Jan Łukasiewicz

First published Thu May 15, 2014; substantive revision Thu Nov 4, 2021

Jan Łukasiewicz (1878–1956) was a Polish logician and philosopher who introduced mathematical logic into Poland, became the earliest founder of the Warsaw school of logic, and one of the principal architects and teachers of that school. His most famous achievement was to give the first rigorous formulation of many-valued logic. He introduced many improvements in propositional logic, and became the first historian of logic to treat the subject’s history from the standpoint of modern formal logic.

1. Life

Jan Łukasiewicz’s life was that of a career academic and scholar, seriously disrupted by the upheavals of war in the twentieth century. Born and educated in Polish Austria, he flourished in Poland’s Second Republic, endured the hardships of war, fled ahead of the Red Army to Germany, and found a final haven in the Republic of Ireland.

Jan Leopold Łukasiewicz was born on 21 December 1878 in Lwów[1], historically a Polish city, at that time the capital of Austrian Galicia. Łukasiewicz’s father Paweł was a captain in the Austrian military, his mother Leopoldine, née Holtzer, was daughter of an Austrian civil servant. Jan was their only child. The family spoke Polish. Łukasiewicz attended school (classical Gimnazjum or grammar school, emphasizing classical languages) from 1890, completing in 1897 and beginning the study of law at the University of Lwów. Under Austrian rule the university permitted instruction in Polish. In 1898 he switched to mathematics, studying under Józef Puzyna, and philosophy, studying under Kazimierz Twardowski, who had been appointed Extraordinary (Associate) Professor there in 1895, and also Wojciech Dzieduszycki. In 1902 Łukasiewicz was awarded his doctorate in philosophy under Twardowski with a dissertation “On induction as the inverse of deduction”. Having achieved only top marks in all examinations between his school leaving examinations and his dissertation, he was awarded the doctorate sub auspiciis Imperatoris, a rare distinction, and he received a diamond ring from Emperor Franz Josef.

From 1902 he was employed as a private teacher and as a clerk in the university library. In 1904 he obtained a scholarship from the Galician autonomous government and went to study in Berlin then in Louvain. In 1906 he obtained his Habilitation with a piece on “Analysis and construction of the concept of cause”. As a Privatdozent in Philosophy, he was able to give lectures at the university, becoming the first of Twardowski’s students to join him in doing so. His first course of lectures, delivered in Autumn 1906, was on the algebra of logic, as formulated by Couturat. In 1908 and 1909 he obtained a stipendium which enabled him to visit Graz, where he made acquaintance with Alexius Meinong and his school. In 1911 he was appointed Extraordinary Professor, and continued to teach in Lwów until the outbreak of war in 1914. During this time his students included Kazimierz Ajdukiewicz and Tadeusz Kotarbiński, who would later become famous philosophers in their own right. He also in 1912 got to know Stanisław Leśniewski, who had however come to Lwów after studying abroad and cannot be counted as his pupil.

In 1915 the fortunes of war put Germany in control of Warsaw, and they decided to re-open the university, which had not been allowed to function as a Polish-speaking university under Russian rule. Łukasiewicz became professor of philosophy there. In 1916 he was dean of the Faculty of Arts, and in 1917 prorector of the university. In 1918 he left the university, being appointed Head of the Department of Higher Schools in the new Polish Ministry of Education, and after Poland obtained full independence he became Minister of Education in Paderewski’s Cabinet, serving from January to December 1919. From 1920 until 1939 he was, as was Leśniewski, a Professor in the Faculty of Natural Sciences at the University of Warsaw. In 1922/23 and again in 1931/32 he served as rector of the university. In 1929 he married Regina Barwińska.

The interwar period was most fruitful for Łukasiewicz. He was a leading figure, with Leśniewski and Tarski, in what became known as the Warsaw School of Logic. He made a friend of the only German professor of mathematical logic, Heinrich Scholz, and was awarded an honorary doctorate by the latter’s University of Münster in 1938. Other honors awarded him in this period were Grand Commander of the Order of Polonia Restituta (1923), Grand Commander of the Hungarian Order of Merit, a monetary award from the City of Warsaw (1935) and memberships of the Polish Academy of Arts and Sciences in Kraków, and the Polish Scientific Societies in Lwów and Warsaw.

Students whom he supervised through their doctoral dissertations were: Mordechaj Wajsberg, Zygmunt Kobrzyński, Stanisław Jaśkowski, Bolesław Sobociński, and Jerzy Słupecki.

At the outbreak of war in September 1939 the Łukasiewiczes’ home was bombed by the Luftwaffe: all his books, papers and correspondence were destroyed, except for one volume of his bound offprints. The Łukasiewiczes lived in provisional accommodation for academics. The German occupiers closed the university and Łukasiewicz found employment for a meagre salary in the Warsaw city archives. Additional financial support came from Scholz. Łukasiewicz taught in the underground university. From late 1943, fearing the imminent arrival and occupation of Poland by the Red Army, and under suspicion by some colleagues of being pro-German and anti-Jewish, Łukasiewicz expressed the wish to Scholz that he and his wife should leave Poland. As a first step to their going to Switzerland, Scholz managed to obtain permission for the Łukasiewiczes to travel to Münster. They left Warsaw on 17 July 1944, just two weeks before the outbreak of the Warsaw Rising. Following the 20 July 1944 bomb plot against Hitler there was no hope of them obtaining permission to leave for Switzerland. They stayed in Münster, enduring allied bombing, until January 1945, when they were offered accommodation by Jürgen von Kempski at his farm in Hembsen (Kreis Höxter, Westphalia), where they were liberated by American troops on 4 April.

From the summer of 1945 Łukasiewicz taught logic at a Polish secondary school set up at a former Polish POW camp in Dössel. In October 1945 they were allowed to travel to Brussels. There Łukasiewicz again taught logic at a provisional Polish Scientific Institute. Being unwilling to return to a Poland under communist control, Łukasiewicz looked for a post elsewhere. In February 1946 he received an offer to go to Ireland. On 4 March 1946 the Łukasiewiczes arrived in Dublin, where they were received by the Foreign Secretary and the Taoiseach Eamon de Valera. In autumn 1946 Łukasiewicz was appointed Professor of Mathematical Logic at the Royal Irish Academy (RIA), where he gave lectures at first once and then twice a week.

In his final years in Ireland Łukasiewicz resumed contacts with colleagues abroad, particularly Scholz, with whom he was in constant correspondence. He attended conferences in Britain, France and Belgium, sent papers to Poland before being expelled (with 15 other exiled Poles) from the Polish Academy in Kraków, lectured on mathematical logic at Queen’s University Belfast and on Aristotle’s syllogistic at University College Dublin. His health deteriorated and he had several heart attacks: by 1953 he was no longer able to lecture at the Academy. In 1955 he received an honorary doctorate from Trinity College Dublin. On 13 February 1956 after an operation to remove gallstones he suffered a third major coronary thrombosis and died in hospital. He was buried in Mount Jerome Cemetery in Dublin, “far from dear Lwów and Poland”, as his gravestone reads. Regina deposited most of his scientific papers and correspondence with the RIA. In 1963 the Academy transferred their holdings to the library of the University of Manchester, where they remain, uncatalogued. The choice of Manchester was due to the presence there as a lecturer of Czesław Lejewski, who had studied with Łukasiewicz in Warsaw and twice been examined by the latter for doctoral theses, once in 1939, when war intervened, a second time in London in 1954. Lejewski had seen the second edition of Łukasiewicz’s book on Aristotle’s syllogistic through the press: it appeared posthumously in 1957. In 2022 on the initiative of the Polish government his remains were repatriated and reinterred with military honors in Warsaw’s Powązki Cemetery.

2. The Influence of Twardowski

Łukasiewicz was one of Twardowski’s first students in Lwów, and was influenced in his attitudes and methods by his teacher. Twardowski was born and studied in Vienna, where he became a disciple of Franz Brentano, and was imbued with the latter’s passionate advocacy of philosophy as a rigorous discipline, to be investigated with the same care and attention to detail as any empirical science, and to be communicated with utmost transparency. In 1895 Twardowski was appointed Professor Extraordinary in Lwów. He found Polish philosophical life dormant and third-rate, and set about vitalising the subject and building its Polish institutions, at the cost of his own academic output. Like Brentano, he believed that a sound descriptive psychology was methodologically basic for philosophy, and like Brentano he advocated modest reforms in formal logic. Łukasiewicz, under the influence of Husserl, Russell and Frege, rejected any foundational role for psychology, and inspired in particular by the latter two, he carried the reform of logic far beyond anything Twardowski envisaged. He read Russell’s The Principles of Mathematics in 1904 and it influenced him considerably. The general attitude that philosophy could and should aspire to be scientifically exact was one that stayed with Łukasiewicz, though his estimation of the state of the subject tended to become more pessimistic than optimistic, and he advocated fundamentally reforming philosophy along logical lines.

Another respect in which Łukasiewicz continued the tradition of the Brentano School was in his respect for the history of philosophy, particularly that of Aristotle and the British empiricists. (He and Twardowski translated Hume’s first Enquiry into Polish.) Twardowski, who knew Bolzano’s work well, pointed out similarities between concepts in Bolzano’s and Łukasiewicz’s theories of probability. The respect for history also lay behind Łukasiewicz’s groundbreaking studies in the history of logic, notably his accounts of Stoic propositional logic and Aristotle’s syllogistic.

