end this preclassical period. We then turn our attention to surveying the emergence of a canonical argument form. Finally, we conclude with a very brief overview of the treatment of fallacies in arguments and of missteps in debate.

### 3.1 Texts of the early classical period

The texts relevant to the study of the development of logic during this period may be divided into three kinds: those which have arguments but which do not mention or discuss either argument or inference as such, those which mention or discuss inference as such but do not mention or discuss arguments as such, and those which mention or discuss arguments and possibly also mention or discuss inference, and may even provide illustrations of either.

#### 3.1.1 Texts with arguments

During this period polemical texts, which consist almost entirely of arguments, start to appear. The earliest among these are texts attributed to Nāgārjuna (2nd century ce). They include Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (Basic verses on the middle way), Vigraha-vyāvartanī (Exclusion of disputes) and Vaidalya-prakaraṇa (Tract on pulverization). Then comes a text extant only in Chinese, Bǎi lùn (百論), a translation of the Sanskrit text entitled Śataka-śāstra (Treatise in one hundred verses) by Āryadeva (c. 3rd century ce), a student of Nāgārjuna. Many of the arguments in these texts are arguments by analogy; those which are not are often enthymemes whose omitted premisses are patently false.

The simpler arguments by analogy are of two kinds: ones based on similarity (sādharmya; sārūpya) and others based on dissimilarity (vaidharmya; vairūpya). Such simple arguments involve two things, call them p and d, and two properties, call them H and S. An argument by analogy based on similarity is one where, if p and d are similar with respect to property H and d has property S, then p has property S. This gives rise to this argument schema:

analogical syllogism using similarity
 proposition: p has S reason: because p has H. example: d has H and S.

(The names for the statements have been added for ease of comparison with later developments to be discussed below.) Notice that, if p and d are not distinct, the argument is circular.

An argument by analogy based on dissimilarity is one where, if p and d are dissimilar with respect to property H and d has property S, then p does not have property S. Here is its argument schema:

analogical syllogism using dissimilarity
 proposition: p does not have S reason: because p does not have H. example: d has H and S.

Here the ontic version of the law of non-contradiction guarantees that p and d are distinct.

The terms similarity and dissimilarity become technical terms in Indian logic. It is useful to bear in mind some syntactic and semantic features shared by both the Sanskrit terms and their English translations. These words express a three place relation, namely the relation of a thing similar to, or dissimilar from, another thing in some respect. When these terms are used either in English or in Sanskrit, the complement referring to the respect in which things are similar or dissimilar may be left unexpressed. It is this omissibility which accounts for the fact that the following two sentences are not contradictory: Devadatta is similar to Yajñadatta and Devadatta is dissimilar to Yajñadatta. After all, two people might be similar to one another, say, in temperament, but dissimilar to one another, say, in appearance. When the respect of similarity or dissimilarity is not expressed in a sentence, it must be gathered from the context.

A pair of related terms with the same syntactic and semantic features, which also become technical terms in Indian logic, are the terms subject-like (sa-pakṣa), or similar to the subject, and subject-unlike (vi-pakṣa), or dissimilar to the subject. The Sanskrit prefixes, sa- and vi-, and the English adjectives, like and unlike, which are also English prepositions, express the relation of similarity and dissimilarity respectively.

#### 3.1.2 Texts discussing inference

Two early texts which discuss inference (anumāna), but not argument (sādhana), are Ṣaṣṭi-tantra (Sixty doctrines), attributed Vārṣagaṇya (4th century ce), and Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (Aphorisms on individuation), a treatise of speculative ontology attributed to Kaṇāda (c. 1st century ce).

Ṣaṣṭi-tantra, which survives only in fragments, first collected by Frauwallner (1958), later expanded by Steinkellner (2017 Appendix 1), defines inference (anumāna) as follows: To infer is to establish something in the remainder, on the basis of a relation and something perceptible . One of the text’s fragments lists six relations as ones which underpin an acceptable inference: the master servant relation (sva-svāmi-bhāva-saṃbandha), the matter alteration relation (prakṛti-vikāra-saṃbandha), the part whole relation (kārya-kāraṇa-saṃbandha), the cause effect relation (nimitta-naimittika-saṃbandha), the source product relation (mātrā-mātrika-saṃbandha), the association relation (sahacāri-saṃbandha) and the incompatibility relation (vadhya-ghātaka-saṃbandha).Though each of the relations is illustrated, no example of an inference using them is found.

Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (Aphorisms on individuation) also has passages which allude to inferences whereby one thing is inferred on the basis of something observable which bears one of five relations to the thing inferred (VS 9.18; Jambuvijaya (ed.) 1961 p. 69; cp. VS 3.1.8), though no examples are given. Nonetheless, in the case of both texts, it is clear from the description that the inferences would have the following form:

inferential syllogism
 proposition: p has S reason: because p has H. relation: A relation which possessors of H bear to possessors of S.

