Madeleine de Scudéry

First published Wed May 18, 2011; substantive revision Thu Aug 22, 2019

A prominent novelist, Madeleine de Scudéry (1607–1701) composed a series of dialogues dealing with philosophical issues. Primarily ethical in focus, her dialogues examine the virtues and vices proper to the aristocratic society of the period. They also explore questions of moral psychology, in particular the interplay between temperament and free will. In the area of epistemology, Scudéry analyzes the problem of certitude and self-knowledge. Theologically, she defends cosmological arguments demonstrating God’s existence. Her aesthetic theory endorses the mimetic thesis concerning art as the imitation of nature but the individuality of artistic perception also receives attention. In her philosophical speculation, Scudéry stresses questions of gender; the relationship of philosophical theories to the condition of women receives substantial analysis.

Long framed by her critics as a pedantic précieuse, Scudéry has only recently attracted the interest of professional philosophers. Critics have dismissed her lengthy novels as unreadable, her famous Saturday salon as amateurish, and her philosophical ideas as derivative and confused. In the recent feminist expansion of the canon of humanities, however, another Scudéry has appeared. In this reevaluation, the philosophical significance of her writings has emerged. Her literary corpus presents a novel version of the ancient philosophical method of dialogue; it also expresses original, sophisticated theories concerning the ethical, aesthetic, and theological disputes of early modernity.

1. Biography

Born in Le Havre on November 15, 1607, Madeleine de Scudéry was born into a minor Norman aristocratic family, often dismissed as bourgeois by her critics. Her later efforts to conquer the aristocratic and court society of Paris often appeared tied to insecurity concerning her familial rank. Orphaned at the age of six, Scudéry entered into the care of her uncle, an ecclesiastic who provided her with an extensive education. She studied reading, writing, drawing, painting, music, and dancing. She received instruction in the practical arts of medicine, agriculture, and domestic economy. Her most notable achievement was mastery of Spanish and Italian; the domestic library featured numerous volumes written in each language. A voracious reader, she discovered the epic serial novels which would become her preferred literary genre as an author. Scudéry also began her philosophical initiation with the reading of Montaigne, who would influence her later sympathy with skepticism, and Plutarch (in the French translation by Jacques Amyot), who introduced her to the Stoic philosophy of reason, will, and virtue.

In 1637 Scudéry joined her brother Georges at his residence in Paris. A burgeoning playwright, Georges introduced his sister to the literary salons of Paris. Mademoiselle de Scudéry quickly became a frequent guest at the Hôtel de Rambouillet, where Catherine de Vivonne presided over her salon, the celebrated chambre bleue [blue room]. Notable salon authors included Pierre Corneille,[1] Jean-Louis Guez de Balzac,[2] Valentin Conrart,[3] Jean Chapelain,[4] Gilles Ménage,[5] Mademoiselle de Montpensier,[6] Madame de Sévigné,[7] Madame de Lafayette,[8] and Catherine Descartes.[9] Although eclectic in their philosophy, several authors evinced a clear sympathy for moral libertinism. In later writings, the salon libertine would often serve as the object of Scudéry’s censure.

During the Rambouillet years, Scudéry launched her own literary career. Printed under the name of her brother Georges, she published an historical novel, Ibrahim or the Ilustrious Basa, in 1641 and Illustrious Women or Heroic Harangues in 1642. With the publication of Artamène or the Great Cyrus, a novel printed in ten volumes from 1648 until 1653, Mademoiselle de Scudéry acquired literary fame. One of the world’s longest novels, containing more than two million words, the work attracted a broad European reading public still avid for serial historical romances. Although it is set in ancient Assyria, the work was clearly a roman-à-clef which depicted various members of Rambouillet’s literary circle through pseudonyms. Scudéry herself appears under the title of Sappho. Now an acclaimed author, Scudéry participated enthusiastically in the capital’s literary quarrels. In 1651 she was involved in a dispute over the relative merits of Isaac de Benserade’s sonnet Job and Vincent Voiture’s sonnet Urania.[10] In political disputes, Scudéry remained faithful to the French crown. During the Fronde (1648–53), the intermittent civil war opposing old aristocratic families and the Parisian parliament to the monarchy, Scudéry sided with the throne, despite her personal admiration for the women who had led the military resistance to the Bourbons in certain areas of the country. Her royalist sympathies would later harden into an admiration of Louis XIV that bordered on sycophancy.