Łukasiewicz emulated and indeed surpassed Twardowski in his attention to clarity of expression. Qualified experts agree that Łukasiewicz’s scientific prose, in whichever of the three languages in which he wrote, is of unmatched clarity and beauty.

3. Early Work

In the years before World War I, Łukasiewicz worked predominantly on matters to do with the methodology of science. His doctorate, published in 1903 as “On induction as the inverse of deduction”, investigated the relationship between the two forms of reasoning, in the light of work by Jevons, Sigwart and Erdmann. Inductive reasoning, proceeding from singular empirical statements, attempts on his early view to reach a general conclusion to which a certain probability can be ascribed. But he soon shifted to the view that it is impossible to ascribe a determinate probability to a general statement on the basis of induction. Rather the method of the empirical sciences is to creatively hazard the thought that a certain generalization is true, deduce singular conclusions from this, and then see whether these are true. If one conclusion is not, then the general statement is refuted. This, an early formulation of the hypothetico-deductive method of science, anticipates the ideas of Popper by more than two decades, though expressed less forcefully. Łukasiewicz also anticipated Popper by stressing what he called “creative elements in science”, against the idea that the scientist’s task is to reproduce or replicate the facts.

In 1906 Łukasiewicz published a substantial piece, “Analysis and construction of the concept of cause”, which gained him his Habilitation in Lwów. It is significant both for its carefully argued method and for presaging themes that were to occupy him later. Taking concepts platonistically as abstract objects, Łukasiewicz rejects psychological, subjective and regularity accounts of causality and accepts that cause and effect are linked by necessity, which he identifies with logical necessity: “a causal relation is a necessary relation, and the relative feature […] due to which we call some object a cause, is the feature ‘entailing or bringing-about with necessity’.” The piece’s motto is Arceo psychologiam, “Reject psychology”, marking a clear break with Twardowski and Brentano, while the logical analysis is aimed at extracting the logical features of the notion of cause. It is a clear example of what later came to be called ‘analytic philosophy’, and shows Łukasiewicz bringing logical concepts to bear on scientifically central concepts, as he was later to do with his logical analysis of determinism.

An interest in probability lay behind one of Łukasiewicz’s two monographs published before the war, namely Logical Foundations of Probability Theory, which was written and published not in Polish but in German. In 1908 and 1909 Łukasiewicz visited Graz where both Alexius Meinong and Ernst Mally were also working on probability theory at this time, so it is likely that the book was written in German because their language of discussion was German, and also in order to ensure a wider audience. Łukasiewicz’s theory makes constructive use of ideas plucked from elsewhere: from Frege he took the idea of a truth-value, from Whitehead and Russell the idea of an indefinite proposition, and from Bolzano the idea of the ratio of true values to all values for a proposition. Consider the classical urn example, where an urn contains m black balls and n white balls. Let the indefinite proposition ‘\(x\) is a black ball in this urn’ be such that the variable ‘\(x\)’ may take as value any expression naming a ball in the urn: the variable is then said to range over the individual balls, and different expressions naming the same ball to have the same value. (Note that Łukasiewicz indeed uses the terminology, later associated with Quine, of a variable taking values, here expressions, and ranging over objects designated by said expressions.) An indefinite proposition is said to be true if it yields a true proposition (Łukasiewicz says ‘judgement’ for a definite proposition) for all values of its variables, it is false if it yields a false judgement for all values, and is neither true nor false if it yields true judgements for some values and false judgements for others. The ratio true values/all values is then called by Łukasiewicz the truth-value of the indefinite proposition. For true indefinites it is 1, for false indefinites it is 0, and for others it is a rational number between 0 and 1 (rational because only finite domains are considered). In our urn case the truth-value of the indefinite proposition ‘x is a black ball in this urn’ is \(\frac{m}{m+n}\).

On this basis Łukasiewicz develops a calculus of truth-values in which he can deal with logically complex propositions, conditional probability, probabilistic independence, and derive Bayes’ Theorem. The calculus of truth-values is used as a logical theory of probability, assisting us in our dealings with definite reality: Łukasiewicz denies that there can be a theory either of objective or of subjective probability as such. Two ideas from this short but remarkable work are worth emphasizing because they resonate with later ones of Łukasiewicz. Firstly, there is the idea of a proposition (in this case an indefinite proposition) being neither true nor false; secondly, and connected with this, of such a proposition having a numerical truth-value properly between 0 (false) and 1 (true). Łukasiewicz’s theory deserves to be better known: it continues and extends earlier ideas of Bolzano, his probability corresponding to the latter’s degree of validity of a proposition (with respect to variable components). Its chief drawback is that it is formulated for finite domains only.

Of all the works Łukasiewicz published before World War I, one most clearly anticipated his later concerns. This was the 1910 monograph On the Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle. It marked a crucial turning point in the development of the Lwów-Warsaw school. For Łukasiewicz it represented the first sustained questioning of the assumptions of traditional Aristotelian logic.

Łukasiewicz introduces the project of his monograph, a critical investigation of the legitimacy of the Principle of Contradiction (PC) as variously formulated by Aristotle, in the context of its critique by Hegel and the opportunity to re-examine the PC in the light of the development of mathematical logic from Boole to Russell. Łukasiewicz’s sources for the post-Hegelian discussion of the ‘logical question’ are Ueberweg, Trendelenburg and Sigwart. A more local background was probably Twardowski’s account of the absolute and timeless nature of truth.

Łukasiewicz distinguishes three different, non-equivalent versions of PC in Aristotle: an ontological version, a logical version, and a psychological version, as follows:

Ontological (OPC): No object may at the same time possess and not possess the same property.

Logical (LPC): Contradictory statements are not simultaneously true.

Psychological (PPC): No one can simultaneously believe contradictory things.

Łukasiewicz criticises Aristotle for on the one hand claiming PC cannot be proved, and on the other hand attempting an indirect or pragmatic “proof”. In partial agreement with the tradition according to which PC is not the cornerstone or basic principle of logic, Łukasiewicz claims that its status is less secure than some other logical propositions, and that its function is principally to serve as a pragmatic norm. Nevertheless, in an Appendix to the book he gives a formal derivation of one version of PC from other assumptions. This shows that PC is as it were just one logical theorem among others, a statement that would raise few eyebrows today but was fairly radical in its day. Among the assumptions used in the derivation is a version of the Principle of Bivalence, that every proposition is either true or false and none is both, so the derivation of PC is not after all such a surprise.

Łukasiewicz described himself later as attempting in the monograph to devise a “non-Aristotelian logic” but admits that he did not succeed, principally because at this stage he was not prepared to reject the principle of bivalence. It may well be Meinong’s influence at work when Łukasiewicz comes to give his natural-language renderings of the symbolism of Couturat’s algebra of logic in the Appendix. There is little or no trace of the propositional logic that Łukasiewicz was to make very much his own: the renderings are clumsily object-theoretic: the constant ‘0’ for example, which might be naturally construed as a constant false proposition (and is so in later Łukasiewicz) is rendered as “the object that does not exist”. This is one reason why Łukasiewicz’s formal work in the Appendix to the 1910 work appears relatively archaic. While the variable letters like \(a, b\) etc. “signify affirmative statements” and their negations \(a', b'\) etc. “signify negative statements”, and in practice do work like propositional variables and their negations in modern propositional logic, Łukasiewicz’s renderings of them are curiously hybrid: ‘\(a\)’ is rendered as ‘\(X\) contains \(a\)’ and ‘\(a'\)’ as ‘\(X\) contains no \(a\)’, while ‘1’ signifies ‘\(X\) is an object’ and ‘0’ signifies ‘\(X\) is not an object’. This is all very confused, and by no means a classical sentential logic in intent, even if it works like one in practice.

While not in itself a success, the book shows Łukasiewicz on the threshold of his later logical breakthroughs. It was read in 1911 by the young Leśniewski, who sought against Łukasiewicz to prove OPC, and who first introduced himself in 1912 on Łukasiewicz’s doorstep with the words, “I am Leśniewski, and I have come to show you the proofs of an article I have written against you.” The book also contains a brief discussion of Russell’s Paradox, and it was reading this that inspired Leśniewski to become a logician, intent on providing a paradox-free logical foundation for mathematics. The book promoted further discussion in Lwów: Kotarbiński wrote in defense of Aristotle’s idea, discussed by Łukasiewicz, that a statement about future contingent events may lack a truth-value before the event and only gain one afterwards, while Leśniewski wrote in opposition to this and brought Kotarbiński round to his own view (which agreed with earlier views of Twardowski and later ones of Tarski) that truth is timeless, or as Leśniewski expressed it, both eternal and sempiternal. Łukasiewicz was soon to side with the earlier Kotarbiński, and in so doing to make his most famous discovery, that of many-valued logic.