#### 3.1.3 Texts discussing argument

The best known text from this period is the Brahmanical treatise Nyāya-sūtra (Aphorisms on logic) by Gautama, also known as Akṣapāda (c. 2nd ce), the actual redaction of which is thought by some to date to the third century ce. This work, which comprises five books, each with two chapters, addresses primarily questions pertaining to epistemology and debate, though it also touches on other topics. A few aphorisms found in the first chapter of the first and second books speak of inference, but much more attention is devoted to debate, essentially all of both chapters of Book 5, the entirety of the second chapter of Book 1, and several aphorisms in the first chapter of Book 1. Unfortunately, the laconic style of the aphorisms makes it hard to get a clear idea of what is intended.

Some light is shed on this work by a contemporaneous Buddhist work, the Vaidalya-prakaraṇa (Tract on pulverization), attributed to Nāgārjuna. It is organized around the key terms listed in the first aphorism of the Nyāya-sūtra (NS 1.1.1). However, it does not explain the terms nor does it illustrate them. Instead, it sets out for each term arguments intended to show its incoherence. It is therefore rich in arguments, most of which are analogical. The author also judges a number of counter arguments as fallacious, pointing out either that they are circular or that they lead to an infinite regress.

Not all Buddhist texts from this period are hostile to argumentation. Two works contain short passages with lists and classificatory definitions of terms pertaining to debate. One is the Saṃdhi-nirmocana-sūtra (Aphorisms on release from bondage), of unknown authorship, whose original Sanskrit has been lost, but whose translations into Tibetan and Chinese have been preserved. (See Yoshimizu 2010.) The other is the Abhidharma-samuccaya (Compendium of the higher teachings), a text usually attributed to the Buddhist thinker, Asaṅga (5th century ce), whose fifth chapter has a section, its seventh, often referred to as Vāda-viniścaya (Settling on what debate is), also devoted to debate.

In contrast, five other texts from this period not only mention and sometimes discuss terms pertinent to inference and debate but also provide illustrations of the terms. The earliest texts are two passages in the earliest medical work, the Caraka-saṃhitā, conjectured by some to have been redacted in its current form at the beginning of first century ce. Another important passage occurs in the Yogācāra-bhūmi-śāstra (Treatise on the stages of the practice of yoga), a work traditionally attributed to Asaṅga, but now generally thought to be by a number of authors. The passage, usually referred to as Hetu-vidyā (Science of reasons), provides some fifty examples of simple common sense inferences, all of which are easily recast in the form of the inferential syllogism given above. The inferences are divided into five categories. While relation words are used for each category, the logical force of these relations is not made clear. The inferences provided include ones such as the inference of fire from smoke, of the presence of a lion from its roar, of being sick from unusual eating practices, as well as inferences more closely connected with Buddhist doctrine.

The first work devoted entirely to argument and inference is the Fāng biàn xīn lùn (方便心論), or Treatise on the heart of means, translated into Chinese in 472 ce without attribution, though it later came to be attributed to Nāgārjuna. This text, translated into Sanskrit by G. Tucci (1929), is commonly known by scholars by the translation of its title by Tucci as Upāya-hṛdaya.

Shortly after Asaṅga, Vasubandhu (c. 5th century ce), another Buddhist idealist, thought to be the younger brother of the Asaṅga, wrote at least three works on debate: Vāda-hṛdaya (Heart of debate), Vāda-vidhāna (Precepts of debate) and Vāda-vidhi (Rules of debate). These texts have been lost, though fragments of the latter two, some in Sanskrit, many in Tibetan, have been collected (Frauwallner 1933, 1957; Ono 2020). Another work, ascribed to Vasubandhu, which survives only in Chinese, is the Rúshí lùn (如實論), Treatise on truth. G. Tucci (1929), translating it back into Sanskrit, gave it the Sanskrit title Tarka-śāstra, by which it is now generally known. However, as has been shown recently by Ono Motoi (Ono 2020 §1), this rendition is not correct.

There are two other works which have passages pertinent to the study of the history of reasoning in India, both works attributed to Asaṅga. The first is the Xiǎn yáng shèng jiào lùn (顯揚聖教論), or Treatise which reveals and disseminates the wise teachings, which is a condensed version of the Yogācāra-bhūmi-śāstra, and the Shùn zhōng lùn (順中論), or Treatise on following the middle way, which seems to be a commentary on the introductory verse of Nāgārjuna’s Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā (Katsura 1985 p. 166).

Having surveyed the texts from the late preclassical period pertinent to the study of the development of logic, we now turn to the emergence of a canonical Indian syllogism.

### 3.2 The emergence of a canonical syllogism

The earliest known example of the canonical Indian syllogism is found in the Caraka-saṃhitā. The argument is clearly an analogical one. The earliest known deductive version of the syllogism is found in the Fāng biàn xīn lùn, or Upāya-hṛdaya; and the earliest known discussion of a deductive version of the syllogism is found in the Rúshí lùn, usually referred to as the Tarka-śāstra. A concise version of the the deductive version is found in Vasubandhu’s Vāda-vidhi.