In 1653 Madeleine and Georges Scudéry established a new residence in the Marais neighborhood of Paris. It is here that Mademoiselle de Scudéry conducted her famous Saturday salon: the samedis, where a large literary circle assembled to discuss disputed questions, especially those concerning the nature of love. The writings of Montaigne, Pierre Charron, and Marguerite de Navarre were discussed in the debates on the nature of true friendship.[11] Prominent participants in the salon included Madame de Sablé,[12] Madame de Lafayette, Madame Scarron (the future Madame de Maintenon),[13] Valentin Conrart, Paul Pellisson,[14] Jean-François Sarasin,[15] Gilles Ménage, Jean Chapelain, and Antoine Gombaud, chevalier de Méré.[16] Many of Scudéry’s philosophical dialogues reflect Méré’s ideal of honnêteté, the virtue of decency, fairness, and tolerance, especially in the realm of disputed ideas. Salonnières debated the “new philosophy” of Descartes; Scudéry opposed the mechanistic theory of matter in Cartesianism.

Scudéry continued to work as a prolific author. The ten-volume Clélie or a Roman History (1654–61) contained Scudéry’s most celebrated passage, the Carte de Tendre, a map of love, which describes the various obstacles (depicted as rivers, deserts, and mountains) affection must overcome as it attempts to reach the summit of spiritual love. Sensing the public’s disaffection for the older serial novels, Scudéry published several novellas: Célinte (1661), Mathilde d’Aguilar (1667), and Promenade at Versailles (1669). Later in life, Scudéry published her most philosophical works. Labeled as “conversations,” these works were a series of dialogues presenting the philosophical and literary issues commonly debated in the salons; the anthologies contained dialogues extracted from the earlier novels, reworked dialogues, and dialogues created expressly for the new collections. The works included Conversations on Different Subjects (1680), New Conversations on Different Subjects (1684), Moral Conversations (1686), New Moral Conversations (1688), and Moral Dialogues (1692).

Scudéry’s prolific authorship and influential salon brought her numerous honors. The Académie française awarded her its first literary prize for her essay On Glory in 1671.[17] The Academy of the Ricovrati in Padua elected her to membership in 1684. But opponents strongly contested the literary and intellectual worth of Scudéry. Molière’s Les Précieuses ridicules (1659), Furetière’s Le Roman bourgeois (1666), and Boileau’s Satire X (1667) mocked Scudéry as the model précieuse.[18] According to this caricature, Scudéry’s erudition was pedantry, her profligacy redundancy, her philosophical theories second-hand and incoherent. This dismissal of Scudéry as a risible arriviste would long dominate her image among literary critics and close her books to generations of potential readers.

Mademoiselle de Scudéry died on June 2, 1701. She was interred in the Parisian church of Saint-Nicolas-des-Champs.

2. Works

The works of Mademoiselle de Scudéry fall into several distinct genres: the novel, the novella, the dialogue, the oration, and the letter.

The novels follow the conventions of the serial epic novel established earlier in the seventeenth century. Each features an exotic locale. Ibrahim or the Illustrious Basa (1641) sprawls over the ancient Mediterranean basin. Artamène or the Grand Cyrus (1649–1653) takes place in ancient Assyria. Clélie, a Roman History (1654) is set in classical Rome. Each is of extraordinary length to present its intricate twists in plot. Ibrahim has four volumes, Cyrus ten, Clélie ten. The novels feature numerous abductions of the heroine, a trait which was the cause of mockery by early and later critics. Philosophically, the novels provide a critical portrait of the abuses of power in the relationship between the sexes, especially in the practices of rape and forced marriage, and in the relationship between ruler and ruled, notably in the practice of enslavement.

The novellas represent a concession to the changed tastes of the French literary public. New miniature genres (the maxim, the tale, the fable) had replaced the outmoded genre of the prolix romance novel. Célinte (1661) and Mathilde d’Aguilar (1667) explore the distinctive traits of female psychology, especially in the area of the passions and the propensity toward curiosity. Promenade at Versailles (1669) exemplifies Scudéry’s royalist political philosophy at its most militant; Louis XIV is praised as the model of virtues and Versailles is depicted as a terrestrial paradise.