4. Propositional Logic

4.1 Discoveries in Propositional Logic

Łukasiewicz came across propositional logic, which he originally followed Whitehead and Russell in calling ‘theory of deduction’, in their work and also in that of Frege. In 1921 Łukasiewicz published a ground-clearing article, “Two-Valued Logic”, in which he brought together results in the algebra of logic governing the two truth-values true and false, which, like Frege, Łukasiewicz construed as what sentences or propositions denoted, but for which, unlike Frege, he introduced constant propositional symbols ‘1’ and ‘0’. He intended it as the first part of a monograph on three-valued logic, which however was never completed, probably because Łukasiewicz became dissatisfied with the rather hybrid approach which was already being outdated by his rapid development. The article is notable for several innovations. Using a symbolism derived from those of Couturat and Peirce, it introduces the idea of axiomatic rejection alongside that of axiomatic assertion, which latter was of course familiar from Frege, Whitehead and Russell. The constants ‘0’ and ‘1’ also occur in asserted and rejected formulas, in effect setting up an object-language version of truth-tables. To show this we use Łukasiewicz’s later parenthesis-free notation (see the supplementary document (Łukasiewicz’s Parenthesis-Free or Polish Notation) and his symbols ‘\(\vdash\)’ for assertion and ‘\(\dashv\)’ for rejection, to be read respectively as “I assert” and “I reject”. The first principles of logic are simply \({\vdash}1\) and \({\dashv}0\) but to indicate the tabulation for implication the following principles must be adhered to: \({\vdash}C00, {\vdash}C01, {\dashv}C10, {\vdash}C11\). When Łukasiewicz employed propositional variables, he quantified them in the manner of Peirce, using ‘\(\Pi\)’ for the universal and ‘\(\Sigma\)’ for the particular quantifier.

Łukasiewicz and his students made the study of propositional calculi very much their own: the results obtained between 1920 and 1930 were published in a 1930 joint paper of Łukasiewicz and Tarski, “Untersuchungen über den Aussagenkalkül”. Work proceeded on both classical (bivalent) and many-valued calculi. The clearest and most complete demonstration of how Łukasiewicz in his maturity treated classical propositional calculus comes in his 1929 student textbook, based on lecture notes, Elements of Mathematical Logic. The system, following Frege, is based on implication \((C)\) and negation \((N)\) alone, with the elegant axiom set

\[ \begin{align} &CCpqCCqrCpr \\ &CCNppp \\ &CpCNpq \end{align} \]

and three rules of inference: modus ponens, a rule of uniform substitution of formulas for propositional variables, and a rule of definitional replacement. On this basis, and using an extremely compressed linear notation for proofs which is at the opposite extreme of Frege’s space-occupying proofs, Łukasiewicz proves around 140 theorems in a mere 19 pages.

Łukasiewicz, aided and abetted by students and colleagues, not just Tarski but also Adolf Lindenbaum, Jerzy Słupecki, Bolesław Sobociński, Mordechaj Wajsberg and others, investigated not only the full (functionally complete) propositional calculus, with different sets of connectives as basic, including the Sheffer functor D, but also partial calculi, in particular the pure implicational calculus (based on C alone) and the pure equivalential calculus (based on E alone). They strove to find axioms sets satisfying a number of normative criteria: axioms should be as few as possible, as short as possible, independent, with as few primitives as possible. Undoubtedly there was a competitive element to the search for ever better axiom systems, in particular in the attempt to find single axioms for various systems, and the exercise has been smiled upon or even belittled as a mere “sport”, but the Polish preoccupation with improving axiom systems was a search for logical perfection, an illustration of what Jan Woleński has termed “logic for logic’s sake”. At one time it was thought, not without some justification, that only Poles could compete. When Tarski once congratulated the American logician Emil Post on being the only non-Pole to make fundamental contributions to propositional logic, Post replied that he had been born in Augustów and his mother came from Białystok. Later, Łukasiewicz was to find in the Irish mathematician Carew Meredith a worthy non-Pole who could outdo even the Poles in the brevity of his axioms (see Meredith 1953).

Łukasiewicz used many-valued matrices to establish the independence of logical axioms in systems of Frege, Russell and others. He proved the completeness of full, implicational and equivalential calculi, and proved that the equivalential calculus could be based on the single axiom \(EEpqErqEpr\), with substitution and detachment for equivalence, and showed further that no shorter axiom could be the sole axiom of the system. Tarski showed in 1925 that the pure implicational calculus could be based on a single axiom, but a series of improvements by Wajsberg and Łukasiewicz led to the latter’s discovering in 1936 that the formula \(CCCpqrCCrpCsp\) could serve as single axiom and that no shorter axiom would suffice, though the publication of this result had to wait until 1948.

4.2 Variable Propositional Functors

Standard propositional calculus employs neither quantifiers nor variable functors, that is, functors of one or more places taking propositional arguments, but which unlike such constant functors as \(N\) or \(C\) do not have a fixed meaning. Such variable functors act like the predicates of first-order predicate logic except for taking propositional rather than nominal arguments. They thus add to the expressive power of the logic. Leśniewski added both quantifiers and bound propositional and functorial variables to propositional logic, and called the resulting theory protothetic. Leaving prefixed universal quantifiers tacit, it is a thesis of protothetic that

\[ \begin{align} & CEpqC\delta p \delta q \end{align} \]

where \(\delta\) is a one-place propositional functor, out of the same syntactic stable as negation or necessity. This thesis is an expression of the law of extensionality for propositional expressions. If \(p\) and \(q\) are replaced by complex expressions \(x\) and \(y\) the thesis can be used to enable definitions to be given in the implicational form \(C\delta x\delta y\).

If \(\delta\) is replaced by the first part of a complex expression, e.g., \(Cq\) or \(CCq0\), then simply adjoining a variable such as \(p\) to give \(Cqp\), \(CCq0p\), is straightforward. But if the “gap” where the variable is to go is not at the end, such as \(Cpq\), or if the variable is to be inserted more than once, as \(CCp0p\), this simple replacement procedure will not work. Leśniewski got around the problem by introducing auxiliary definitions which maneuvered the required variable slot into the right position with only one occurrence. But Łukasiewicz found this procedure unintuitive and wasteful. His preference—which in fact echoes the practice of Frege—was to allow any context in which a single propositional variable is free to serve as a substituend for a functor like \(\delta\), and mark the places into which the argument of \(\delta\) was to be slotted with an apostrophe, so in our examples \(C \apos q\), \(CC\apos 0 \apos\). This more liberal “substitution with apostrophe” allows definitions to be given a satisfyingly simple implicational form. For example, in propositional calculus based on implication and the propositional constant 0, negation can be defined simply by \(C\delta Np\delta Cp0\). The use of variable functors with liberal substitution enables a number of principles of propositional logic to be given startlingly compressed and elegant formulations, for example the principle of bivalence in the form

\[ \begin{align} & C\delta 0C\delta C00 \delta p \end{align} \]

which can be read as “if something is true of a false proposition then if it true of a true proposition, it is true of any proposition” (C00 is a true proposition). The supreme achievements of compression using variable functors were made by Meredith, who showed (as quoted by Łukasiewicz, referring to an apparently unpublished paper) that the whole of classical propositional logic with variable functors can be based on the single axiom

\[ \begin{align} & C\delta pC\delta Np\delta q. \end{align} \]

More astonishingly, Meredith (1951) showed that the whole of bivalent propositional calculus with quantifiers and variable functors can be deduced, using substitution, detachment and quantifier rules, from the single axiomatic formula

\[ \begin{align} & C\delta \delta 0\delta p. \end{align} \]

Łukasiewicz admiringly described this feat as “a masterpiece of the art of deduction”.

4.3 Intuitionistic Logic

Łukasiewicz was interested in intuitionistic logic, not least because, like his own, it rejected the law of excluded middle. In a late article published in 1952, he gave an elegant axiomatization with ten axioms, using the letters \(F\), \(T\) and \(O\) for the intuitionist connectives of implication, conjunction and disjunction respectively, in order to obviate clashes caused by “competition” for the connectives, though interestingly he kept the usual negation for both systems. He then showed how to define classical implication as \(NTpNq\), formulated this definition using a variable functor as the implication

\[ \begin{align} & F\delta NTpNq\delta Cpq \end{align} \]

and proved that in this version classical bivalent logic based on \(C\) and \(N\) is contained in intuitionistic logic, provided that detachment is confined to \(C\)-\(N\) formulas only. Classical conjunction and disjunction can be defined in the usual way as \(NCpNq\) and \(CNpq\) respectively. By differentiating intuitionistic from classical connectives his perspective reverses the usual one that intuitionistic propositional calculus is poorer in theorems than classical: in Łukasiewicz’s formulation it is the other way around.

