Titus Lucretius Carus (died mid to late 50s BCE) was an Epicurean poet of the late Roman republican era. His six-book Latin hexameter poem De rerum natura (DRN for short), variously translated On the nature of things and On the nature of the universe, survives virtually intact, although it is disputed whether he lived to put the finishing touches to it. As well as being a pioneering figure in the history of philosophical poetry, Lucretius has come to be our primary source of information on Epicurean physics, the official topic of his poem. Among numerous other Epicurean doctrines, the atomic ‘swerve’ is known to us mainly from Lucretius’ account of it. His defence of the Epicurean system is deftly and passionately argued, and is particularly admired for its eloquent critique of the fear of death in book 3.
- 1. Life
- 2. The poem’s structure
- 3. Epicurean background
- 4. Physics
- 5. Ethics
- 6. Religion
- 7. Influence
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We know virtually nothing, beyond what little can be inferred from the poem itself, of Lucretius’ biography. There is just one contemporary reference to him (or near contemporary, depending on the date of his death): it is found in a letter of Cicero, written in 54 BCE, where he briefly agrees with his brother about the ‘flashes of genius’ and ‘craftsmanship’ that characterize Lucretius’ poetry.
What we can say for sure is that the poem is dedicated and addressed to a Roman aristocrat named Memmius, although it is not altogether certain which member of the Memmius family this was. Lucretius expresses a hope for Memmius’ friendship, but that does not rule out the possibility of an asymmetric client-patron relation, as distinct from one of genuine social equality.
The other biographical data are late and untrustworthy. They put his birth in 94 BCE, his death in either 54 or 51. (A case has even been made, by Hutchinson 2001, for dating his death later still, to the early 40s BCE). We can, at all events, say with some confidence that Lucretius wrote his poem in the mid first century BCE.
Because early Christianity branded Lucretius an enemy of religion, his life and death had to be depicted as appropriately wretched. Thus, according to St Jerome, he was driven mad by a love philtre, wrote poetry in his lucid intervals, and died by his own hand, leaving his poem to be edited posthumously by Cicero. This—apart from the last detail, which some have found credible—is a palpable fabrication. Its portrayal of wretched insanity is implicitly contradicted by Lucretius’ younger contemporary and admirer Virgil, who felt able to write of him in his Georgics, a didactic poem heavily in Lucretius’ debt, the celebrated lines (2.490–2) ‘Happy he who was able to know the causes of things (felix qui potuit rerum cognoscere causas), and who trampled beneath his feet all fears, inexorable fate, and the roar of devouring hell’. With these admiring words, Virgil neatly encapsulates four dominant themes of the poem—universal causal explanation, leading to elimination of the threats the world seems to pose, a vindication of free will, and disproof of the soul’s survival after death. But he also, in advertising Lucretius’ philosophical understanding as his enviable source of happiness, makes it implausible that the author of DRN had by this date acquired his later reputation as a suicidal psychotic.
Whether or not the poem is altogether in the finished state that Lucretius would have wanted, its six-book structure is itself clearly a carefully planned one. It falls into three matching pairs of books:
- The permanent constituents of the universe: atoms and void
- How atoms explain phenomena
- The nature and mortality of the soul
- Phenomena of the soul
- The cosmos and its mortality
- Cosmic phenomena
The sequence is one of ascending scale: the first pair of books deals with the microscopic world of atoms, the second with human beings, the third with the cosmos as a whole. Within each pair of books, the first explains the basic nature of the entity or entities in question, the second goes on to examine a range of individual phenomena associated with them. A further symmetry lies in the theme of mortality, treated by the odd-numbered books. Book I stresses from the outset the indestructibility of the basic elements, while books III and V in pointed contrast give matching prominence to the perishability and transience of, respectively, the soul and the cosmos.
