Notes to Martin Luther

1. Research on the wider cultural significance of that upbringing and education has been summarized by Nicholas Boyle:

It has been calculated that, even excluding philosophers, 120 major literary figures writing in German and born between 1676 and 1804 had either studied theology or were the children of Protestant pastors. (Boyle 2008: 10.)

2. “A Scurrilous Attack Evokes a Response”, 1538, WA TR 3 no 3838/LW 54: 282:

I confess I’m the son of a peasant from Möhra, near Eisenach, but in spite of this I’m a doctor of the Holy Scriptures and an opponent of the pope.

Thomas Carlyle was later to use Luther’s supposedly humble origins to draw obvious Biblical comparisons:

I find it altogether suitable to Luther’s function on this Earth, and doubtless wisely ordered to that end by the Providence presiding over him and us and all things, that he was born poor, and brought up poor, one of the poorest of men. (Carlyle 1841 [1983: 156])

3. See Steinmetz 1980 for a discussion of the relation between Luther and Staupitz. For a general discussion of the intellectual context of this period, see Heiko A. Oberman 1977 [1981].

4. Cf. Against the Antinomians 1539, WA 50:473/LW 47:113: “Good heavens, I should at least be left in peace by my own people! It is enough to be harassed by the papists.”

5. Luther’s relation to Erasmus and humanism more generally is complex: for some useful discussion, see Trinkaus 1999 and Rex 2017b.

6. Thesis 13 of the Heidelberg Dissertation reads:

Free will, after the Fall, exists in name only, and as long as it does what it is able to do, it commits a mortal sin. (WA 1:354/LW 31:40)

Erasmus responds to Luther’s comments on freedom in his reply to article 36 of Exsurge Domine in Assertio omnimum articulorum M. Lutheri per bullam Leonis X. novissimam damnatorum: see WA 7:142–9, translated in Erasmus 1999, 76: 300–10; see also the German version published in 1521, Grund und Ursach aller Artikel D. Martin Luthers, WA 7:444–450/LW 32:92–4.

7. Erasmus’s title is multi-layered, as Smith (2011: 24 note 2) observes:

The very title, “Hyperaspistes”, gives an indication of the kind of philological play and bitter sarcasm that often permeated these exchanges. The term derives from the adjective meaning “protected by a shield” and implies that the work is Erasmus’s self defense. However, there is more to the term than that. Luther had occasionally referred to Erasmus as a “viper” (vipera in Latin, ἀσπίς in Greek), and Erasmus seems to imply that he is playing the role of a “super snake”.

See also the note on the title in Erasmus 1526 [1999: 96].

8. On the Jews and Their Lies, On the Ineffable Name and on the Lineage of Christ, and On the Last Words of David were all published in 1543, while Luther’s sermon from February 1546 was published posthumously as Admonition Against the Jews. For further discussion of Luther’s polemics against the Jews, placing it in a wider context, see Helmer 2019: Chapter 5. For a selection of relevant texts, and helpful introductory essays, see Schramm, Brooks, and Stejerna (eds.) 2012.

9. See Church Postils WA 10.1–1:531:

In temporal, human affairs human judgment suffices. For these things we need no light but that of reason. Hence God does not in the Scriptures teach us how to build houses, to make clothing, to marry, to wage war, to navigate the seas and so on. For these our natural light is sufficient.

10. See Sermon, 11 August 1532, WA 36:493:

For human wisdom and reason cannot go any higher or further than to judge and draw conclusions as its eyes see and it feels, or than it grasps with its senses. But faith has to draw conclusions beyond and against such feeling and understanding, and cleave to what is presented to it by the Word.

11. See Lectures on the Galatians, 1531, WA 40.1:607–8/LW 26:399 for the distinction between general and particular knowledge of God, and Lectures on Jonah, 1526, WA 19:206–7/LW 19:53:

Such a light and such a perception [of God] is innate in the hearts of all men; and this light cannot be subdued or extinguished.