5. Many-Valued Logic

5.1 Possibility and the Third Value

Łukasiewicz’s most celebrated achievement was his development of many-valued logics. This revolutionary development came in the context of discussing modality, in particular possibility. To modern logicians, used to the idea of modal logic being grafted onto classical bivalent logic, this may seem odd. But let us consider how Łukasiewicz arrived at the idea. If \(p\) be any proposition, let \(Lp\) notate that it is necessary that \(p\) and \(Mp\) that it is possible that \(p\). The two modal operators are connected by the usual equivalence \(ENLpMNp\). Everyone accepts the implications \(CLpp\) and \(CpMp\). Łukasiewicz supposes one accepts also the converse implications \(CpLp\) and \(CMpp\), as one would from a deterministic point of view. That gives the equivalences \(EpLp\) and \(EpMp\), which effectively collapse modal distinctions. Now add in the idea that possibility is two-sided: if something is possible, then so is its negation: \(EMpMNp\). From these it immediately follows that \(EpNp\), and this is paradoxical in two-valued logic. The way out, as Łukasiewicz portrays it, is to uncollapse the modal distinctions, not by rejecting any of the principles above but by finding a case where \(EpNp\) is true. We entertain the idea of the proposition \(Mp\) being true when \(p\) is neither true nor false. In addition to the truth-values true (1) and false (0), allow then a third value, possible, which we write ‘\(\tfrac{1}{2}\)’, so that when \(p\) is neither true nor false, it is possible, and so is its negation \(Np\), for if \(Np\) were true, \(p\) would be false, and vice versa. If \(Epq\) is true when \(p\) and \(q\) have the same truth-value, then when \(p\) is possible (we write ‘\(\tval{p}\)’ for the truth-value of \(p\), so \(\tval{p}=\tfrac{1}{2}\)) we have

\[ \begin{align} & \tval{EpNp} = \tval{E \tfrac{1}{2} \tfrac{1}{2}} = 1 \end{align} \]

This is, with minor changes, the way in which Łukasiewicz introduces the third value in his first published paper on the subject, which bears the title “On the Concept of Possibility”. This short paper is based on a talk given on 5 June 1920 in Lwów. Two weeks later a second talk in the same place was more transparently titled “On Three-Valued Logic”. In this, Łukasiewicz sets out principles governing implication and equivalence involving the third value. These in effect determine the truth-tables[2] for these connectives:

\(C\) 1 ½ 0
1 1 ½ 0
½ 1 1 ½
0 1 1 1
\(E\) 1 ½ 0
1 1 ½ 0
½ ½ 1 ½
0 0 ½ 1

Together with the assumed definitions of negation, conjunction and disjunction as, respectively

\[ \begin{align} Np & = Cp0 \\ Apq & = CCpqq \\ Kpq & = NANpNq \end{align} \]

this yields truth-tables for these connectives as

1 0
½ ½
0 1
\(A\) 1 ½ 0
1 1 1 1
½ 1 ½ ½
0 1 ½ 0
\(K\) 1 ½ 0
1 1 ½ 0
½ ½ ½ 0
0 0 0 0

Łukasiewicz proudly declares “that three-valued logic has, above all, theoretical significance as the first attempt to create a non-Aristotelian logic” (PL, 18; SW, 88). What its practical significance is, he thinks awaits to be seen, and for this we need “to compare with experience the consequences of the indeterministic view which is the metaphysical basis of the new logic” (ibid.).

5.2 Indeterminism and the Third Value

This final remark reveals the motivation of Łukasiewicz’s drive to replace the old bivalent logic with the new trivalent one. It was in order to defend indeterminism and freedom. In fact the idea had come to fruition some three years earlier. Having been appointed to an administrative position in the Ministry of Education in 1918, and being about to leave academic life for an indefinite period, Łukasiewicz delivered a “farewell lecture” to the University of Warsaw on 17 March, in which he announced dramatically, “I have declared a spiritual war upon all coercion that restricts man’s free creative activity.” The logical form of this coercion, in Łukasiewicz’s view, was Aristotelian logic, which restricted propositions to true or false. His own weapon in this war was three-valued logic. Recalling his 1910 monograph, he notes that:

Even then I strove to construct non-Aristotelian logic, but in vain. Now I believe I have succeeded in this. My path was indicated to me by antinomies, which prove that there is a gap in Aristotle’s logic. Filling that gap led me to a transformation of the traditional principles of logic. Examination of that issue was the subject-matter of my last lectures. I have proved that in addition to true and false propositions there are possible propositions, to which objective possibility corresponds as a third in addition to being and non-being. This gave rise to a system of three-valued logic, which I worked out in detail last summer. That system is as coherent and self-consistent as Aristotle’s logic, and is much richer in laws and formulae. That new logic, by introducing the concept of objective possibility, destroys the former concept of science, based on necessity. Possible phenomena have no causes, although they themselves can be the beginning of a causal sequence. An act of a creative individual can be free and at the same time affect the course of the world. (SW, 86)

Because Łukasiewicz was involved in government until the end of 1919, it took until 1920 for his discoveries of 1917 to be revealed to a wider academic public. Łukasiewicz returned to the subject of determinism for his inaugural lecture as Rector of the University of Warsaw on 16 October 1922. That lecture, delivered without notes but later written down, was reworked, though not in essentials, up until 1946. It was published only posthumously in 1961 as “On Determinism”. Distinguishing logical from causal determinism, Łukasiewicz claims that if a prediction of a future contingent event such as an action is true at the time the prediction is made, the event must occur, so the only way to rescue the agent’s freedom of action is to deny that the prediction is true, and assign it instead the third truth-value of possibility.

Here is not the place to go into the problems with Łukasiewicz’s argumentation. Suffice it to say that the principle EpLp need not be accepted by determinists, and that other logicians who have considered adding a third value to logic, such as (unbeknown to Łukasiewicz) William of Ockham, concluded that there was no reason to reject bivalence while upholding freedom. This is without even considering compatibilist views.

5.3 More than Three Values

Once the spell of bivalence was broken, a natural next step was to consider logic with more than three values. In 1922 Łukasiewicz indicated how to give truth-tables for the standard connectives in systems with finitely or infinitely many truth values, according to the following principles, where the truth-values are numbers in the interval [0,1]:

\[ \begin{aligned} \tval{Cpq} & = \begin{cases} 1, & \text{if } \tval{p} \le \tval{q} \\ (1 - \tval{p}) + \tval{q}, & \text{if } \tval{p} \gt \tval{q} \end{cases} \\ \tval{Np} & = 1 - \tval{p} \end{aligned} \]

In proposing logics with infinitely many values, Łukasiewicz was thus the inventor of what was much later (43 years later, to be exact) to be called ‘fuzzy logic’. Commenting on these systems in 1930, Łukasiewicz wrote

it was clear to me from the outset that among all the many-valued systems only two can claim any philosophical significance: the three-valued one and the infinite-valued ones. For if values other than “0” and “1” are interpreted as “the possible”, only two cases can reasonably be distinguished: either one assumes that there are no variations in degrees of the possible and consequently arrives at the three-valued system; or one assumes the opposite, in which case it would be most natural to suppose, as in the theory of probabilities, that there are infinitely many degrees of possibility, which leads to the infinite-valued propositional calculus. I believe that the latter system is preferable to all others. Unfortunately this system has not yet been investigated sufficiently; in particular the relations of the infinite-valued system to the calculus of probabilities awaits further inquiry. (SW, 173)

We will discuss this philosophical attitude below.

5.4 Axioms and Definitions

Once the truth-tabular or matrix approach to many-valued logics was established, it was natural to consider their axiomatization. Łukasiewicz’s students assisted in this. In 1931 Wajsberg axiomatized the three-valued system Ł\(_3\) by the theses

\[ \begin{align} & CpCqp \\ & CCpqCCqrCpr \\ & CCNpNqCqp \\ & CCCpNppp \end{align} \]

Wajsberg also proved a conjecture of Łukasiewicz that the denumerably infinite-valued system Ł\(_{\aleph_0}\) can be axiomatized by

\[ \begin{align} & CpCqp \\ & CCpqCCqrCpr \\ & CCCpqqCCqpp \\ & CCCpqCqpCqp \\ & CCNpNqCqp \end{align} \]

None of these systems is functionally complete: there are connectives not definable on the basis of C and N alone. Among those that are definable is possibility M: as early as 1921 Tarski showed that it could be defined as CNpp. In 1936 Słupecki showed that by adding a functor \(T\) specifiable as \(\tval{Tp} = \tfrac{1}{2}\) for all values of p, all connectives can be defined in Ł3. To axiomatize these functionally complete system the formulas

\[ \begin{align} & CTpNTp \\ & CNTpTp \end{align} \]

have to be added to Wajsberg’s axioms.

Adolf Lindenbaum showed that Ł\(_n\) is contained in Ł\(_m\) \((n \lt m)\) if and only if \(n - 1\) is a divisor of \(m - 1\), so if neither divides the other their respective tautologies properly overlap but neither set is contained in the other. Tautologies of the infinite-valued system Ł\(_{\aleph_0}\) are contained in those of all the finite-valued systems.