In addition to this division into three matching pairs of books, the poem can also be seen as constituted by two balanced halves, orchestrated by the themes of life and death. It opens with a hymn to Venus as the force inspiring birth and life. The first half closes, at the end of III, with Lucretius’ long and eloquent denunciation of the fear of death. And the poem as a whole returns at its close to the theme of death, with the disquieting passage on the frightful Athenian plague during the Peloponnesian War: whether or not this, as we have it, is in its finished form, there can be little doubt that the placing of its theme itself somehow represents the author’s own orchestration.
There has been much dispute over this ending. Some judge it a poetically effective closure as it stands, others believe that Lucretius would, had he lived, at least have completed it with a suitable moral. The former party maintains that Lucretius by this point in the poem is liable to leave readers to work out the moral for themselves. On this, however, see further §5 below.
Epicurus founded his system in the late 4th and early 3rd century BCE, and it became one of the most influential of the Hellenistic age. Lucretius lived in Italy in a period when Epicureanism flourished there, especially in the area of the Bay of Naples, where a major Epicurean circle had formed around Philodemus. Philodemus’ library was rediscovered during the 18th-century excavations of Herculaneum (recent claims to have found remains of Lucretius’ poem among its badly damaged contents may be unduly optimistic). In addition, the main Epicurean school was still flourishing in Athens, despite the departure of most other schools from their metropolitan headquarters there, and it had other regional branches to which a Roman might equally well go for study. In any case, Epicureanism was by now one of the four leading philosophical systems that any aspiring philosophy student was expected to master. Romans who, against this background, became Epicureans included Cicero’s friend Atticus, and Cassius, later an assassin of Caesar. It therefore becomes both easy and attractive to think of Lucretius’ turn to Epicureanism as part of a trend among the Roman intelligentsia. Curiously, however, his poem shows few if any signs of contemporary philosophical or scientific engagement. We know a good deal about recent trends in the Epicurean school—for example, its sophisticated debates with the Stoics on scientific method and mathematics—yet we find little or no evidence in Lucretius’ poem that he is aware of, let alone engaged in, these developments. And although he includes a number of critiques of anonymous opponents, none of these opponents can plausibly be identified with anyone who lived in the two centuries separating Epicurus’ own lifetime from Lucretius’, including adherents of the era’s most prestigious school, the Stoa. It may, then, be more accurate to think of Lucretius as philosophically isolated, drawing his inspiration from Epicurus’ own treasured writings, and for that reason adopting Epicurus’ polemical targets as his own.
This alternative fits well with the apparent facts about Lucretius’ use of sources. So far as one can tell, the material on physics that he started from and reworked was all taken from the first fifteen books of Epicurus’ 37-book magnum opus, On nature. Thanks to the accidental survival in Lucretius’ book 4 of two alternative programmatic passages for the book, we can work out that what we call book 4 was initially planned to come directly after book 2, a sequence of topics which would have exactly reproduced Epicurus’ own in On nature, and that it was only in a later phase that he reorganised his material so that our book 3 came to intervene. This gives good grounds for the guess that the relatively small number of other demonstrable departures from Epicurus’ original sequence likewise represent the process by which, either while or after completing a first draft, Lucretius set about reorganising the poem’s contents into the six-book structure we possess today. So far as one can tell, his rewriting of books 1–3 was complete, but that of books 4–6 was still under way at the time of his death. (This is all argued at length in Sedley 1998.) Among other signs of incompleteness, the latter three books are very long, and would probably have been cut down to something like the length of books 1–3 in the final revision.
Because of the way he worked, there are grounds for confidence that, by and large, the central philosophical content of Lucretius’ poem closely mirrors what he found in Epicurus. His departures from Epicurus are more in the matter of sequence than of doctrine or argument. This adherence to Epicurus’ own text is further confirmed by the reverent tones in which Lucretius speaks of his master’s writings: ‘I follow you, glory of the Greek race, as in your footprints I now plant my own, not so much out of any desire to compete with you as for love, for my wish is to imitate you … You are our father, the discoverer of reality. You pass to us your paternal precepts, and from your scrolls, glorious one, just as bees sip all they can find in the flowery glades, we likewise feed upon all of your golden words—golden, and ever deserving of perpetual life’ (3.3–13).