The dialogues published toward the end of Scudéry’s life represent the most philosophical of her works. Labeled as “conversations,” the dialogues reflect the debates and favored topics of the salon Scudéry hosted at the celebrated samedis. A series of characters informally discuss a disputed issue of the moment; the conversation usually leads to a consensus on the correctness of a particular position but occasionally the debate ends in intellectual deadlock. Many dialogues focus on philosophical issues: the nature of the virtues, the nature of the passions, the problem of free will, arguments for God’s existence. Numerous conversations treat literary issues: the comparative merit of French poets, the proper method of letter-writing, the nature of artistic mimesis. Several dialogues deal with scientific questions. On Butterflies and History of Two Chameleons defend a vitalist theory of animal life and contest the mechanistic theory of the animal-machine.

One of the more unusual genres invented by Scudéry is the rhetorical oration used in Illustrious Women or Heroic Harangues (1642). In this series of discourses by famous women, Scudéry creates fictitious diatribes pronounced by powerful women in a moment of crisis, often on the verge of death. Prominent characters include Cleopatra and Sappho. Many of the harangues criticize the reduction of women to silence by political oppression and the need for women to express themselves forcefully through spoken and written speech. Placed in the mouths of socially prominent women, the orations also defend the right of women to exercise political authority.

The letters of Mademoiselle de Scudéry involve two distinct types. The first are fictitious: Amorous Letters from Various Contemporary Authors (1641). Imitating Ovid, this collection provides model-letters for the expression of love by interested parties, including women expressing affection for each other. The actual correspondence of Scudéry is currently dispersed among various anthologies and archives. A prolix epistler, Scudéry corresponded with the intellectual elite of French society. Bossuet and Fénelon figure among her correspondents.[19] Of special philosophical interest is Scudéry’s correspondence with Catherine Descartes, the niece of René Descartes. Both correspondents reject the uncle’s mechanistic explanation of animal life.

3. Philosophy

Interpreting the philosophy of Mademoiselle de Scudéry requires certain cautions. First, a lifelong disciple of Montaigne, Scudéry repeatedly expresses skepticism concerning the enterprise of philosophy itself. The disputes of philosophical schools often appear to be nothing more than a Babel of discordant authorities. Despite the furor, no definitive solution to philosophical disputes can impose itself. The contemporary dispute over Descartes’s theory of vortices illustrates the obscure, endless controversies generated by philosophical pride.

This argument will go on forever. The problem is so complicated. Any resolution of it is beyond the power of the human mind. The result will always be an unstable mixture of half-truths and unanticipated difficulties. This problem arises because philosophers generally try to say something new rather than saying something true. [EM, 1: 211]

Despite her periodic endorsements of skepticism, Scudéry clearly maintains that some philosophical theses are true. Her religious philosophy insists that God’s existence can be demonstrated through an argument from design; her moral philosophy emphatically praises certain moral qualities as virtuous and condemns other moral dispositions as vicious. The skeptical cast of Scudéry’s rhetoric, nonetheless, indicates the tentativeness with which her philosophical positions are often affirmed.

Second, Scudéry’s dialogical form of philosophy can make it difficult to discern which philosophical position Scudéry actually supports. In the typical “conversation,” multiple speakers defend contrasting views on a given theoretical topic. In this open-ended dialogue, each speaker’s position usually contains certain merits and defects; theories are corrected, altered, or abandoned as the exchange progresses. Certain dialogues, such as Of Lying, end on an inconclusive note; the disputants cannot agree as to whether lying is a universally evil act. In most dialogues, however, the speakers clearly concur on a certain philosophical issue or one of the positions defended by a particular disputant is clearly more convincing than the positions defended by others. Unlike the philosophical essay, with its mono-authorial voice, the multiple voices of the philosophical dialogue make the determination of the author’s actual philosophical position a complicated enterprise. The irony employed in many Scudéry dialogues renders this determination of philosophical position even more delicate.

3.1 Moral Philosophy

Virtue theory constitutes the primary object of Scudéry’s moral philosophy. Many of her dialogues analyze the moral virtues and vices typical of the aristocratic world of the salon and the court. In examining these virtues, the dialogues emphasize the distinctive ways in which women possess these moral qualities. The dialogues also stress the ambiguity of virtue. Using the distinguo [a refined distinction between similar qualities], Scudéry highlights the multiple gradations of a single virtue and how certain moral dispositions can function as either virtues or vices according to context.