5.5 Second Thoughts on Modality: System Ł

From 1917, Łukasiewicz had been happy with the three-valued logic as formulating adequate notions of modality, with the noted preference for the infinite-valued system as optimally precise. At some time, probably around 1951–52, when he was working on Aristotle’s modal logic, Łukasiewicz changed his mind. There are a number of reasons behind the change of mind but the easiest to identify is Łukasiewicz’s concern that in Ł\(_3\) there are theorems of the form \(L\alpha\), for example \(LCpp\). Why should this be a concern, given that most “standard” modal logics recognize the principle that if \(\alpha\) is a theorem, so is \(L\alpha\)? Łukasiewicz gives two examples to justify the worry. If \({=}ab\) is the proposition that \(a\) is identical with \(b\), then basing identity on the two axioms of self-identity and extensionality

\[ \begin{align} & {=}aa \\ & C{=}abC{\phi}a{\phi}b \end{align} \]

then instantiating \(L{=}a\apos\) for \(\phi\) gives

\[ \begin{align} & C{=}abCL{=}aaL{=}ab \end{align} \]

and if we accept \(L{=}aa\) we are forced to conclude that \(L{=}ab\), which Łukasiewicz thinks is false (SW 392, AS 171), citing Quine’s (1953) example (now outdated because the number has changed) that while it’s true that 9 = the number of planets, this is not necessarily true, although necessarily 9 = 9. Dually, we have

\[ \begin{align} & CMN{=}abN{=}ab \end{align} \]

that is, if \(MN{=}ab\) then \(N{=}ab\). But suppose a is replaced by “the number thrown on this throw of this die” and b by “the number thrown on the next throw of this die” the antecedent can be true and the consequent false.

In the wake of much subsequent discussion of such examples by Quine, Kripke and others, these examples are hardly convincing, but there is another more general reason why Łukasiewicz rejects necessities as theorems:

it is commonly held that apodeictic propositions have a higher dignity and are more reliable than corresponding assertoric ones. This consequence is for me by no means evident. […] I am inclined to think that all systems of modal logic which accept asserted apodeictic propositions are wrong. (SW 395–6).

Since \(LCpp\) is a theorem of all the systems of many-valued logic to date, Łukasiewicz needed to come up with something new. This he did in his 1953 paper “A System of Modal Logic”.

Łukasiewicz begins the paper by laying out the conditions that a modal logic needs to satisfy. These include axiomatic rejections as well as assertions, as follows:

\[ \begin{align} & \vdash CpMp \\ & \dashv CMpp \\ & \dashv Mp \\ & \vdash CLpp \\ & \dashv CpLp \\ & \dashv NLp \\ & \vdash EMpNLNp \\ & \vdash ELpNMNp \end{align} \]

To obtain a system of modal logic respecting extensionality for propositional functors, Łukasiewicz takes Meredith’s axiom for \(C\)-\(N\)-\(\delta\) propositional calculus

\[ \begin{align} & \vdash C\delta pC\delta Np\delta q \end{align} \]

and adds one more axiomatic assertion and two axiomatic rejections

\[ \begin{align} & \vdash CpMp \\ & \dashv CMpp \\ & \dashv Mp \end{align} \]

together with rules of substitution and detachment for both assertion and rejection, to obtain his logic. The principles for assertion are as usual, while those for rejection are:

\(\dashv\) Substitution: Any formula which has a rejected substitution instance is rejected.

\(\dashv\) Detachment: If \(Cab\) is asserted and \(b\) is rejected then \(a\) is rejected.

From these he can derive all the desired principles and extensionality.

This is the logic Ł. Unlike standard modal logics, it has a finite characteristic matrix, as follows, where like Łukasiewicz we now replace ‘\(M\)’ by a new symbol ‘\(\Delta\)’, with 1 as the designated (true) value and 4 the antidesignated (false) value:

\(C\) 1 2 3 4 \(N\) \({\Delta}\)
1 1 2 3 4 4 1
2 1 1 3 3 3 1
3 1 2 1 2 2 3
4 1 1 1 1 1 3

The matrix was proved characteristic by Smiley in 1961. Functors of necessity (\(\Gamma\)) and conjunction are definable in the standard way. More intriguingly, Łukasiewicz notes that there is another possibility operator \(\nabla\) with the truth-table also given below:

\(K\) 1 2 3 4 \(\Gamma\) \({\nabla}\)
1 1 2 3 4 2 1
2 2 2 4 4 2 2
3 3 4 3 4 4 1
4 4 4 4 4 4 2

Taken in isolation, this is indistinguishable from \(\Delta\), but the two operators together interact differently, for while \(\dashv \Delta\Delta p\) and \(\dashv \nabla\nabla p\), both \(\vdash \Delta\nabla p\) and \(\vdash \nabla\Delta p\). Łukasiewicz compares them to twins which are indistinguishable separately but distinguishable together. Similar twins are the necessity operator \(\Gamma\) and its counterpart (with values 3434), and indeed the two intermediate truth-values 2 and 3.

The logic is very unlike Łukasiewicz’s earlier multivalent systems and also very unlike other modal systems. It is unlike his own systems in that it is an extension of classical bivalent logic and includes all bivalent tautologies. This is less surprising when we note that the four-valued matrices for the standard connectives are simply the Cartesian product of the standard bivalent matrices with themselves. It is the modal operators that make the difference. Several features make this very unlike standard modal systems. One is the complete lack of any truths, let alone theorems, of the form \(\Gamma a\), in line with Łukasiewicz’s rejection of truths of “higher dignity”. Other odd theorems are:

\(\vdash CK{\Delta}p{\Delta}q{\Delta}Kpq\)
all possible propositions are compossible

\(\vdash CEpqC{\Delta}p{\Delta}q\)
materially equivalent propositions are both possible if one is

\(\vdash C{\Delta}pC{\Delta}Np{\Delta}q\)
if a proposition and its negation are both possible, anything is

Łukasiewicz was aware of many of these odd consequences, but continued to uphold his system. Despite a number of attempts to make sense of the system, it has generally been concluded that because of these oddities it is not really a system of modal logic. If there is one dominant reason for this it is Łukasiewicz’s adherence to the principle of extensionality (truth-functionality) even for modal operators, which forced his account of modality to go multivalent in the first place.

6. History of Logic

6.1 Stoic Propositional Logic

Łukasiewicz’s third signal achievement, along with his investigations of many-valued and propositional logics, is his work in the history of logic. Indeed he can reasonably be considered the father of the modern way of doing the history of logic, which is pursued, to quote the subtitle of his book on Aristotle’s syllogistic, “from the standpoint of modern formal logic.” We saw that his early book on the principle of contradiction in Aristotle was relatively unsuccessful in its own terms, though it demonstrated his ability to go to the heart of the ancient Greek texts.

A decisive event in Łukasiewicz’s development as an historian of logic was his discovery of ancient Stoic logic. It seems he was examining a dissertation on the Stoics and to prepare for it he read original texts. He thereupon discovered that Stoic logic, contrary to the then standard opinion, voiced by Prantl, Zeller and others, was not a bowdlerized and defective Aristotelian syllogistic, but an early propositional logic, so that for example the first Stoic indemonstrable, “if the first, then the second; but the first, therefore the second” is simply modus ponens or detachment for the conditional ‘if’, and the variables, represented not by letters but by ordinal numerals, are propositional variables, not term variables. He first voiced this view, which is now of course standard, at a meeting in Lwów in 1923. A more systematic treatment of 1934, “On the History of the Logic of Propositions”, is a delightful vignette taking in the broad sweep from the Stoics, ancient disputes about the meaning of the conditional, Petrus Hispanus and Ockham on the De Morgan laws, the medieval theory of consequences, and culminating with Frege and modern propositional calculi. Modern appreciation of the achievements of Stoic logic dates from Łukasiewicz’s clarification and his unstinting praise of the Stoics, especially Chrysippus. Łukasiewicz appreciated that Prantl did not have the benefit of knowing post-Fregean logic, and despite Prantl’s erroneous dismissal of the “stupidity” of much Stoic logic did at least provide helpful sources. Nevertheless, Łukasiewicz’s judgement on past historians of logic is scathing:

The history of logic must be written anew, and by an historian who has a thorough command of modern mathematical logic. Valuable as Prantl’s work is as a compilation of sources and materials, from a logical point of view it is practically worthless […] Nowadays it does not suffice to be merely a philosopher in order to voice one’s opinion on logic. (SW, 198)

6.2 Aristotle

In Łukasiewicz’s logic textbook of 1929, after treating propositional calculus he does not go on, as one would nowadays, to expound predicate logic, but gives a brief formal account of Aristotle’s categorical (non-modal) syllogistic, presupposing twelve theorems of propositional calculus. This foreshadowed his 1951 book, Aristotle’s Syllogistic, by 22 years. This book, which revolutionized the study of Aristotle’s logic, had a long and interrupted genesis. A talk on the subject given at Kraków in 1939 was published in Polish only in 1946. In 1939 Łukasiewicz prepared a Polish monograph, but the partial proofs and manuscript were destroyed in the bombing of Warsaw. In 1949 he was invited to lecture on Aristotle’s syllogistic at University College Dublin, and those lectures formed the basis of the book, completed in 1950 and published the following year, his first in English. The first edition dealt only with categorical syllogistic. For the second edition, completed in 1955, less than a year before his death, Łukasiewicz added three chapters on the modal syllogistic, employing the modal logic Ł that he had developed in the meantime. The second edition was proof-read and indexed by Lejewski, and appeared in 1957.

