Supplement to Non-monotonic Logic

Robert Stalnaker's Counter-Example to Rational Monotony

Given a set of initial beliefs Γ, Stalnaker adopts the reading of “α dproves.jpg β” as “Given our initial set of beliefs Γ, if we learn α then (non-monotonically) infer β.” proposed in Makinson and Gärdenfors (1991).

Consider the three composers: Verdi (v), Bizet (b), and Satie (s), and suppose that according to our initial set of beliefs Verdi is Italian (I(v)), while Bizet and Satie are French (F(b), F(s)). Suppose now that we learn that Verdi and Bizet are compatriots (C(v,b)). This leads us no longer to endorse either the proposition that Verdi is Italian (because he could be French), or that Bizet is French (because he could be Italian); but we would still draw the defeasible consequence that Satie is French, since nothing that we have learned conflicts with it. Thus,

C(v,b) dproves.jpg F(s)

Now consider the proposition C(v,s) that Verdi and Satie are compatriots. Before learning that C(v,b) we would be inclined to reject the proposition C(v,s) because we endorse I(v) and F(s), but after learning that Verdi and Bizet are compatriots, we can no longer endorse I(v), and therefore no longer reject C(v,s). Then the following fails:

C(v,b) dproves.jpg ¬C(v,s).

However, if we also added C(v,s) to our stock of beliefs, we would lose the inference to F(s): in the context of C(v,b), the proposition C(v,s) is equivalent to the statement that all three composers have the same nationality. This leads us to suspend our assent to the proposition F(s). In other words, and contrary to Rational Monotony, the following also fails:

C(v,b), C(v,s) dproves.jpg F(s).

Copyright © 2016 by
Christian Strasser <>
G. Aldo Antonelli

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