12. See Lectures on Jonah, 1526, WA 19:206/LW 19:54:

[R]eason does admittedly believe that God is able and competent to help and to bestow; but reason does not know whether he is willing to do this also for us. That renders the position of reason unstable. Reason believes in God’s might and is aware of it, but it is uncertain whether God is willing to employ this in our behalf, because in adversity it so often experiences the opposite to be true.

13. See Disputation Concerning the Passage: “The Word Was Made Flesh”, 1539, WA 39.2:8/LW 38:244:

For as God has created distinct spheres in the heavens, so also he has created distinct kingdoms on earth, so that every matter and art may keep to its own place and kind and not be engaged outside its own centre, in which it has been placed.

14. See Lectures on the Galatians, 1531, WA 40.1:369 note:

Follow not the judgement of reason, which tells you that [Christ] is angry with sinners; but kill reason and believe in him.

(This is not translated in LW, but is in the “Middleton” translation, 1531/1575 [1953: 227].)

15. See Christmas Postils, 1522, WA 10.1–1:506:

All this is immeasurably far above, and contrary to, reason… In this God is seeking only that man may have the humility to bring his reason into captivity and be subject to divine truth.

16. See also WA 39.2:5/LW 38:242:

We would act more correctly if we left dialectic and philosophy in their own sphere and learned to speak in a new language in the realm of faith outside all such spheres.

17. See WA 39.2:12: “The syllogism is not allowed into the mysteries of faith and theology. Philosophy is error in theology”; and Disputation Against Scholastic Theology, 1517, WA 1:226/LW 31:12: “No syllogistic form is valid when applied to divine terms”.

18. See Lectures on Galatians, 1535, WA 40.I:412/LW 26:263:

When we theologians talk about “doing”, therefore, it is necessary that we speak about doing with faith, because in theology we have no right reason and good will except faith.

“The Right and Wrong Use of Reason”, 1533, WA TR 1, no. 439/LW 54:71:

[R]eason, when illuminated [by the Spirit], helps faith by reflecting on something, but reason without faith isn’t and can’t be helpful. Without faith the tongue utters nothing but blasphemies… But reason that is illuminated takes all its thoughts from the Word.

19. For a strikingly more ambitious reading of Luther’s view of reason, which is historically interesting but interpretatively implausible, see Heinrich Heine 1835 [2007: 32]:

In saying that his teachings could be contradicted only by the Bible itself or by means of rational argument, Luther granted human reason the right to explain the Bible, and Reason was thus acknowledged as the highest judge in all religious controversies. Thus arose in Germany what is called freedom of the spirit or, by another name, freedom of thought. Thinking became a right, and the authority of reason became legitimate.

20. See Richard H. Popkin, The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, who starts this classic study by referring to Luther on these issues (1979: 1–8). See also Rex 2017a: 224–229. The difficulty of interpreting scripture is a running theme in Erasmus’s response to Luther in Hyperaspistes, which emphasises that even Luther’s followers disagree amongst themselves.

21. See Praelectio in librum iudicium, 1516ff, WA 4:554:

When I was a monk they used to despise the Bible. Nobody understood the Psalter. They used to believe that the Epistle to the Romans contained some controversies about matters of Paul’s day and was of no use for our age. Scotus, Thomas, Aristotle were the ones to read;

Lectures on Genesis, 1535–1545, WA 43:94/LW 3:306:

After those who had devoted themselves to sacred studies had come upon commentaries of human beings, they not only spent most of their time reading the ancient theologians, but eventually also busied themselves with Aristotle, Averroes, and others, who later on gave rise to the Thomases, the Scotuses, and similar monstrosities;

and a Church Postil from 1522 WA 10.1–1:569/LW 52:166:

There is no greater reputation than that which is derived from the knowledge of Aristotle in the universities. Yet that reputation is false, for that knowledge is nothing; it is simply opposed to Christ and has arisen to destroy him.

For more on Luther’s efforts at curricular reform (undertaken alongside Melanchthon), see Kusukawa 1995.