Łukasiewicz’s understanding of Aristotle’s syllogistic is based on two specific interpretative principles and a general attitude. The first principle is that Aristotle’s syllogisms are not, as had traditionally been supposed, inference schemata, of the form ‘p, q, therefore r’, but conditional propositions of the form ‘if p and q, then r. This leads directly into the second principle, which is that there is behind the syllogistic treatment of term logic a deeper logic, that of propositions, and in particular a logic of opposition, ‘and’ and ‘if’, as well as (in modal syllogistic) ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’. Łukasiewicz takes this propositional basis to be occasionally invoked by Aristotle, for instance in the treatment of indirect proofs, but for the most part left as tacit, and he therefore regards it as legitimate to criticise Aristotle (unlike the Stoics) for not explicitly formulating the underlying propositional logic. Łukasiewicz’s trenchant and controversial views sparked a controversy over how to interpret the syllogistic. While the principles did win an early adherent in Patzig (1968), subsequent criticisms by Corcoran (1972, 1974) and, independently, Smiley (1974) established clearly that syllogisms are not propositions but inferences, and that Aristotle had no need of a prior logic of propositions. That view is now universal among scholars of Aristotle’s logic. In retrospect, it appears that Łukasiewicz was keen to wish onto Aristotle his own (Fregean) view of logic as a system of theorems based on a propositional logic.

The general attitude, present throughout Łukasiewicz’s treatment, is that Aristotle’s work is of sufficient precision and stature to warrant and withstand exposition using the most rigorous modern logical methods and concepts. In other words, the development of modern logic, while it may highlight lacunae and deficits of Aristotle’s logic, in fact brings out its merits, innovations and genius more clearly than previous traditional or philological studies. Łukasiewicz’s attitude has prevailed and is now pervasive among those studying Aristotle’s logic, whether or not they agree with his specific interpretative principles.

After an exposition of the basics of Aristotle’s treatment of syllogistic, in which he criticises earlier commentators and notes that Aristotle originated the method of rejected forms in order to show not just which are the valid syllogisms but also to prove the invalid forms to be such, Łukasiewicz presents his formalization of categorical syllogistic, based on the following logical expressions

Expression Meaning
\(Aab\) All \(a\) is \(b\) (or \(b\) belongs to all \(a\))
\(Eab\) No \(a\) is \(b\) (or \(b\) belongs to no \(a\))
\(Iab\) Some \(a\) is \(b\) (or \(b\) belongs to some \(a\))
\(Oab\) Some \(a\) is not \(b\) (or \(b\) does not belong to some \(a\))

Taking \(A\) and \(I\) as primitive and defining \(E = NI\) and \(O = NA\), the axioms, added to propositional calculus, are

\(\vdash Aaa\)  
\(\vdash Iaa\)  
\(\vdash CKAbcAabAac\) (Barbara in the first figure)
\(\vdash CKAbcIbaIac\) (Datisi in the second figure)

together with modus ponens and a substitution rule for term variables. This in fact was the system that Łukasiewicz had put forward in his 1929 textbook. As the second axiom indicates, Łukasiewicz is here following Aristotle in assuming that all terms denote. Rejected forms can be added: Łukasiewicz gives from the second figure

\[ \begin{align} & \dashv CKAcbAabIac & \text{and}\\ & \dashv CKEcbEabIAc & \end{align} \]

which together with detachment and substitution for rejection deliver all Aristotle’s 232 rejected moods. Łukasiewicz’s verdict on Aristotle’s categorical syllogistic is, that despite its narrowness, it is “a system the exactness of which surpasses even the exactness of a mathematical theory, and this is its everlasting merit.” (AS, 131)

The modal syllogistic on the other hand is little studied, according to Łukasiewicz, both because it falls well below the standards of perfection of the categorical, and for lack of a “universally acceptable system of modal logic”, which Łukasiewicz takes himself, with Ł, now to have provided. Łukasiewicz’s own treatment falls short of being definitive, though it provides material for later studies, and we shall not pursue it here. Interestingly, in Aristotle’s attempts in Book I, Chapter 15 of the Prior Analytics, to establish the theses

\[ \begin{align} & CCpqCLpLq \\ & CCpqCMpMq \end{align} \]

Łukasiewicz sees an Aristotelian endorsement for the idea of a principle of extensionality for modal operators as well as for categorical ones.

7. Philosophical Positions

In his early philosophy, the most significant and influential position adopted by Łukasiewicz is his anti-psychologism in logic. This was influenced by Frege, Husserl and Russell. It manifested itself terminologically in Łukasiewicz’s replacement of the traditional term sąd (judgement), used by Twardowski, by the term zdanie (sentence). This change of perspective and terminology was adopted by subsequent Polish logicians en masse. After 1920, Łukasiewicz is very sparing in his statements regarding philosophy and philosophical problems. His abiding commitment to indeterminism we have noted. His main comments and indeed ire are reserved for those who criticise the place of mathematical logic (or logistic, as it was then known) in philosophy and thought in general. He noted certain convergences in method and style between the Lwów–Warsaw School and the Vienna Circle, but criticised the latter for their conventionalism and rejection of all metaphysics and for their attempt to turn substantive problems into linguistic ones. Despite its abstractness, logic is no more detached from reality than any other science, and it is constrained to conform to aspects of the world. It was his conviction that determinism was false that drove his rejection of bivalent logic. While maintaining the metaphysical neutrality of logic, he admitted later in the 1930s that whereas he had earlier been a nominalist, he was now a platonist. The source of this conviction is stated at the end of his 1937 polemic “In defence of logistic”:

whenever I work even on the least significant logistic problem, for instance, when I search for the shortest axiom of the propositional calculus, I always have the impression that I am facing a powerful, most coherent and most resistant structure. I sense that structure as if it were a concrete, tangible object, made of the hardest metal, a hundred times stronger than steel and concrete. I cannot change anything in it; I do not create anything of my own will, but by strenuous work I discover in it ever new details and arrive at unshakable and eternal truths. (SW, 249)

Rarely has the motivation for platonism been so eloquently stated.

In the philosophy of logic, one of Łukasiewicz’s most deep-seated convictions, one that he shared with the other logicians of the Warsaw School, was that logic has to be extensional, that it is the study of the calculi not of linguistic meanings or psychological judgements but of the truth-values, whether just the classical two or more besides. His view is that sentences denote truth-values, and that logic is the science of such logical values, not of sentences (which is grammar) or of judgements (which is psychology), or of contents expressed by propositions, or of objects in general (ontology). He does not justify this position, but simply accepts and assumes it. As we saw, it has far-reaching consequences for his treatment of modal logic, forcing it to be many-valued.

In addition to the general attitude to scientific philosophizing that he derived from Twardowski, there is one identifiable source of some other of Łukasiewicz’s philosophical stances regarding logic, or if not a source, at least a point of convergent convictions. One is the rejection of a “supertruth” above ordinary truth. This comes out especially clearly in the modal logic Ł. The other is his liking for degrees of possibility intermediate between truth (1) and falsity (0), by contrast with the non-quantitative third case of possibility (or in Ł twin third cases). An exactly similar distinction between two kinds of possibility, “unincreasable”, without degrees, and “increasable”, with infinite degrees, can be found in Meinong’s massive 1915 treatise Über Möglichkeit und Wahrscheinlichkeit. Like Łukasiewicz, Meinong does not accord propositions a dignity of necessity higher than truth, and despite having the most ample ontology known to philosophy, Meinong’s object theory lacks objects described as necessary: he never mentions God, and ideal objects such as numbers are taken by him to subsist, not to exist or subsist necessarily. It is perhaps not incidental that on returning to Lwów after his visit to Graz, Łukasiewicz spoke in 1910 about the law of excluded middle, concluding that like the principle of contradiction it is not fundamental, and has practical rather than logical significance. He conjectured that it failed for general objects like the triangle in general, which is neither equilateral nor not equilateral. Meinong accepted such objects, which he called “incomplete”, and had in fact adopted the idea from Łukasiewicz’s teacher Twardowski. Łukasiewicz also regarded the application of the principle to real objects as “connected with the universal determinism of phenomena, not only present and past ones but also future ones. Were someone to deny that all future phenomena are today already predetermined in all respects, he would probably not be able to accept the principle in question.” The seeds of three-valued logic were already germinating in 1910, after the visit to Graz.

Meinong employed the many values of increasable possibility to give an account of probability. While Łukasiewicz’s procedure in his 1913 monograph was based on a different idea, he continued to be pulled towards the idea that infinite-valued logic might be able to shed light on probability. At the very latest by 1935, with the publication of a short article on probability and many-valued logic by Tarski, he knew that the most straightforward approach, that of identifying probabilities with truth-values between 0 and 1, would not work. The reason is that because of probabilistic dependence, probability is not extensional: if \(p\) is the proposition that it will rain in Dublin tomorrow and \(Np\) is its negation, the probability of the contradictory conjunction \(KpNp\) is 0, but if \(p\) has degree of truth \(\tfrac{1}{2}\), so does \(Np\), and so \(\tval{KpNp} = \tfrac{1}{2}\) in both Ł\(_3\) and Ł\(_{\aleph_0}\). Despite this, as late as 1955 Łukasiewicz could still muse,

I have always thought that only two modal systems are of possible philosophic and scientific importance: the simplest modal system, in which possibility is regarded as having no degrees at all, that is our four-valued model system, and the ℵ0-valued system in which there exist infinitely many degrees of possibility. It would be interesting to investigate this problem further, as we may find here a link between modal logic and the theory of probability. (AS, 180)

8. Legacy

Łukasiewicz once declared somewhat immodestly that the discovery of many-valued logics was comparable to that of non-Euclidean geometries (SW 176). Whatever their significance, Łukasiewicz’s hopes for such logics have not been realized in the way he anticipated. The semantics and pure mathematics of multivalued logics have flourished, leading to the development of MV-algebras in use for the algebraic semantics of Łukasiewicz’s logics. Infinite-valued or fuzzy logic has its own mathematics, and prominent among its developers is the Czech mathematical logician Petr Hájek, whose work is influenced by that of Łukasiewicz. Fuzzy logic is found in many practical applications, where it is used to deal with vagueness, inexactness, or lack of knowledge, whether these are the same or different. But Łukasiewicz’s championing of multivalence in the analysis of modality has been almost universally rejected, and the logic of modality has inexorably followed other paths, mostly bivalent, non-extensional ones. His final logic Ł has resisted consensual interpretation, and is regarded as at best an oddity and at worst a dead end.