At 1.921–50 (lines which later recur in part as the proem to book 4) Lucretius sets out his poetic manifesto, declaring the revolutionary novelty of his task. By this he means, no doubt, above all his task as the first poet of Epicureanism. Philosophical poetry had been pioneered by the early Greek writers Xenophanes, Parmenides and Empedocles, the last of whom Lucretius both reveres and imitates. But none before him had written poetry in defence of Epicureanism, or for that matter (and Lucretius may have this innovation in mind too) philosophical poetry in Latin.
There has been much discussion regarding the supposed unorthodoxy of an Epicurean writing philosophical verse, but it has not been established that Lucretius was breaking any school edict. Epicurus’ own hostility to poetry had, it seems, belonged in a tradition that went back at least to Plato, focusing on the morally harmful content of the poetry, by Homer and others, that played such a large part in the Greek educational curriculum. That versification as such was considered objectionable in the school’s earlier tradition has not been shown. Lucretius’ own explanation of his choice of a poetic medium is that philosophy is medicine for the soul, and that the charms of verse can function like the honey that doctors smear on the rim of a cup of bitter medicine, to persuade children to drink it for their own good. For, Lucretius loves to remind us, when it comes to fear of the unknown, we are all of us mere children, terrified of the dark.
A feature germane to philosophical prose which Lucretius retains and even enhances in his verse is the carefully tabulated order of a series of arguments for each demonstrandum, even though additional, more rhetorical features of his argumentative techniques have been rightly noted by scholars (e.g., Asmis 1983, Markovic 2008). Another is the defence of a hypothesis by appeal to analogy with familiar empirical data. This latter procedure, integral to Epicurean methodology, presents Lucretius with frequent occasion to develop rich and complex poetic similes—one of the most admired and appreciated aspects of his writing.
Book 1 sets out the fundamental principles of Epicurean atomism.
1.149–482. First comes, in effect, Lucretius’ ontology. Nothing comes into being out of nothing or perishes into nothing. The only two per se entities are body and void; all other existing things are inseparable or accidental properties of these (Lucretius’ own terms for which are coniuncta and eventa respectively). Two further items that might be suspected of existing independently of any concurrently existing body or void, (1) time and (2) historical facts, are argued to be in fact existentially parasitic on the presently existing world, and thus not after all per se existents.
1.483–634. Lucretius next turns to the basic truths of physics. Body comes in minute and physically indivisible portions, atoms—although Lucretius does not use this Greek loan-word, and prefers a series of circumlocutions such as ‘first beginnings of things’ (primordia rerum), ‘seeds’, and ‘matter’ (materies, derived from mater, ‘mother’), which serve his poetic purposes by evoking the creative powers of these primary particles. It is by their combination into complex structures that all phenomenal beings are generated.
Epicurus had attached enormous importance to the internal structure of atoms, which he held to consist of altogether partless magnitudes called ‘minima’. Lucretius condenses and largely edits out this doctrine. What little he does say in support of it is mixed in with his defence of atoms themselves (1.599–634), rather than exhibited as a separate part of the physical theory. Whether this policy reflects the theory’s difficulty for himself or his readers, the economies entailed by keeping the overall subject matter within the chosen six-book structure, or a theoretical difference from early Epicureanism, is destined to be a matter for speculation only.
1.635–920. Lucretius now turns polemical, attacking in sequence three Presocratic philosophers representing three rival physical systems as these had come to be classified in the Aristotelian tradition: monism, finite pluralism and infinite pluralism. Heraclitus, with his reduction of everything to fire, is the token monist; Empedocles, with his four elements, represents finite pluralism; and Anaxagoras, read through the lens of Aristotelian doxography as making all the ‘homoeomerous’ or ‘like-parted’ stuffs the elements, is treated as fundamentally sui generis. None of these thinkers had a significant, if indeed any, following in Lucretius’ day (even if Heraclitus had been accorded an honourable place in the prehistory of Stoicism). His choice of them as targets probably reflects his readiness to take over from Epicurus (most likely drawing on the latter’s On nature books 14 and 15, but see Montarese 2012 for a different view) the critiques which the school founder had felt it appropriate to launch in his own historical context.