The aristocratic bent of Scudéry’s virtue theory appears in her treatment of three moral virtues: magnanimity, politeness, and discretion. Each of the virtues presupposes a certain amount of culture, affluence, and social rank. Magnanimity requires a rational estimate of one’s proper worth and an acute estimation of one’s rank within the social hierarchy.

True magnanimity as I consider it is a good opinion of oneself, founded on reason and on the solid merit of one who aspires to great things and contemns the petty. One cannot be truly magnanimous if one does not esteem oneself as much as is proper in comparison to things beneath oneself. [CN, 1: 70]

In Scudéry’s neo-Aristotelian version of the virtue, magnanimity encompasses ambition, self-esteem, and pride in social position. At the same time, magnanimity must avoid contempt for the mysterious workings of fate or divine providence, since such overweening pride leads to self-destruction.

The dialogue Of Politeness conceives politeness primarily as the capacity to engage in proper conversation with persons of elevated social rank.

True politeness consists in knowing how to live properly and always knowing how to speak properly….It is the avoidance of any rudeness or injury to anyone. It is not saying to others what you would not want them to say to you. It is wanting not to be the tyrant of conversation by always speaking without letting others speak. [CN, 1: 127]

Politeness entails more than proper etiquette in speech; it must be motivated by a genuine charity toward the neighbor, rooted in the golden rule of reciprocity.

Discretion is a virtue particularly prized at the court. Of Discretion explains how this virtue is diversely expressed according to one’s position in the social hierarchy.

Concerning our superiors, we do not exercise discretion; rather, we express respect. Concerning our inferiors, we do not exercise discretion; rather, we exercise goodness and indulgence, especially when we abstain from doing something pleasing to us but displeasing to them. [MM, 2: 613]

Just as gossip damages court society, the discretion of the courtier strengthens it. The variations on the exercise of discretion reflect the stratification of the aristocratic society for which Scudéry writes.

In many dialogues Scudéry insists that women as well as men can possess the full range of moral virtues. Against those who hold that only men can practice magnanimity because of its public and political nature, Scudéry argues that women also can possess the virtue. “This great quality [magnanimity] is not banned from appearing in certain extraordinary women” [CN, 1: 64]. As an example, the dialogue cites Portia, wife of Brutus. Although both sexes can possess the most rarified moral virtues, each sex tends to practice the virtues in a distinctive way. The virtue of kindness is more imperative in the personality of a woman than in that of a man.

Kindness is the most essential quality for women. It reinforces the charm of their beauty and of their mind. In fact, kindness is so necessary for them that they cannot be admirable without possessing it in an eminent degree. [CN, 1: 233]

Scudéry’s treatment of the virtue of glory also insists that women are not excluded from its practice. Of Glory rejects the thesis that glory is preeminently a military virtue and, consequently, that it can only be acquired by men. The dialogue insists that women can manifest glory by intellectual and moral achievement.

Ladies have glory when their mind exceeds their beauty and when they have so much moral merit that one can still love them when they have lost everything that made them physically beautiful. [CN, 2: 563]

Paralleling the military glory of men, women often manifest glory through the romantic wars they wage. Poetic descriptions of romance rightly use martial language to describe its operations. “Love also has its combats, victories, conquests, chains, irons, crowns, slaves, prisons, prisoners, defeats and triumphs” [CN, 2: 577]. In fact, glory is present in the emergence of any moral virtue, whether applauded by an external public or not. “Glory is something which necessarily arises from any act of virtue just as light necessarily arises from the sun which produces it” [CN, 2: 571–72]. In particular, glory accompanies the moral victory over oneself through the conquest of one’s passions.

Notwithstanding the authentic moral value possessed by the natural virtues of classical antiquity, Christianity has elevated the natural values through the work of grace. Modesty is exemplary. The properly Christian virtue of humility has refined the generic virtue of modesty.