The Caraka-saṃhitā (CS 3.8.31), like the Nyāya-sūtra (NS 1.1.32), takes the syllogism to have five parts, the names for four of the five parts being identical; however, unlike the Nyāya-sūtra, the Caraka-saṃhitā provides an illustration.

canonical syllogism (analogical)
 proposition: The soul is eternal reason: because of being un-produced. example: Space is unproduced and it is eternal. application: And just as space is unproduced, so is the soul. conclusion: Therefore, the soul is eternal.

Observe that the first three statements in the syllogism have the form of the analogical syllogism using similarity as discussed above: p, the soul, has S, the property of being eternal, because p, the soul, has H, the property of being unproduced; as d, or space, has H, the property of being unproduced, and d, space, has S, the property of being eternal. However, the argument here adds two more statements: the first spells out the analogy between the subject of the proposition and the example, using the correlative expression as (yathā) … so (tathā) …; the second restates the argument’s proposition.

While Caraka-saṃhitā provides only one illustration of its canonical syllogism, the earliest extant commentary on the Nyāya-sūtra, called the Nyāya-bhāṣya (Commentary on logic), has passages in its commentary on NS 1.1.33–39, which permit the reconstruction of two analogical syllogisms, corresponding to those using similarity and using dissimilarity discussed above. The commentary, attributed to Vātsyāyana (fifth ce), also known as Pakṣilasvāmin, explicitly distinguishes the syllogisms as one based on similarity (sādharmya) and the other based on dissimilarity (vaidharmya) discussed earlier. (For details, see Gillon 2020.) The analogical syllogism based on similarity differs but slightly from the syllogism found in the Caraka-saṃhitā.

The Fāng biàn xīn lùn, or Upāya-hṛdaya, purports to be a primer on argument and reasoning, listing and defining many terms. It also contains many arguments, several of which are analogical arguments both through similarity and through dissimilarity. The author of the text neither states what an argument is nor what its parts are. Yet, in the first chapter, he speaks of excessive and deficient statements and says that there are three kinds: deficiency of reason, deficiency of proposition and deficiency of example. (T1632 24.3.14–18; Gillon and Katsura 2017 p. 215). Arguments which are not deficient in any of these ways is said to be complete. From the illustrations, it is clear that a nondeficient argument has the form: p has S, because of having H, like d, where d is assumed to have both H and S. In other words, a complete argument could be spelled out in the form whose explicit counterpart would be that of an analogical syllogism using similarity of the kind found in the polemical texts discussed earlier.

The only argument to appear in a form with five parts is given in the fourth, or last, chapter (T1632 28.1.4–6). Here is the argument as it occurs with the labels for the parts supplied for ease comparison. Though the Chinese equivalent of proposition, reason and example appear in the text, the equivalents of application and conclusion do not.

canonical syllogism (deductively valid)
 proposition: The self is eternal reason: because it is not perceptible by the senses. example: Space, because of not being perceptible by senses, is eternal. Everything which is not perceptible by senses is eternal. application: And the self is not perceptible by senses. conclusion: Could the self possibly be non-eternal?

Note that example statement comprises two sentences: the first restates what is expressed in the proposition and reason statements, the second affirms a universal proposition, everything which is not perceptible by senses is eternal. The example statement comprises a deductively valid argument, as does the second sentence together with the reason and proposition statements. Surprisingly, the author rejects the syllogism as a bad one. The rejection is justified by an argument by analogy through dissimilarity.

When we turn to the Rúshí lùn, customarily referred to as the Tarka-śāstra, we find the logical situation has changed. A deductive syllogism similar to the one just set out is endorsed. Moreover, analogical syllogisms are explicitly rejected. For example, the text rejects the following analogical syllogism (T1633 30.3.2–4).

canonical syllogism (analogical)
 proposition: Sound is not eternal reason: because, arising due to an effort, it arises immediately. example: As a clay vessel, arising due to an effort, and having arisen, perishes, application: sound too is that way. conclusion: Therefore, sound is not eternal.

That the syllogism is analogical is made clear by the formulation of the example and application statements.

What the text’s author advocates instead are syllogisms which are in fact deductively valid, similar to the syllogism cited and rejected in the Fāng biàn xīn lùn. Here is one example (T1633 30.3.7–10).

canonical syllogism (deductively valid)
 proposition: Sound is not eternal reason: because, arising due to an effort, it arises immediately. example: If a thing is eternal, (then) it does not arise due to an effort. For example, space is eternal and does not arise due to an effort. application: Sound too is not that way. conclusion: Therefore, sound is not eternal.

This argument, like the one rejected in Fāng biàn xīn lùn, is deductively valid. The example statement also comprises two sentences: the first, however, affirms a universal proposition, If a thing is eternal, (then) it does not arise due to an effort, and the second states an instance of the universal proposition, which is distinct from the subject of the argument. The proposition and reason statements, together with the first sentence of the example statement, comprise a deductively valid argument.