1.951–1117. The final part of book 1 is a leap from the invisibly small to the unimaginably large. The universe is infinite, he argues, consisting of infinitely extended space and an infinite number of atoms. Some philosophers, he adds, mistakenly picture our world as formed around a spherical earth, itself located at the universe’s centre. Although Lucretius does not say so, the juxtaposition of these two themes was natural because the latter thesis—a version of the Platonic one that privileged our own world as unique—was the main rival to that of the universe’s infinity. Modern readers may therefore well sympathize with the motivation of Lucretius’ critique of it, even if at the same time regretting his too ready dismissal of the ridiculous image of animals walking upside down in the antipodes, where it is day when it is night here (1.1058–67).
Book 2 explains the nature of atomic compounds.
2.80–332. The opening exposition of book 2 descends into the details of atoms’ behaviour and qualities. They are in perpetual motion at enormous speed, since in the void they get no resistance from the medium, and when they collide they can only be deflected, not halted. Their weight gives them an inherent tendency to move downwards, but collisions can divert those motions in other directions. The result is that, when in a cosmic arrangement, atoms build up complex and relatively stable patterns of motion, which at the macroscopic level appear to us as states of rest or relatively gentle motion. Lucretius compares a flock of sheep on a distant hillside, which appears as a stationary white patch, even though close up the constituent sheep prove to be in motion (2.317–22). The most celebrated part of this account, however, is at 2.216–93 (see extended textual discussion in Fowler 2002), where Lucretius maintains that not only to explain how atomic collisions can occur in the first place, but also to account for the evident fact of free will in the animal kingdom, it is necessary to postulate a minimal indeterminacy in the motions of atoms, an unpredictable ‘swerve’ (clinamen) ‘at no fixed place or time’. Otherwise we would all be automata, our motions determined by infinitely extended and unbreakable causal chains. A striking resemblance to the indeterminacy postulated by modern quantum physics—which has also often been invoked in debates about determinism—has helped make this passage the subject of particularly intense debate. Analogously to various modern philosophical attempts to exploit quantum indeterminacy as a basis for psychological indeterminism, interpreters of Lucretius have long debated what relation he postulates between the swerve and free will. Some have read him as positing at least one atomic swerve in the soul to coincide with (and probably help constitute) every new volition. Others have drawn attention to his remark that the swerve is needed ‘so that cause should not follow cause from infinity’ (2.255) and argued that the theory aims merely to ensure that our present self is not the necessary product of our entire past atomic history. A wide variety of further variants have been proposed.
2.333–1022. After his account of atoms’ motion, Lucretius turns to their properties, explaining how a vast but finite variety of atomic shapes underlies and accounts for the vast but finite phenomenal variety that the world has to offer, without the atoms themselves possessing either sensible properties such as colours, or mental powers.
2.1023–1174. The final part of the book returns, symmetrically with the end of book 1, to the nature of the universe beyond the confines of our own world. This time Lucretius’ theme is the existence of other worlds besides our own, it being inconceivable, he argues, that in an infinite universe it should be only here that a world has formed. Moreover, he adds, worlds come and go, our own included. Both themes—the numberless plurality of worlds and their transience—Lucretius regards as helpfully damaging to the religious view of our world as a product of divine creation.
Book 3 turns to the soul and its mortality.
3.94–416. the soul’s constitution. The soul consists of two parts. The ‘spirit’ (anima) is spread throughout the body, while the ‘mind’ (animus) is the command centre, located in the chest. The soul in both aspects can be shown to be corporeal, Lucretius argues. Its characteristic sensitivity and mobility are explicable by the special combination of atoms that constitute it: it is a blend of the types of atoms constitutive of air, wind and fire, along with a fourth, ultra-fine type unique to soul. Although modern readers will find the details of this physiology hopelessly outdated, they can usefully replace Lucretian ‘mind’ and ‘spirit’ with, respectively, the brain and nervous system, in order to appreciate the enduring relevance of what follows, Lucretius’ argument that our conscious selves cannot survive death.