22. See Sermon, 27 April 1522, WA 10.3:92; Church Postil 1522 WA 10.1–1:115; and Against Latomus, 1521, WA 8:127/LW 32:258:

Thomas wrote a great deal of heresy, and is responsible for the reign of Aristotle, the destroyer of godly doctrine.

On Aquinas’s general commitment to Aristotle, see “An Opinion about Thomas Aquinas”, 1532, WA TR 1 no. 283/LW 54:39:

This is the procedure of Thomas. First he takes statements [sententias] from Paul, Peter, John, Isaiah, etc. Afterwards he concludes that Aristotle says so and so and he interprets Scripture according to Aristotle.

For further discussion, see Gerrish 1962: 128–135, Grane 1969 and 1970, Pesch 1967, Janz 1983 and 1989, Marshall 1999. As is often noted, Luther’s criticism of Aquinas on justification is relatively infrequent, and it is more often other Aristotelian aspects of his thought that are singled out: see, e.g., Janz 1983: 59–61.

23. Daphne Hampson puts this point clearly, while referring to the wider literature on this issue:

[I]ustus and peccator are relational terms and we are involved in a relational understanding of what it is to be justified. There is a sense in which neither term refers to the inward “state” of the person. Certainly neither is to be understood as a quality which could be predicated of the human, understood as a substantial entity. On the one hand God, for Christ’s sake, holds the sinner to be just; he acquits us… Thus we may say that we are indeed to be considered fully just. On the other hand when the human is placed coram deo (before God), faced with God’s goodness he must necessarily judge himself a sinner. But again it is not so much that the human is a sinner in himself. It is not that there is nothing good in the human. It is simply that when one considers the nature of God, the human cannot bring anything to God, on account of which God could accept him. In relation to God, he must count himself a sinner. The human thus has a double sense of himself, as both fully just and yet also as a sinner. (Hampson 2001: 25)

24. See Luther’s Sermon on the Day of St. Peter and St. Paul (1519):

For it is true that a man helped by grace is more than a man; indeed, the grace of God gives him the form of God and deifies him, so that even the Scriptures call him “God” and “God’s son”. (WA 2:247–48/LW 51:58)

See V.-M. Kärkkäinen 2006 and Bielfeldt 2016 for helpful discussions of the “Finnish interpretation” and its implications. The papers collected in Braaten and Jenson 1998 give a representative discussion of some of the issues.

25. The doctrine of transubstantiation claims that there is a change of substance from bread and wine to the body and blood of Christ while the accidents of bread and wine remain; the doctrine of real presence or consubstantiation makes no such claim about a change of substance and merely holds that the body and blood of Christ is substantially present when the Eucharist is celebrated.

26. WA TR 5 no. 6419. Luther generally refers to Ockham with approval, calling him “my dear master” (Exhortation to All Clergy Assembled at Augsburg, 1530, WA 30.2:300/LW 34:27); see also Kleine Antwort auf Herzog Georgen nächstes Buch, 1533, WA 38:160.

27. For discussion of Luther in the context of the debates between realism and nominalism, and the via antiqua and the via moderna, see: Hägglund 1955, 1957; Oberman 1963, 1992, 2003; Vignaux 1971; McGrath 1985; Osborne 2002; Dieter 2014; P. Kärkkäinen 2017.

28. See also the subsequent thesis:

Free will, after the Fall, has power to do good only in a passive capacity, but it can always do evil in an active capacity. (WA 1:354/LW 31:40)

As Alfsvåg 2015: 52–3 notes, in the Assertio Luther went beyond the Dissertation, as

Here he not only declares “free will” to be a concept without factual reference, he even insists that there is no one in the position even to think on one’s own, either good or bad, as everything happens with absolute necessity.

However, as Alfsvåg also notes, when Luther translated the Assertio into German as Grund und Ursach aller Artikel [Defense and Explanation of All the Articles] in March 1521, “[Luther’s] rejection of free will did not contain any reference to the idea of absolute necessity” (see, 1521, WA 7:446–51/LW 32:92–4).