Moreover, we know that the author is fully aware of the syllogism’s logical force, for he states the three conditions, or three forms (tri-rūpa), which a reason must satisfy for the argument in which it occurs to be sound.

three forms (T1633 30.3.18–26):
The reason you set forth is not definite because eternality and non-eternality appear throughout it. The reason I set forth has the three marks. (1) The (reason) is a property of the subject, (2) it is included in things similar and (3) it is excluded from things dissimilar. Therefore, the reason I set forth succeeds in not deviating, your reason does not. Therefore, your objection is confused. If the reason you set forth were like my reason (in this respect), your objection would succeed in being a proper objection.

As noted by H. Ui 1929 (reported in Katsura 1985 p. 166), the earliest mention of the three forms appears in a brief passage in a non-logical text, Shùn zhōng lùn (T1565 42a12,22ff). However, the author of this text, said to be Asaṅga, rejects the criterion, a criterion thought to be of a non-Buddhist origin.

Finally we come to Vasubandhu’s Vāda-vidhi. Here the endorsed argument retains the proposition and the reason, abandons the application and the conclusion and simplifies the example, so that the resulting syllogism has this form:

canonical syllogism (deductively valid): Vasubandhu
 proposition: p has S reason: because p has H. example: That which has H has S, like d. (where d, distinct from p, has properties H and S).

It harks back to the form of the inferential syllogism mentioned earlier in our discussion of the Ṣaṣṭi-tantra and the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra. However, there is one crucial difference: Vasubandhu is absolutely clear that the example statement expresses an indispensability relation (a-vinā-bhāva: lit. not existing without, or sine qua non). As is clear, instances of this schema are deductively valid arguments.

### 3.3 Fallacies in arguments and missteps in debates

The obverse side of identifying a proper argument is identifying fallacious arguments. Fallacious arguments include, on the one hand, syllogisms whose reasons have been identified as specious and, on the other hand, counter arguments, or rejoinders, identified as defective.

The Caraka-saṁhitā (CS 3.8.57) identifies and illustrates three kinds of arguments as defective. The first chapter of the fifth book of the Nyāya-sūtra (NS 5.1) lists and briefly describes 24 arguments, which it designates as fallacious rejoinders (jāti). The fourth chapter of the Fāng biàn xīn lùn lists and describes twenty such arguments, which are either the same as, or similar to, the arguments identified as fallacious rejoinders in the chapter of the Nyāya-sūtra just mentioned. Surprisingly, the Fāng biàn xīn lùn treats these arguments as good rejoinders, as noted by Kajiyama (1989 p. 108). The most interesting treatments of fallacious rejoinders are those found in the Rúshí lùn and in the Vāda-vidhi, where many of fallacious rejoinders have names which are the same as those exemplified in the Nyāya-sūtra (Ono 2020 §3.2 and §3.5). (See also Randle 1930 ch. 6.2 and Solomon 1976 ch. 5.)

The Vaiśeṣika-sūtra (VS 3.1.10–11) and the Nyāya-sūtra (NS 1.2.4–9) name kinds of specious reasons (hetvābhāsa), but give neither examples nor explanations of what they are. Three kinds are listed, and even briefly discussed, in the Caraka-saṃhitā (CS 3.8.57). The Fāng biàn xīn lùn merely lists eight kinds. Three kinds are exemplified and briefly discussed both in the Vāda-vidhi and in the Rúshí lùn. (See Randle 1930 ch. 3.5 and Solomon 1976 ch. 7.)

Besides identifying fallacious syllogisms and rejoinders, some of these texts also have either extended passages or entire chapters devoted to the identification of behavior in debates which, when displayed by someone, warrants his being deemed to have lost. These missteps, known as grounds for defeat (nigraha-sthāna), range from making fallacious arguments to infringing the rules of debate procedure. The second chapter of the fifth book Nyāya-sūtra (NS 5.2) sets out 22 cases, as does the third chapter of the Rúshí lùn. An extended passage of the Caraka-saṁhīta (CS 3.8.50–65) lists 14 cases. Asaṅga’s Hetu-vidyā has an extended passage which classifies them into three kinds and provides cases of each. (See Randle 1930 ch. 6.3 and Solomon 1976 ch. 6.)

## 4. Culmination of the Classical Period

The Buddhist thinker, Dignāga (c. 5th – 6th century ce), consolidates the insights into the canonical deductively valid syllogism of his predecessors, and in particular those of his teacher, Vasubandhu, as well as deepens them. He is, in fact, a pivotal figure in the history of Indian logic. This section is divided into two parts: the first devoted to Dignāga’s contributions to Indian logic, especially the canonical syllogism, the second part summarizing other contributions from his contemporaries and successors, both Buddhist and non-Buddhist.