3.417–829. Given that it is atomically constituted, the soul must like every atomic compound be destined for eventual dissolution. Once the body dies, there is nothing to hold the soul together, and its atoms will disperse—as Lucretius argues with a massive battery of proofs (around thirty, the exact number depending on alternative ways of dividing up the text). For example, he argues, our mental development tracks that of the body through infancy, maturity and senility alike, so it is only to be expected that the body’s final disintegration should be accompanied by that of our mental faculties. There is therefore, contrary to the most favoured religious tradition, no survival after death, no reincarnation, and no punishment in Hades. For the consequent lesson that death is not to be feared, see § 5 below.
Book 4 moves the focus to the soul’s powers.
4.26–215. Lucretius starts by setting out the theory of simulacra—atom-thin and lightning-fast ‘images’ that stream from the surfaces of solid objects (or sometimes form spontaneously in mid air) and enter the eyes or mind to cause vision and visualization.
4.216–1059. The basic theory is then applied to sense-perception, and above all to vision and visualization, including dreams. (The non-visual senses are addressed too, even though, technically speaking, they rely not on simulacra but either on direct contact with their object or on other kinds of effluence.) Lucretius devotes a substantial section to describing optical illusions, which his atomic theory claims to be able to account for without sacrificing its fundamental position that it is never the senses that lie, only our interpretations of their data. Indeed, he defends this latter Epicurean paradox by deploying a classic self-refutation argument against the sceptical alternative: to deny that we have access to knowledge through the senses (its only possible entry route) is a philosophical stance that disqualifies its own adherents by depriving them of any possible grounds for its assertion (4.469–521).
Although cognitive mechanisms provide the main focus, a variety of other animal functions, including nutrition and locomotion, are covered by this part of the book. Among the gems is a digression attacking the teleologists’ mode of physiological explanation (4.823–57). To explain bodily limbs and organs on the model of artefacts, as divinely created for the sake of their use, is a misapplication of the craft-nature analogy. Artefacts were invented for the better fulfilment of functions that already existed in nature—cups to facilitate drinking, beds to improve sleep, weapons for more effective fighting. No analogous story can be told about e.g., the eye being created for seeing, because before there were eyes there was no such function as seeing.
Books 5 and 6 set out to explain the cosmos as a whole and its phenomenal contents.
5.91–415 expands the earlier argument that our world is no more than a transient amalgam of atoms. This finding is taken by Lucretius to be damning to creationism, for benevolent creators would surely (as Plato had maintained) have ensured that their product would be everlasting. Besides, he argues, the world is an environment too hostile to human beings to lend any credence to the creationist thesis that it was made for them. While other creatures seem to have it easy, we struggle all our lives to eke out a living. When the new-born human baby takes its first look at the world and bursts into tears, one can admire its prescience, considering all the troubles that lie ahead for it.
5.416–770. Following up on this theme, Lucretius now reconstructs the blind process of atomic conglomeration that gave rise to our world. He then continues with a matchingly non-theistic series of explanations of individual celestial phenomena. In true Epicurean spirit (here and in book 6 too; see especially 6.703–11), his favoured policy is to list a plurality of explanations of one and the same phenomenon without selecting one as correct. What matters is that, however many such explanations we acknowledge, they should be exclusively material explanations sufficient to render unnecessary the postulation of divine intervention. Being intrinsically possible, they must also be true, if not in our world, then at any rate somewhere, for in an infinite universe no possibility can remain unactualized (an application of the Principle of Plenitude). Lucretius is here relying on an Epicurean modal theory based on actual—not just possible—worlds, whereby ‘possible’ is equated with ‘true in one or more (actual) worlds’, ‘necessary’ with ‘true in all (actual) worlds’.