29. In Hyperaspistes, Erasmus associated the first two options with Augustine and Karlstadt respectively, and sets them out as follows: “When Augustine posits co-operating grace, he confesses that free will also does something in a good work; Karlstadt affirms that it does nothing [in a good work] but remains passive; you [Luther] teach that it does nothing in a good work or a bad one, either before grace or after grace, but that it is a meaningless word, pure and simple” (Erasmus 1526 [1999: 284–5]).

30. The Sacrament of Penance, 1519, WA 2:715/LW 35:10:

[S]in must be forgiven before good works can be done. For works do not drive out sin, but the driving out of sin leads to good works. For good works must be done with a joyful heart and good conscience towards God, that is, out of the forgiveness of guilt.

Treatise on Good Works, 1520, WA 6:207/LW 44:27:

[H]e who is not at one with God, or is in a state of doubt, worries and starts looking about for ways and means to do enough and to influence God with his many good works.

31. Sermons on the First Epistle of St Peter, 1522, WA 12:333/LW 30:79:

All our works should be of such a nature that they flow from pleasure and love, and are all directed toward our neighbour, since for ourselves we need nothing to make us good.

32. Lectures on Galatians, 1535, WA 40.2:70/LW 27:57:

These unnatural and superstitious works, which they decide upon without either the command or approval of God, they regard as so brilliant and saintly as to surpass and obscure love, which is the sun which outshines all works.

33. “Preface to the Epistle of St Paul to the Romans”, 1522, WA DB 7:14/LW 35:373:

Thus Paul explains the law rightly when he lets no one remain without sin but proclaims the wrath of God to all who want to live virtuously [wollen wol leben] by nature or by free will. He makes them out to be no better than public sinners; he says they are hard of heart and unrepentant.

34. WA 22:15:

Anyone who does not believe but goes on doubting the grace and love of God will not have the heart to express his love and thanks to God by responding to his neighbour in love. However, this faith which recognizes the great grace and goodness of God which helped him from death to life, always inflames a man’s heart to love and to good, even to his enemies, just as God has done for him.

35. See Freedom of the Christian, WA 7: 66 (Latin)/LW 31:367:

I will therefore give myself as Christ to my neighbour, just as Christ offered himself to me; I will do nothing in this life except what I see is necessary, profitable, and salutary to my neighbour, since through faith I have an abundance of all good things in Christ.

And Sermons on the First Epistle of St. Peter, 1523, WA 12:331/LW 30:77:

Christians…are not obligated to do anything more than serve and help their neighbour with all they have, just as Christ helped them. All their works are performed without compulsion and for nothing; they flow from a happy and cheerful heart, which thanks, praises, and lauds God for all the good things it has received from him. Thus St. Paul writes in 1 Tim 1:9 that “the law is not laid down for the just”; for of their own accord they do without recompense and unbidden everything God wants.

See also the Second Disputation Against the Antinomians, 1538, where Luther speaks of the law being “empty” (lex vacua) when the law no longer presents itself in an accusatory form — which is how it is experienced by “the angels and saints in heaven” who “do with joy the things of the law” (WA 39.1:433, translated in Sonntag (ed. and trans.), Only the Decalogue is Eternal, 91–92).

36. Luther took himself to be following Paul in making this view of law distinctive of Christianity, as against the “legalism” of Judaism (see for example Against Latomus, 1522, WA 8:70–3/LW 32:177–180), though it remains a matter of dispute whether this is a legitimate reading of the Jewish attitude to law, and of Paul’s criticism of it, or whether it is instead Luther’s projection of his own views: see the debate on Paul begun by E. P. Sanders (1977).

37. See Lectures on Galatians, 1535, WA 40.1:479–91/LW 26:308–16. Luther summarizes his view at WA 40.1:485/LW 26:312–3:

We say that the law is good and useful, but in its proper use, namely, first, as we said earlier, to restrain civic transgressions; and secondly to reveal spiritual transgressions.