### 4.1 Dignāga

Dignāga wrote three works pertaining to reasoning and argument. Unfortunately, in each case, the original Sanskrit text is not available. One, the Nyāya-mukha (Introduction to logic), is extant in Chinese translation and a Sanskrit manuscript is known to exist in Tibet. The remaining two are extant only in Tibetan translation: Hetu-cakra-ḍamaru (The drum wheel of reason) and his magnum opus, Pramāṇa-samuccaya (Compendium on epistemic means of cognition), four of whose six chapters are devoted to inference or argument.

One idea which is particularly clear in Dignāga’s work is his explicit recognition that arguments which are expressed as syllogisms are expressions of inferences. This is reflected in his terms inference for oneself (svārtha-anumāna), which refers to the cognitive process expressible as a syllogism, and inference for another (parārtha-anumāna), which refers to the verbal expression of the syllogistic inference. These terms are also the titles of the second and third chapters of his Pramāṇa-samuccaya.

Dignāga apparently enlarges the form of Vasubandhu’s canonical syllogism. Even though the texts just mentioned are not extant in Sanskrit, some of their commentaries are and some of these texts’ passages are found cited in existing Sanskrit works. Availing himself of these works, S. Katsura (2004a p. 143) has identified the following as an argument instantiating what Dignāga considers the canonical form of a good syllogism.

canonical syllogism (deductively valid): Dignāga
 thesis: Sound is non-eternal reason: because it is immediately connected with an effort. similarity example: That which is immediately connected with an effort is observed to be non-eternal, like a pot. dissimilarity example: That which is eternal is observed not to be immediately connected with an effort, like space.

Before discussing the syllogism, we must take notice of the word pakṣa (thesis), which Dignāga uses instead of pratijñā (proposition). The word is used both for the statement, previously called a proposition and now called a thesis, as well as for the factual situation it expresses. It is also used to refer to the grammatical subject of the thesis statement as well as to the thing denoted by the grammatical subject. (See Staal 1973 for a lucid exposition of this and other ambiguities in the technical terms of classical Indian logic.)

Dignāga’s canonical syllogism, like that of Vasubandhu, has neither an application statement nor a conclusion statement. However, unlike that of Vasubandhu, it has two example statements. Each example statement comprises a universal statement and a phrase naming something. In the case of the statement of similarity example, the universal statement asserts that whatever has the property adduced as a reason (hetu) has the property to be established (sādhya-dharma), which is mentioned in the syllogism’s thesis, while the phrase names something, distinct from the subject (pakṣa), yet similar to it with respect to the property to be established (sādhya-dharma), and has the property adduced as the reason. The example named is said to be subject-like (sa-pakṣa). In the case of the statement of dissimilarity example, the universal statement asserts that whatever does not have the property to be established (sādhya-dharma) does not have the property adduced as a reason (hetu) and the phrase names something dissimilar to subject with respect to the property to be established and not having the property adduced as the reason. The example named here is said to be subject-unlike (vi-pakṣa). Finally, Dignāga seems to have added a word to the formulation of the universal statement, namely, the word observed (dṛṣṭa), the past passive participle of the verb to see (dṛś), which means not only to see but also to observe, to notice and even to know. Hereafter, we shall refer to a syllogism’s reason statement as its minor premiss and the universal statement in its example statement as its major premiss.

Perhaps most original in Dignāga’s work on argument and inference is what he called the wheel of reasons (hetu-cakra), an equivalent alternative to the three forms of reason (tri-rūpa-hetu). It comprises a three by three matrix, which distinguishes a proper from an improper reason. It specifies, on the one hand, the three cases of the reason (hetu) occurring in some, none, or all of subject-like things (sa-pakṣa), and, on the other, the three cases of the reason (hetu) occurring in some, none, or all of subject-unlike things (vi-pakṣa). Letting H be the reason, S the subject-like things and $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ the subject-unlike things, we obtain the following table.

 H occurs in: all S all S all S all $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ no $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ some $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ H occurs in: no S no S no S all $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ no $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ some $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ H occurs in: some S some S some S all $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ no $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$ some $$\bar{\mbox{S}}$$

Dignāga identified the syllogisms corresponding to the top and bottom cases of the middle column as good syllogisms and those corresponding to the other cases as bad.

These developments have led to a rather lively debate among scholars of the development of logic in early classical India. A very succinct, but somewhat misleading, way to put the question at the center of the debate is whether or not Dignāga’s canonical syllogism is inductive or deductive. A more cumbersome, but more precise, way to put the question is this: Is there a choice of a subject, of a property adduced as a reason, and of a property to be established which Dignāga would accept as constituting a good syllogism but which fails to satisfy the form corresponding to the canonical syllogism given above?