5.771–1427. Continuing the early history of our world, Lucretius envisages how life first emerged from the earth, and (an especially admired and influential reconstruction) how humans developed from nomadic hunters to city-dwellers with language, law and the arts. In this prehistory the exclusion of divine intervention, while rarely foregrounded, is plainly the underlying motivation. The fertile young earth naturally sprouted with life forms, and the organisms thus generated were innumerable random formations. Of these, most perished, but a minority proved capable of surviving—thanks to strength, cunning, or utility to man—and of reproducing their kind. This account, which has won admiration for its partial anticipation of a Darwinian principle, the survival of the fittest, is plainly using a kind of natural selection to account non-teleologically for the apparent presence of design in the animal kingdom.
Much the same anti-teleological program underlies the ensuing prehistory of civilization (5.925–1457). Each cultural advance was prompted by nature, and only subsequently taken up and developed by human beings. Hence, it is implied, no divine intervention need be postulated as an explanatory tool. No Prometheus was needed to introduce fire, which rather was first brought to human attention by naturally kindled forest fires (5.1091–1101). Language emerged (5.1028–90) because people started to notice how their instinctive vocal responses to things, comparable to animal noises, could be put at the service of their intuitive desire to communicate (for which infants’ pre-linguistic pointing is cited as evidence). The same part of book 5 is rich in other cultural reconstructions, including the origin of friendship and justice in a primitive social contract (5.1011–27), and of conventional religion in early mankind’s misguided tendency to link visions of the gods, above all in dreams, to their desire to explain cosmic phenomena (5.1161–1240).
6.96–1286. To conclude his poem, Lucretius works through a range of the phenomena that physical theorists were standardly called upon to account for: storms, waterspouts, earthquakes, plagues and the like. Once more the exclusion of divine causation undoubtedly motivates the account, the phenomena in question being nearly all ones popularly regarded as manifestations of divine intervention. Lucretius not only explains them naturalistically, but is ready to mock the rival, theological explanations: for example, if thunderbolts are weapons hurled by Zeus at human miscreants, why does he waste so much of his ammunition on uninhabited regions, or, when he does score a hit, sometimes strike his own temple (6.387–422)?
The De rerum natura is, as its title confirms, a work of physics, written in the venerable tradition of Greek treatises On nature. Nevertheless, Lucretius writes as a complete Epicurean, offering his reader not just cosmological understanding but the full recipe for happiness. Certainly to eliminate fear of the divine through physical understanding is one component of this task, but not the only one. According to the Epicurean canon, the fear of death must also be countered, and the rational management of pleasures and pains learnt.
Such an agenda manifests itself at various strategically significant points of the poem, in the form of Lucretius’ uplifting pleas for Epicurean values. The magnificent finale of book 3 (830–1094) is a diatribe against the fear of death, taking as its starting point the preceding demonstration that death is simply annihilation. To fear a future state of death, Lucretius argues, is to make the conceptual blunder of supposing yourself present to regret and bewail your own non-existence. The reality is that being dead will be no worse (just as it will be no better) than it was, long ago, not yet to have been born. This Lucretian ‘symmetry argument’ (see Warren 2004; also Death 2.3), which has enjoyed widespread discussion in the recent philosophical literature on death, is found in company with a whole battery of further arguments for acquiescing in the prospect of one’s own dissolution. Book 4’s treatment of sexual passion (1037–1287) includes a matching diatribe, comically denouncing the folly of enslaving oneself to any individual (1121–1191).
The proem to book 2 extols the Epicurean life of detached tranquility, portrayed as maintaining modest and easily satisfied appetites while shunning lofty ambitions and the disquiet these inevitably bring in their wake. And the proem to book 6, in praising the city of Athens for the gifts of civilisation, adds that these are, nevertheless, dwarfed by that city’s greatest gift to mankind, Epicurus and his philosophy. For it is Epicurus alone who has made life genuinely worth living, not only by releasing us from the torment of fear but also by teaching us how to manage our desires to the point where we can enjoy their genuine and lasting satisfaction. Lucretius’ entire history of civilisation in book 5 (1011–1457) can be read as strengthening this same motif (cf. Furley 1978): civilization has advanced because of man’s desire to better his lot, but to no avail, because every advance eliminates one source of grief only to replace it with another. The root cause of our troubles lies elsewhere, Lucretius is implying, and, even after civilization had reached its peak, it remained for Epicurus to bring that cause to light.