The outstanding work that Łukasiewicz and his students accomplished in the logic and metalogic of propositional calculus, the Polish speciality of ever-shorter axioms and so on, now belongs to the bygone heroic age of logistic. Its results have indeed only been bettered occasionally by automated theorem-provers. On the other hand the emphasis on logical semantics, Łukasiewicz’s abundant use of truth-values notwithstanding, has shifted interest away from axiomatic virtuosity.

In the history of logic, Łukasiewicz’s pioneering studies opened up a new and more fruitful interaction between the past and the present, and the rediscovery and new appreciation of figures from logic’s past “in the light of modern formal logic” has continued to this day, though not all of Łukasiewicz’s own views on how to approach Aristotle or the Stoics have stood the test of time. His work also helped to inspire those historians of logic from the Catholic tradition in Kraków, most notably Jan Salamucha and Józef Bocheński, who applied modern methods to the investigation of logical problems and arguments from the history of philosophy.

During the heyday of the Warsaw School, 1920–1939, Łukasiewicz played a key role in educating the next generation of logical researchers and inspiring them with methods, results and problems. Even ideas he tossed off as exercises have changed logic, for example a 1929 suggestion to formalize the informal procedure of proof from assumptions led to Stanisław Jaśkowski’s 1934 system of natural deduction, in essentials the way logic is mainly taught to students today. The war irrevocably interrupted their work. Several of Łukasiewicz’s best students were Jewish, and were killed in Nazi death camps. In his exile from Poland after 1944, Łukasiewicz had scant opportunity to continue this pedagogical work, holding a research position in a non-teaching institution in a country with no logical tradition. His interactions with contemporaries were much more sparse, and those chiefly through correspondence. The one notable logician who interacted with Łukasiewicz at this time and whose work intersects with his in both interests (time, modality, many-valuedness) and attitudes (the importance of logic for philosophy) is Arthur Prior, who was the only major logician to adopt Polish notation, and who also expended more effort than anyone in the attempt to find a plausible interpretation for the system Ł. It is also fair to say that of the major figures among the Warsaw logicians, Łukasiewicz has received the least attention from commentators and historians. There are relatively fewer monographs and papers on Łukasiewicz than on other major figures of the Lwów–Warsaw School.

Despite such disappointments, Łukasiewicz’s achievements and inventions ensure him a permanent and honorable place in the history of mathematical and philosophical logic. Łukasiewicz was justly proud of the prominence achieved by Polish logicians between the wars, and fully deserves his commemoration by one of Adam Myjak’s four statues of prominent Lwów–Warsaw School members at the entrance to Warsaw University Library.


General Remarks

Titles have been given in their original language, followed in the case of pieces originally in Polish by the title of any published English translation where one exists, or by our English translation where none does. The bibliography of Łukasiewicz’s published writings is not complete, since a large number of his published pieces consist of one- or two-page summaries or abstracts of talks given at various venues, as was the Polish practice of the time. Of this kind, only those which are important for Łukasiewicz’s development or the exposition of his views have been included. Translations into languages other than English have not been included, with one exception, the 1910 monograph on Aristotle.

A comprehensive bibliography in Polish, compiled by the editor Jacek Juliusz Jadacki, is published in the collection Logika i Metafizyka (1998), which reprints most of Łukasiewicz’s essays, along with a number of incidentally interesting speeches, reviews and excerpts from correspondence, a biographical chronology, and a large number of photographs.


  • (AS) Aristotle’s Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic, 2nd ed.
  • (PF) Przegląd Filozoficzny
  • (PL) Polish Logic, 1920–1939, ed. S. McCall.
  • (PWN) Państwowe Wydawnictwo Naukowe
  • (RF) Ruch Filozoficzny
  • (SW) Selected Works, ed. L. Borkowski.
  • (Z) Z zagadnień logiki i filozofii. Pisma wybrane, ed. J. Słupecki.

Primary Sources: Works by Łukasiewicz


  • Z zagadnień logiki i filozofii. Pisma wybrane. [Topics in Logic and Philosophy. Selected Writings], ed. J. Słupecki. Warsaw: PWN, 1961.
  • Selected Works, ed. L. Borkowski. Amsterdam: North-Holland, 1970.
  • Logika i Metafizyka. Miscellanea. [Logic and Metaphysics. A Miscellany], ed. J. J. Jadacki. Warsaw: Towarzystwo Naukowe Warszawskie, 1998.
  • Pamiętnik. [Diary], ed. J. J. Jadacki and P. Surma. Warsaw: Wydawnictwo Naukowe Semper, 2013. [Contains diary entries by Łukasiewicz and a number of incidental pieces of biographical note by him and others.]


  • O zasadzie sprzeczności u Arystotelesa, Studium krytyczne. [On the Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle. A Critical Study.] Kraków: Akademia Umiejętności, 1910. 2nd ed., ed. J. Woleński, Warsaw: PWN, 1987. Translations: Über den Satz vom Widerspruch bei Aristoteles. Hildesheim: Olms, 1993; Del principio di contradizzione in Aristotele. Macerata: Quodlibet, 2003.
  • Die logischen Grundlagen der Wahrscheinlichkeitsrechnung. Kraków: Spółka Wydawnicza Polska, 1913. Translation: Logical Foundations of Probability Theory, in SW, 16–63.
  • Elementy logiki matematycznej. Skrypt autoryzowany, ed. M. Presburger. Warsaw: Wydawnictwo Koła Matematyczno-Fizycznego Słuchaczów Uniwersytetu Warszawskiego, 1929. 2nd ed., ed. J. Słupecki, Warsaw: PWN, 1958. Translation: Elements of Mathematical Logic. Oxford: Pergamon Press, 1966.
  • Aristotle’s Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1951. 2nd, enlarged ed., 1957.