Let us now consider those aspects of Dignāga’s treatment of the syllogism which are at the center of this debate. One reason to think that Dignāga would accept as a good syllogism one failing to be deductively valid might be his inclusion of the word observed (dṛṣṭa) in the example statement. In other words, one might think that Dignāga would accept as a good syllogism one in which, even though it is not the case that whatever has H has S, it is the case that whatever is observed to have H has S: that is to say, the major premiss pertains only to observed cases of H, and not for every case of H. However, no such syllogisms are accepted by Dignāga. Indeed, the addition of the word observed (dṛṣṭa) does not permit attributing such an idea to Dignāga, for the word is added, not to the major premiss’s subordinate, relative clause, but to its main clause. Thus, what the major premiss says is not that every observed instance of the reason (H) is an instance of the property to be established (S), but rather that every instance of the reason (H) is observed to be an instance of the property to be established (S). Moreover, if the word observed (dṛṣṭa) has a factive sense, that is, a sense which presupposes the truth of the clause into which the word is inserted, as do several of its English translations, for example, noticed, known, then the word in the statement leaves the truth conditions of major premiss unaffected.

A further reason which has prompted scholars to think that included among the syllogisms Dignāga would accept as good ones are ones which might not be deductively valid is the fact that he has retained an example phrase in example statements, for such phrases have no bearing on the deductive validity of Dignāga’s canonical syllogism. This doubt is re-enforced by the fact that example statements, stripped of their example phrases, are contrapositives of one another. Thus, one being logically equivalent to the other is also logically superfluous with respect to it. Yet, Dignāga seems to be aware of the equivalence, for he acknowledges in his commentarial discussion of the three forms (PS 2.5) that the second and third forms are equivalent (Katsura 2000 p. 245; Katsura 2004b pp. 121–124), from which it follows that any two statements, one of which satisfies the second form and the other of which satisfies the third form are equivalent.

That said, it is nonetheless perfectly reasonable to exclude some deductively valid syllogisms as good syllogisms. Consider, for example, a syllogism whose conclusion is identical with one of its premisses. It is a deductively valid syllogism, though it is utterly unpersuasive. Dignāga, like any rational thinker, would not, and did not, accept as a good syllogism any syllogism in which the reason (H) and the property to be established (S) are the same property, even if such syllogisms have the same form as the canonical syllogism above. Excluding such circular syllogisms is fully consistent with the view that the syllogisms accepted by Dignāga are only deductively valid ones. (For extensive scholarly discussion of the role of examples in Buddhist arguments, see the collection of articles in Katsura and Steinkellner (eds) 2004.)

A good reason for Dignāga to retain an example phrase in the example statements of his canonical syllogism would be to exclude syllogisms which are patently unpersuasive, even though, like circular syllogisms, they are deductively valid. Consider the following argument:

 thesis: Sound is eternal reason: because it is audible. similarity example: Whatever is audible is eternal.

This syllogism, rejected as a bad syllogism by Dignāga, was put forth by a school of Brahmanical thinkers who held, for doctrinal reasons, that sound is eternal. To maintain this claim in the face of observation to the contrary, these thinkers maintained instead that what is transitory is the revelation of sound, not sound itself. According to them, in other words, sound is constantly present, but we hear it only when its presence is revealed.

Their syllogism as stated above, though deductively valid, is utterly unpersuasive. The reason is that the instances of audibility (H), are coextensive with sound (p). Thus, there is no independent empirical evidence to support the universal statement that whatever is audible is eternal. Requiring that there be at least some thing different from sound which is both audible and eternal is an obvious and plausible way to eliminate such patently unpersuasive syllogisms. Dignāga, therefore, rules out the syllogism as a bad syllogism, rather than, as we would, accept it as a valid syllogism with an unpersuasive premiss. (See also Tillemans 1990.)

But this cannot be the entire explanation of why Dignāga appears to insist on example phrases in example statements, for nowhere does he rule out as a good syllogism one which, though valid, is unpersuasive for want of some subject-unlike thing.

Because of the doubts just discussed, some scholars think that Dignāga was not striving to work out a deductive form of reasoning and argument. Rather, according to some, such as Hayes (1980; 1988 ch. 4.2), Dignāga was seeking to develop an inductive form of reasoning and argument. According to others, such as Oetke (1994; 1996), Dignāga and some of his predecessors and contemporaries were striving to spell out a defeasible form of reasoning and argument. (See Taber 2004 for a critical assessment of Oetke’s view.)

A final contribution by Dignāga is found in the sixth and final chapter of his Pramāṇa-samuccaya, where he addresses fourteen fallacious rejoinders (jāti), each bearing the same name as one of the fourteen treated in Vasubandhu’s Vāda-vidhi, though sometimes the argument associated with a particular name in the Pramāṇa-samuccaya is different from the one associated with the name in the Vāda-vidhi. His treatment is often different from, and critical of, the treatment found in this earlier work.

### 4.2 Dignāga’s contemporaries and immediate successors

However much scholars may disagree about Dignāga’s aim in the formulation of the canonical syllogism, all agree that his works set the framework within which subsequent Buddhist thinkers addressed philosophical issues pertaining to inference and debate. Thus, Śaṇkarasvāmin (c. 6th century ce), a pupil of Dignāga (Frauwallner 1961, 140), wrote a brief manual of inference for Buddhists, called the Nyāya-praveśa (Beginning logic), based directly on Dignāga’s work. Not long thereafter, Dharmakīrti (c. 7th century ce), the great Buddhist metaphysician, also elaborated his views on inference and debate within the framework found in Dignāga.