The Epicurean fourfold cure (tetrapharmakos) read: ‘God holds no fears, death no worries. Good is easily attainable, evil easily endurable.’ The first three of these maxims are fully represented by the poem’s moral commentary, but the fourth is curiously absent. How was evil to be endured? Epicurus’ recipe for accepting pain with equanimity lay in such strategies as concentrating the mind on past pleasures, and, where the pain was terminally severe, on its imminent eclipse by the painless state of death. Although this recipe has not always impressed Epicurus’ modern interpreters, it was widely and admiringly quoted by his ancient followers and sympathizers. It is hard to believe that Lucretius, with his deep understanding of Epicurean ethics, did not plan to rectify its glaring omission from his poem. If he did so plan, the obvious place to incorporate the final maxim of the canon would have been in connection with the frightful sufferings in the great Athenian plague, horrifyingly described in the poem’s closing verses. Those who believe that the poem is unfinished, and that Lucretius had he lived would have developed or restructured its final part, may justifiably suspect that the possibility of good cheer and optimism in the face of pain was the motif that he was saving for that role, wherever and however he might eventually have chosen to work it in.
Lucretius presents Epicurus’ chief achievement as the defeat of religio. Although this Latin word is correctly translated into English as ‘religion’, its literal meaning is ‘binding down’, and it therefore serves Lucretius as a term, not for all attitudes of reverence towards the divine, but for those which cow people’s spirits, rather than, as he thinks such attitudes should, elevate them to a joyful state of tranquility.
Epicurus had insisted on the existence of the gods, but the mode of existence he attributed to them has become a matter of controversy. They have only ‘quasi-bodies’, for example, and are constituted by nothing more than the wafer-thin and lightning-fast ‘images’ (Latin simulacra, see above § 4) which according to Epicurus enter our eyes and minds to become the stuff of vision, imagination and dreams. Some scholars take this constitution out of simulacra to describe a highly attenuated mode of biological being which somehow makes the immortal gods an exception to the rule that compounds must eventually disintegrate, so that they are able to live on forever, not in any world like ours (since all worlds must themselves eventually perish) but in the much safer regions between worlds. Others, who doubt such a realist interpretation, take the reduction of gods to simulacra to be Epicurus’ way of saying that these immortal beings are our own intuitive thought-constructs, our personal idealizations of the ideally tranquil life to which we naturally aspire, and that he is not committed to the further view that such beings must actually exist as living organisms somewhere in the universe. Epicurus’ recorded instruction to think of god as a blessed and immortal being does not help us choose between the two readings. It would probably be a mistake to assume that any text or texts of Epicurus were available to resolve the ambiguity definitively, similar ambiguities being an endemic characteristic of much religious discourse (the most famous case in antiquity was Plato’s account of the creation in his Timaeus, on whose interpretation his followers never agreed despite possessing his entire works). Lucretius shows signs of assuming the realist view of the gods (2.153–4, 6.76–7), yet his account of the origin of religion (5.1169–82) leans more towards the idealist reading. Disappointingly, the actual exposition of the gods’ nature that he promises us (5.155) never materializes. One may wonder whether he ever located in his massive Epicurean source the explicit account of the gods’ mode of being that he was expecting to find there.