The word humility is a Christian term, because this virtue, like all the others, has been better known since the rise of Christianity than it was among the pagans….In Christian humility, Christians know their weaknesses and faults through the precepts of divine law. Developing a genuine remorse for not having accomplished it, they hate themselves and only themselves. They cannot feel the same way about the burden of the faults of others. [EM, 1: 14]

Although Scudéry evinces little interest in the properly theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity, she repeatedly emphasizes the purifying role of grace in the transition from pagan to contemporary Christian exercises of virtue.

Just as the moral virtues bear an aristocratic cast in Scudéry’s works, the moral vices carry a distinctive aristocratic stamp. The dialogues criticize vices which commonly appear in a court setting: flattery, dissimulation, mockery, envy, and vanity. In their sophistication, the vices of the courtier are frequently hidden beneath the appearance of virtue. Of Hope analyzes how the ambition of the courtier distorts the Christian virtue of hope.

The entire life of the court is nothing but hope; that is where one always dies in hoping for something. In every court in which I’ve been, I’ve seen courtiers puffed up with vain hopes, which at the end turned into bitter disappointments. [MM, 1: 36]

The vices criticized in the dialogues often represent a species of mendacity. Assaults on the order of truth, essential for the cohesion of society itself, constitute particularly grave moral transgressions in Scudéry’s hierarchy of values.

In Scudéry’s analysis, many virtues are capable of minute variations in quality and operation. Of Kindness details numerous subspecies of the virtue of kindness, such as habitual, respectful, friendly, courtly, urbane, vivacious, eloquent, true, and false. In fact, kindness admits of so many variations that it can turn into a vice in certain contexts.

Kindness, which is a peaceful and pleasant virtue, one necessary for society and rightly admired, becomes a vice if it lacks certain limits. This virtue is different from others. There is only one sort of justice and there is only sort of generosity and of wisdom; however, there are a hundred sorts of kindnesses. [CDS, 1: 320]

Kindness is not alone in the moral ambiguity of certain virtues. Of Anger ends on a note of irresolution concerning the vicious nature of anger. While the dialogue’s interlocutors agree that anger is usually a serious vice, especially when the moral agent deliberately prolongs it, they cannot rule out the possibility that certain angers might be justified under the category of justified retribution.

Despite the ambiguous moral status of certain virtues and vices, Scudéry rejects moral relativism. In several dialogues she argues that certain actions are patently evil, no matter how popular they are in particular cultures or governments. Of Lying rejects the use of deception or murder to advance the interests of the state. No raison d’état can justify the use of immoral means, even to justify a substantial national good. “In order for an action to be heroic, it is not only necessary that the motive be just; it is necessary that its methods be noble and innocent” [CN, 1: 443]. Despite widespread social approval, certain customs are intrinsically immoral. Although modern European voyagers have revealed the widespread acceptance of polygamy, for example, the practice is censured by Scudéry as oppressive.

Neither nature nor reason could have authorized this custom. It is only the tyranny of custom authorized by a grave voluptuousness that has authorized this multiplicity of wives and the imprisonment of the Sultan’s consorts in the Seraglio. [MM, 1: 271]

The moral ambiguity of certain virtues should not lead to the acceptance of immoral practices which are only abuses of power sanctified by custom. Irrational customs which oppress women, such as polygamy and foot-binding in China, merit Scudéy’s particular scorn.

3.2 Moral Psychology

In several dialogues Scudéry examines the psychology animating the moral life. This psychology consists primarily of the interplay between personal temperament, largely determined by biological factors, and the personal exercise of free will. In this theory, temperament shapes the moral tone of a particular personality but moral character rests largely on how a moral agent exercises his or her personal freedom.

The variations in human personality derive largely from the different temperaments human beings possess. Contrasting temperaments conceive pain and pleasure in divergent ways; judgments concerning the worth of a particular action or object naturally vary.

The diversity of temperaments causes the variations in pleasure. The pleasures are different according to such factors as one’s age and one’s personal qualities. Ordinarily the only thing which determines this divergence are the different passions which govern the various pursuits of pleasure. [CDS, 1: 79]

Predominantly determined by biological factors, temperament colors a moral agent’s distinctive perspective and inclinations toward action. Even the wise use of reason to discipline one’s action cannot alter the basic temperament with which the moral agent must confront ethical dilemmas.

Scudéry’s account of temperament rests squarely on the classical-medieval theory of the humors. Despite idiosyncratic variations, human personality expresses four basic humors: choleric, melancholic, sanguine, and phlegmatic.