  • O indukcji jako inwersji dedukcji [On induction as the inversion of deduction]. PF 6 (1903), 9–24, 138–152.
  • Analiza i konstrukcja pojęcia przyczyna. PF 9 (1906), 105–179. Reprinted in Z, 9–62. Translation: Analysis and construction of the concept of cause, in J. Jadacki and E. Swiderski, eds., The Concept of Causality in the Lvov-Warsaw School. The Legacy of Jan Łukasiewicz. Leiden: Brill, forthcoming.
  • O zasadzie wyłączonego środka. PF 13 (1910), 372–3. Translation: On the Principle of the Excluded Middle. History and Philosophy of Logic 8 (1987), 67–9.
  • Über den Satz von Widerspruch bei Aristoteles. Bulletin internationale de l’Académie des Sciences de Cracovie, Classe de Philosophie (1910), 15–38. Translation: On the Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle. Review of Metaphysics 24 (1970/71), 485–509; Aristotle on the Law of Contradiction, in: J. Barnes, M. Schofield and R. Sorabji, eds., Articles on Aristotle 3. Metaphysics. London: Duckworth, 1979, 50–62.
  • O twórczości w nauce, Księga pamiątkowa ku uczczeniu 250-tej rocznicy zalożenia Uniwersytetu Lwowskiego przez Króla Jana Kazimierza r. 1661. Lwów: Uniwersytet Lwowski, 1912, 3–15. Translation: Creative elements in science, in SW, 1–15.
  • W sprawie odwracalności stosunku racji i następstwa [Concerning the reversibility of the relation between reason and consequence], PF 26 (1913), 298–314.
  • O nauce i filozofii [On science and philosophy], PF 28 (1915), 190–196.
  • O pojęciu wielkości, PF 19 (1916), 1–70. Translation: On the concept of magnitude. in SW, 64–83.
  • Treść wykładu pożegnalnego wygłoszonego w auli Uniwersytetu Warszawskiego 7 marca 1918 r. Pro arte et studio 3 (1918), 3–4. Translation: Farewell lecture delivered in the Warsaw University Lecture Hall on March 7, 1918, in SW, 84–6.
  • O pojęciu możliwości, RF 5 (1920), 169–170. Translation: On the concept of possibility, in PL, 15–16.
  • O logice trójwartościowej, RF 5 (1920), 170–1. Translation: On three-valued logic, in PL, 16–18, and in SW, 87–8.
  • Logika dwuwartościowa, PF 23 (1921), 189–205. Translation: Two-valued logic, in SW, 89–109.
  • Interpretacja liczbowa teorii zdań, RF 7 (1922/23), 92–3. Translation: A numerical interpretation of the theory of propositions, in SW, 129–30.
  • O logice stoikow [On Stoic logic], PF 30 (1927), 278–9.
  • O znaczeniu i potrzebach logiki matematycznej [On the importance and needs of mathematical logic], Nauka Polska 10 (1929), 604–20.
  • (with A. Tarski) Untersuchungen über den Aussagenkalkül, Comptes rendus de la Société des Sciences et des Lettres de Varsovie, cl. iii, 23 (1930), 1–21. Translation: Investigations into the Sentential Calculus, in SW, 131–52.
  • Philosophische Bemerkungen zu mehrwertigen Systemen des Aussagenkalküls, Comptes rendus de la Société des Sciences et des Lettres de Varsovie, cl. iii, 23 (1930), 51–77. Translation: Philosophical remarks on many-valued systems of propositional logic, in PL, 40–65, and in SW, 153–78.
  • Uwagi o aksjomacie Nicoda i “dedukcji uogólniającej”, Księga pamiątkowa Polskiego Towarzystwa Filozoficznego, Lwów, 1931, 366–83. Translation: Comments on Nicod’s axiom and on “generalizing deduction”, in SW, 179–96.
  • Ein Vollstandigkeitsbeweis des zweiwertigen Aussagenkalküls, Comptes rendus de la Société des Sciences et des Lettres de Varsovie, cl. iii, 24 (1931), 153–83.
  • Z historii logiki zdań, PF 37 (1934), 417–37. Translation: On the history of the logic of propositions, in PL, 66–87, and in SW, 197–217.
  • Znaczenie analizy logicznej dla poznania [The importance of logical analysis for cognition], PF 37 (1934), 369–77.
  • Bedeutung der logischen Analyse für die Erkenntnis, Actes du VIII Congrès International de Philosophie, Prague (1936), 75–84.
  • W obronie logistyki. Myśl katolicka wobec logiki wspólczesnej, Studia Gnesnensia 15 (1937), 12–26. Translation: In defence of logistic, in SW, 236–49.
  • Kartezjusz [Descartes], Kwartalnik Filozoficzny 15 (1938), 123–8.
  • Geneza logiki trójwartościowej [The origins of three-valued logic]. Nauka Polska 24 (1939). 215–223.
  • O sylogistyce Arystotelesa [On Aristotle’s syllogistic], Sprawozdania PAU, 44 (1939), 220–7. Published 1946.
  • Der Äquivalenzkalkül, Collectanea logica 1 (1939), 145–69. Did not appear then. One offprint survived in Münster, and served for the translation: The Equivalential Calculus, in PL, 88–115, and in SW, 250–77.
  • Die Logik und das Grundlagenproblem, Les entretiens de Zurich sur les fondements et la méthode des sciences mathématiques 6–9.XII.1938, Zurich: Leemann, 1941, 82–100.
  • The shortest axiom of the implicational calculus of propositions, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, Sect. A, 52 (1948), 25–33.
  • W sprawie aksjomatyki implikacyjnego rachunku zdań [On the system of axioms of the implicational prepositional calculus], Annales de la Société Polonaise de Mathématique 22 (1950), 87–92.
  • On Variable Functors of Propositional Arguments, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, Sect. A, 54 (1951), 25–35.
  • On the intuitionistic theory of deduction, Indagationes Mathematicae. Koninklijke Nederlandse Academie van Wetenschappen, Proceedings Series A 14(1952), 201–212, repr. in SW, 325–40.
  • Sur la formalisation des théories mathématiques. Colloques internationaux du Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique, 36: Les méthodes formelles en axiomatique, Paris, 1953, 11–19. Translation: Formalization of Mathematical Theories, in SW, 341–51.
  • A System of Modal Logic, The Journal of Computing Systems, 1 (1953), 111–49, repr. in SW, 352–90.
  • Arithmetic and Modal Logic, The Journal of Computing Systems, 1 (1954), 213–9, repr. in SW, 391–400.
  • The principle of individuation, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supplementary volume XXVII (Berkeley and modern problems) (1953), 69–82.
  • On a controversial problem of Aristotle’s modal syllogistic, Dominican Studies 7 (1954), 114–28.
  • Curriculum vitae [1953], Philosophical Studies 6 (1956), 43–6.
  • O determinizmie, in Z, 114–26. Translation: On determinism, in PL 19–39, and in SW, 110–28.


  • David Hume, Badania dotycące rozumu ludzkiego [An enquiry concerning human understanding]; translation by Jan L. Łukasiewicz and Kazimierz Twardowski, Lwów: Nakładem Polskiego Towarzystwa Filozoficznego, 1905.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Agassi, A. and Woleński, J., 2010, “Łukasiewicz and Popper on Induction”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 31: 385–388. [Contains English translation of two small texts of Łukasiewicz on induction.]
  • Betti, A., 2002, “The incomplete story of Łukasiewicz and bivalence”, in T. Childers (ed.), The Logica 2002 Yearbook, Prague: The Czech Academy of Sciences—Filosofia, 21–36.
  • Childers, T. and Majer, O., 1998, “On Łukasiewicz’s theory of probability”, in K. Kijania-Placek and J. Woleński (eds.), The Lvov-Warsaw School and Contemporary Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 303–12.
  • Corcoran, J., 1972, “Completeness of an Ancient Logic”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 37: 696–705.
  • –––, 1974, “Aristotelian Syllogisms: Valid Arguments or True Universalized Conditionals?”, Mind, 83: 278–81.
  • Font, J. P. and Hájek, P., 2002, “On Łukasiewicz’s Four-Valued Modal Logic”, Studia Logica, 70: 157–82.
  • McCall, S. (ed.), 1967, Polish Logic 1920–1939, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Malinowski, G., 1993, Many-Valued Logics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Meredith, C. A., 1951, “On an extended system of the propositional calculus”, Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, 54 (Section A): 37–47.
  • Meredith, C. A., 1953, “Single axioms for the systems (C,N), (C,0), and (A,N) of the two-valued propositional calculus”, The Journal of Computing Systems, 1: 155–164.
  • Patzig, G., 1968. Die aristotelische Syllogistik, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck and Ruprecht, 3rd edition (1st edition, 1959); translation by J. Barnes, Aristotle’s Theory of the Syllogism, Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
  • Placek, T., 2006. “A Puzzle about Semantic Determinism: Łukasiewicz’s ‘On Determinism’ Years Later”, in J. Jadacki and J. Paśniczek (eds.), The Lvov-Warsaw School – The New Generation, Amsterdam: Rodopi, 171–185.
  • Prior, A. N., 1954, “The Interpretation of Two Systems of Modal Logic”, The Journal of Computing Systems, 1: 201–8.
  • Quine, W. V., 1953, “Three Grades of Modal Involvement”, Proceedings of the XIth International Congress of Philosophy (Volume XIV), Brussels, pp. 80 ff.
  • Schmidt am Busch, H.-C. and Wehmeier, K. F., 2007, “On the relations between Heinrich Scholz and Jan Łukasiewicz”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 28: 67–81.
  • Seddon, F., 1996, Aristotle and Łukasiewicz on the Principle of Contradiction, Ames: Modern Logic Publishing.
  • Simons, P., 1992, “Łukasiewicz, Meinong, and Many-Valued Logic”, in K. Szaniawski (ed.), The Vienna Circle and the Lvov-Warsaw School, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989, 249–91; reprinted in P. Simons, Philosophy and Logic in Central Europe from Bolzano to Tarski. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 193–225.
  • Smiley, T. J., 1961, “On Łukasiewicz’s Ł-modal system”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 2: 149–53.
  • –––, 1974, “What is a Syllogism?”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 2: 136–154.
  • Sobociński, B., 1956, “In memoriam: Jan Łukasiewicz (1878–1956)” Philosophical Studies, 6: 3–49. [Includes as an appendix Łukasiewicz’s Curriculum Vitae of 1953.]
  • Tarski, A., 1935/6, “Wahrscheinlichkeitslehre und mehrwertige Logik”, Erkenntnis, 5: 174–5.
  • Wójcicki, R. and Malinowski, G. (eds.), 1977, Selected Papers on Łukasiewicz’s Sentential Calculi, Wrocław: Ossolineum.
  • Woleński, J., 1994, “Jan Łukasiewicz on the Liar Paradox, Logical Consequence, Truth, and Induction”, Modern Logic, 4: 392–400.
  • –––, 2000, “Jan Łukasiewicz und der Satz vom Widerspruch”, in N. Öffenberger and M. Skarica (eds.), Beiträge zum Satz vom Widerspruch und zur Aristotelischen Prädikationtheorie, Hildesheim: Olms, 1–42.
  • –––, 2013, “The Rise of Many-Valued Logic in Poland”, in J. Woleński, Historico-Philosophical Essays (Volume 1), Kraków: Copernicus Press, 37–50.
  • Zinoviev, A. A., 1963, Philosophical Problems of Many-Valued Logic, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The author would like to thank John Corcoran and Jan Woleński for corrections and helpful suggestions.

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Peter Simons <psimons@tcd.ie>

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