Either way, what is not in doubt is that the gods’ role as moral ideals is paramount in the Epicurean system. And this is the function Lucretius too gives them, especially in the proems to books 1, 3, 5 and 6. The gods live a supremely tranquil life, never disquieted by either favour or anger towards us. By contemplating them as they truly are we can aspire to achieve that same blissful state within the confines of a human lifespan. But Lucretius adds another dimension to this theology: for as the poem progresses Epicurus himself is increasingly presented as a god. In itself this apotheosis is probably consistent with Epicurean theology: Epicurus did after all attain the same morally paradigmatic status which characterizes the gods. But in the proem to book 5 Epicurus is permitted to go beyond this paradigmatic role, and to become a heroic benefactor of mankind. Here Lucretius follows a trend which had gathered pace after Epicurus’ own day, the rationalistic practice—associated with the name of Euhemerus—of explaining the gods as pioneering human benefactors whose service had been institutionally acknowledged by formal divinization. What Lucretius effectively asserts is that, on a Euhemeristic ranking, Epicurus is a far greater god than Ceres or Bacchus, held to have originally been the institutors of, respectively, agriculture and wine, and also a far greater god than the divinized Hercules. For Hercules rid the world merely of literal monsters like the Hydra, but it’s not as if there aren’t plenty of wild beasts left in the world to terrorize us today. Epicurus on the other hand has offered us real and permanent salvation from monsters, namely those truly frightful monsters that haunt our souls, such as insatiable desires, fears, and arrogance.
Another possibly Euhemerizing tendency, one that is an unsurprising feature of Latin poetry and, if only for that reason, to be found in the pages of Lucretius, is the use of gods’ names to designate items of special significance for human life, such as ‘Venus’ for love or sex, and ‘Bacchus’ for wine. At 2.598–660 Lucretius discusses the religious portrayal of Earth as divine mother, and concludes that if one is going to call sea ‘Neptune’, corn ‘Ceres’, wine ‘Bacchus’, etc.—as he himself indeed often enough does—one might reasonably also personify the earth as their mother, hence as ‘mother of the gods’. But, he adds in an important codicil, this usage is permissible only if one avoids the pernicious religious beliefs that such locutions imply.
The proems are the most original poetic compositions in the DRN, and one may suspect that the book 5 proem’s brand of Euhemerizing theology goes beyond traditional Epicureanism. The same suspicion recurs with even greater force when we focus on the proem to book 1. In it Lucretius prays to Venus, not only as the universal life force but also as ancestress of the Romans, begging her to intervene with her lover Mars and save the troubled Roman republic from civil strife. Although this choice of motif may owe much to Lucretius’ forerunner and model Empedocles, for whom Love or Aphrodite is the great creative force in the cosmos, it borders perilously on a betrayal of the poem’s central motif, that we should not fear the gods because they do not, and never would, intervene in our world. Readers, as they progress further into the poem, are no doubt expected to accumulate the appropriate materials for understanding the proem as in tune with the true Epicurean message, but there is little agreement as to how this is meant to be achieved. One possibility is as follows. The warlike Mars is not, as such, a true Epicurean god, but a popular perversion of the true divine nature, resulting from people’s projection of their own angry and competitive temperament onto this ideal being. If so, the prayer for Venus to pacify Mars is no more than the expressed hope that Romans will return to appreciating the true peaceful nature of divinity, which for an Epicurean like Lucretius is nothing different from their themselves striving to emulate this paradigm of peacefulness. The poem’s lesson will itself, if successfully taught to its Roman audience, be enough to answer its author’s opening prayer.
Lucretius was both admired and imitated by writers of the early Roman empire, while in the eyes of Latin patristic authors like Lactantius he came to serve as the leading spokesman of the godless Epicurean philosophy. His poem subsequently survived in two outstanding 9th-century manuscripts (known as O and Q), which following the poem’s rediscovery by the papal secretary Poggio Bracciolini in 1417 (for this fascinating story see Greenblatt 2011) became the basis of the Renaissance editions. It was through Lucretius, along with the Latin translation of Diogenes Laertius’ Life of Epicurus, that Epicurean ideas entered the main philosophical (especially ethical) debates of the age. However, despite his extensive impact in literary and philosophical circles—he is, for example, among the writers most assiduously cited by Montaigne—Lucretius struggled for two centuries to shake off the pejorative label of ‘atheist’. He became a key influence on the emergence of early modern atomism in the 17th century—a development above all due to Pierre Gassendi’s construction of an atomistic system which, while founded on Epicurus and Lucretius, had been so modified as to be acceptable to Christian ideology. Lucretius’ many admirers in the early modern era included Thomas Jefferson, a self-declared Epicurean who owned numerous editions of the poem.
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