The canonical syllogism, treated as an inference, is that whereby one who knows the truth of its premisses may also come to know the truth of its conclusion. While the truth of a particular statement is thought to be known either through perception or through inference, how is the truth of a universal statement, such as the major premiss of a canonical syllogism, known? To know its truth would seem to require that one know of each thing which has H, whether or not it also has S. Yet if one knew that, one would already know by perception the canonical syllogism’s conclusion. As a result, inference would be a superfluous means of knowledge.

The earliest classical Indian philosopher thought to have recognized the problem of how one comes to know the truth of a universal statement seems to have been Īśvarasena (Steinkellner 1997 p. 638). He appears to have thought that knowledge of the major premiss is grounded in non-perception (anupalabdhi). That is, according to Īśvarasena, knowledge that whatever has H has S comes from the simple failure to perceive something which has H but which does not have S. (See Steinkellner 1993, where he draws on Steinkellner 1966.)

However, this suggestion does not solve the problem, for reasons laid out in detail by Dharmakīrti (c. 7th century ce). His extensive writing on epistemology in general and on reason and argument in particular formed a watershed in classical India philosophy. Besides his magnum opus, Pramāṇa-vārttika (Gloss on the means of epistemic cognition), one of whose four chapters is devoted to inference (svārtha-anumāna), comprising 340 verses and a commentary by him to it, and another devoted to argument (parārtha-anumāna), which comprises 285 verses, he wrote several smaller works, including Pramāṇa-viniścaya (Settling on what the epistemic means of cognition are), Nyāya-bindu (Drop of logic), Hetu-bindu (Drop of reason) and Vāda-nyāya (Logic of debate). As he makes abundantly clear in verses 13–25 and his commentary thereto of the chapter on inference (svārtha-anumāna) of his Pramāṇa-vārttika, the simple failure to perceive something which has H but which does not have S is no guarantee that whatever has H has S; after all, while one has never encountered something which has H and does not have S, what guarantee is there that something which has H and does not have S is not among the things which one has yet to encounter? Dharmakīrti’s answer was that the truth of the first premiss is guaranteed by either of two relations obtaining between properties: the causation relation (tadutpatti) and the identity relation (tādātmya). Unfortunately, as one might suspect, Dharmakīrti’s solution does not work. (See Gillon 1991; see Steinkellner 2015 for a dissenting view.)

Starting with Dignāga, those interested in logic started to add the particle eva to the various clauses of the three forms of reason (tri-rūpa-hetu) (Katsura 1986). Dignāga’s formulation of the three forms came in for criticism at the hands of the Nyāya thinker, Uddyotakara (c. late 6th century ce), which was, in turn, addressed by Dharmakīrti, who uses the particle to express each of the three conditions (NB 2.5).

three forms of reason (tri-rūpa-hetu)
 first form: the reason’s definite (eva) existence in the subject; second form: the reason’s existence in subject-like things only (eva); third form: the reason’s utter (eva) non-existence in subject-unlike things.

Unfortunately, the precision hoped for is undermined by the ambiguity in the meaning of the particle eva. The particle eva has two principal uses: one emphatic, the other restrictive. What it emphasizes or restricts depends on the word after which it is placed. The particle in the statement of the first form applies to the abstract noun existence and, in its emphatic use, is well translated by definite or actual. The particle in the statement of the third form applies to the negative abstract noun non-existence and, in its emphatic use with negation, is best translated by utter or at all. (Some scholars translate the particle in these statements as necessary. There is, however, no philological justification for such a translation.) The particle in the second form applies to a concrete noun. Though here the particle could have either an emphatic or a restrictive use, only the restrictive use fits the context. A problem arises from the word subject-like (sa-pakṣa). It can be construed in two ways: either as including or as excluding the subject. If subject-like is construed as inclusive and the particle eva is taken as restrictive, then the second and third forms are logically equivalent; but the statement of the three forms has the rhetorical blemish of containing a logically superfluous form. If subject-like is taken as exclusive and the particle is taken as restrictive, then the three forms are inconsistent, for in that case the second form entails the contradictory of the first form. (For details, see Gillon 1999.)