38. See Against the Heavenly Prophets, 1525, WA 18:80/LW 40:97:

Thus, “Thou shalt not kill, commit adultery, steal, etc.” are not Mosaic laws only, but also the natural law written in each man’s heart, as St. Paul teaches (Rom. 2 [:15])…Otherwise, were it not naturally written in the heart, one would have to teach and preach the law for a long time before it became the concern of conscience. The heart must also find and feel the law in itself. Otherwise it would not become a matter of conscience for anyone.

See also Instruction on How Christians Should Regard Moses, 1526/1527, WA 16:363–93 and WA 24:1–16/LW 35:161–74.

39. See Against the Heavenly Prophets, 1525, WA 18:81/LW 40:98:

Why does one then keep and teach the Ten Commandments? Answer: Because the natural laws were never so orderly and well written as by Moses.

However, even within the decalogue, there are some commandments which are “ceremonial laws” and so do not need to be followed in the way they are practiced by the Jews, or which require a different interpretation, such as keeping the sabbath and the prohibition of images, where in Luther’s Large Catechism the latter is subordinated into the first commandment.

40. See On Marriage Matters, 1530, WA 30.3:225/LW 46:291:

This is why Moses’s law cannot be simply and completely valid among us. We have to take into consideration the character and ways of our land when we make or apply laws and rules.

See also Against the Heavenly Prophets, 1525, WA 18:81/LW 40:98, where Luther compares aspects of the law of Moses to the Sachsenspeigel, which was a legal compendium of economic and social laws governing Madgenburg and Halberstadt, thereby arguing these parts of the Mosaic law do not apply beyond the Jews, and so have no authority over Gentiles. Luther makes this distinction in part to undercut the position of more radical reformers such as Karlstadt, whom he accused of wrongheadedly basing their opposition to images on these aspects of Mosaic law.

41. Die Zirkulardisputation über das Recht des Widerstands gegen den Kaiser (Matth. 19, 21), 1539, WA 39.2:81

The Christian as a Christian is under the First Table of the law, but outside the kingdom of heaven he is a citizen of this world. Therefore he has two citizenships: he is a subject of Christ through faith and a subject of the emperor through his body.

42. See Temporal Authority, 1523, WA 11:253–4/LW 45:94:

Just as [the Christian] performs all other works of love which he himself does not need—he does not visit the sick in order that he himself may be made well, or feed others because he himself needs food—so he serves the governing authority not because he needs it but for the sake of others, that they may be protected and that the wicked may not become worse.

43. Temporal Authority, 1523, WA 11:277/LW 45:125:

What if a prince is in the wrong? Are his people bound to follow him too? Answer: No, for it is no one’s duty to do wrong; we must obey God (who desires the right) rather than men [Acts 5:29].

44. Temporal Authority, 1523, WA 11:262/LW 45:105:

The temporal government has laws which extend no further than to life and property and external affairs on earth, for God cannot and will not permit anyone but himself to rule over the soul. Therefore, where the temporal authority presumes to prescribe laws for the soul, it encroaches upon God’s government and only misleads souls and destroys them.

45. Admonition to Peace, 1525, WA 18:308–10/LW 46:28–9:

You do not want to endure evil or suffering, but rather want to be free and to experience only goodness and justice. However, Christ says that we should not resist evil or injustice but always yield, suffer, and let things be taken from us. If you will not bear this law, then lay aside the name of Christian and claim another name that accords with your actions… [T]he Christian law tells us not to strive against injustice, not to grasp the sword, not to protect ourselves, not to avenge ourselves, but to give up life and property, and let whoever takes it have it. We have all we need in our Lord, who will not leave us, as he has promised [Heb. 13:5]. Suffering! suffering! Cross! cross! This and nothing else is the Christian law!

46. Admonition to Peace, 1525, WA 18:305/LW 46:26:

It is true that the rulers do wrong when they supress the gospel and oppress you in temporal matters. But you do far greater wrong when you not only supress God’s word, but tread it underfoot, invade his authority and law, and put yourselves above God.

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