Ideas on the nature of reasoning and argumentation very similar to those of Dignāga’s are found in the Padārtha-dharma-saṃgraha (Summary of categories and properties), a work better known as Praśastapāda-bhāṣya (Praśastapāda’s commentary, customarily regarded as a commentary on the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra). Its author, Praśastapāda (c. 6th century ce), is a near contemporary of Dignāga. Like Dignāga, Praśastapāda uses the expression inference for another (parārtha-anumāna) to refer to arguments cast in a syllogistic form, thereby making clear his recognition that inferences, or cognitive processes, and arguments, or verbal expressions, are two sides of the same coin. Also like Dignāga, Praśastapāda adopts as a canonical syllogism an argument whose core is the same deductively valid argument as Dignāga’s. However, unlike Dignāga, he retains the five members for the syllogism, in keeping with the five members of the analogical syllogism set out by Vātsyāyana, though some of the names for the members are different. The following syllogism is reassembled from Praśastapāda’s treatment of inference. (See Randle 1930 p. 176.)

canonical syllogism (deductively valid): Praśastapāda
 proposition: Wind is a substance [266] reason: because it possesses action. [268] example: That which possesses movement is observed to be a substance, like an arrow. [278] application: And in the same way wind possesses action. [281] conclusion: Therefore, it is indeed a substance. [282]

(The numbers above in square brackets refer to the paragraph numbers of the passages containing the relevant sentences in Bronkhorst and Ramseier (eds) 1994.) Again, like Dignāga, Praśastapāda appeals to the same three conditions to define a proper reason as those used in the three forms of a reason. And finally, he identifies and classifies specious reasons in terms of the failure of a reason to satisfy one or other of the three forms.

The question of whether the deductively valid canonical syllogism spread from Dignāga to Praśastapāda, or from Praśastapāda to Dignāga, or from some other person to the two of them both has yet to be decided. Whatever the answer is to this question, it is clear that a deductively valid version of the canonical syllogism came to be adopted virtually by every classical Indian thinker and that it made its way to China, Korea and Japan through the spread of Buddhism.

It was not long before the ideas pertaining to the canonical syllogism became generally accepted not only by other non-Brahmanical thinkers, such as the Jains, but also by Brahmanical thinkers. For example, the Jain thinker, Jinabhadra (6th ce), a junior contemporary of Dignāga, wrote a commentary on the Jain thinker Bhadrabāhu where he took claims in the latter’s work and recast them in the form of the canonical argument as found in Dignāga’s work (Uno 2009). In addition, one finds that the Mīmāṁsā thinker Kumārila Bhaṭṭa (c. early 7th century ce) adopted, without special comment, a deductively valid version of the canonical syllogism. His thoughts on the matter are developed at length in the one hundred eighty-eight verses of his Śloka-vārttika’s (Gloss in verses) Anumāna-pariccheda (Section on inference). At the same time, though the Nyāya thinker Uddyotakara argued vigorously against many of Dignāga’s views, he nonetheless advocated a version of the canonical syllogism which is deductively valid.

In spite of the metaphysical differences which distinguished the various schools of thought, both Buddhist and Brahmanical, all thinkers came to use a naive realist’s ontology to specify the states of affairs in connection with the canonical syllogism. According to this view, the world consists of individual substances, or things (dravya), universals (sāmānya) and relations between them. The fundamental relation is the one of occurrence (vṛtti). The relata of this relation are known as substratum (dharmin) and superstratum (dharma) respectively. The relation has two forms: contact (saṃyoga) and inherence (samavāya). So, for example, one individual substance, a pot, may occur on another, say the reason, by the relation of contact. In this case, the pot is the superstratum and the reason is the substratum. Or, a universal, say treeness, may occur in an individual substance, say an individual tree, by the relation of inherence. Here, treeness, the superstratum, inheres in the individual tree, the substratum. The converse of the relation of occurrence is the relation of possession. In addition, the relation of pervasion (vyāpti), or what had also been referred to as the relation of indispensability (a-vinā-bhāva), can also be defined in terms of the occurrence relation: one superstratum pervades another just in case wherever the second occurs the first occurs. The converse of the pervasion relation is the concomitance relation (anvaya) and its contrapositive is exclusion (vyatireka). As a result of these relations, the world embodies a structure: if one superstratum, designated as H, is concomitant with another superstratum, designated as S, and if a particular substratum, say p, possesses the former superstratum, then it possesses the second. This structure is the one which underlies the classical Indian canonical syllogism.

Though the canonical syllogism is central to the development of reflection on argument and reasoning in preclassical and classical India, other forms of argument were also recognized as good. One form, as mentioned above, is reductio ad absurdum (prasaṅga). Others include suppositional reasoning (tarka) (Bagchi 1953) and a form of reasoning akin to what contemporaries would call disjunctive syllogism (arthāpatti) (Keating (ed.) 2020). At the same time, there are forms of argument, different from the fallacious rejoinders and specious reasons, which were also regarded as bad. They include arguments which lead to an infinite regress (anavasthā), mentioned above, as well as various forms of circularity. Finally, there are two important forms of argument: one peculiar to Buddhists, known as the tetralemma (catuṣkoṭi), and the other peculiar to the Jains (syādvāda).

## Bibliography

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Edition: Tatia 1976;
E-Text available online;
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Edition: Taishō Chinese Tripiṭaka 1569.
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English translation (chapter 1): Gillon and Katsura 2017.
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Edition: Steinkellner 2016.
English translation: Gokhale 1997.
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English translation: He and van der Kuijp 2016
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Edition: no published edition.
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Reference: PS chapter.verse
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