The humors often carry the mind away and seduce it according to their caprices. This is what accounts for the great diversity of sentiments among the most reasonable people. Without the humors, all reasonable people would like equally everything meriting to be liked, whether in the sciences, in the arts, or in simple pleasures. In fact, different temperaments, which reflect different humors, tend to prefer different objects, despite the weight of reason. This is what explains this variety of emotional inclinations of which society is full. [CN, 2: 458]

This differential in humor explains how equally rational human agents can have very different experiences of and judgments concerning the same external object or activity. It also explains the unusual power of moods, such as ennui, on the moral perception and decisions of the human person.

Temperament is particularly powerful in influencing the moral agent when it fabricates strong desires. Unlike ideas or even simple wishes, desires rarely submit to the discipline of reason.

Wishes must be the work of reason, but desires are nearly always blind powers which are born from temperament. Several times in my life I’ve had desires for several things I never wished for, because reason was opposed to them. [MM, 1: 344]

The arational empire of desire can easily motivate violent action in the interest of neither the moral agent nor his or her neighbor.

Despite the power of temperament, the moral agent can correct it through the use of free will. It is precisely in the emergence of free will’s combat against the inclinations of temperament that personal moral responsibility arises. Of Inclination describes the emergence of the moral responsibility which rightly merits the moral agent praise or blame for actions.

We are born with the inclinations which heaven was pleased to give us, but we enter into the possession of praise or blame only at the moment we begin to act through reason. Up to this point, nothing is truly up to us; after that point, we are responsible for everything we do, whether good or evil. Therefore, it is up to us to see what inclinations we should follow and those we should change. Having known the true path of glory and virtue, we should walk in it despite all the repugnance we might find within ourselves. [CN, 1: 319]

In the transformation of temperament to suit the demands of the moral order, reason must often contradict the pull of emotions surrounding a distorted humor.

To illustrate the mastery of temperament by reason, Of Anger depicts the obligatory transformation of excessive anger by the agent who possesses such a temperament.

Excessive anger is the ordinary fault of all weak people. As repentance is the greatest manifestation of human reason, it is necessary from the earliest moments to habituate oneself to overcome a passion which is practically always followed and which makes the bearer of it hated and despised. [MM, 1: 359]

Rather than abolishing the passions, a morally mature reason transforms them. In the case of a choleric temperament, the flames of anger are transformed into the sentiments of restraint, remorse, and repentance for the damage inflected by excessive anger.

3.3 Epistemology

Influenced by Montaigne, Scudéry often expresses skepticism concerning claims to knowledge. Social custom in particular often tempts the noetic agent to mistake prejudice for authentic knowledge. The complex psychology by which human beings experience the world often tinges their claims to knowledge with subjectivity. Scudéry’s skepticism, however, is a mitigated one. Especially in the religious domain, the noetic agent can acquire certain knowledge and overcome the limits to knowledge tied to the fallible senses and social bias.

Many claims to knowledge are so doubtful that one can easily endorse skepticism as the proper position concerning knowledge itself. The experience of error and subsequent correction reveals how thin are the foundations of all noetic claims.

I think sometimes that everything is so doubtful that one can only support one position concerning knowledge. If I had to establish one sect in this area, I would like to start one where it would be permitted to doubt everything. The one exception would be the things of religion. [CN, 1: 167]

The exception to the rule of skepticism concerns religious truths. In numerous writings Scudéry argues that certain religious knowledge involves both philosophical demonstrations of God’s existence and the theological and moral truths unveiled by God in sacred revelation.

Of Incertitude explores the psychological sources of this widespread doubt and error. Subjective emotions and social custom constitute major obstacles to the disinterested use of reason in the quest for objective knowledge.

As soon as one wants to use one’s reason and tries to examine carefully things in themselves, one realizes that one believes only with great doubt most of those things one thought one knew with the greatest certitude. In the conduct of life, one is carried away by some blind inclination or by some custom one lazily follows without knowing why. [MM, 1: 373]

Like Montaigne and Descartes, Scudéry emphasizes how social custom can easily induce the noetic agent into error. But she also stresses how the more interior and elusive powers of temperament and emotion can color noetic judgment and block the agent from objective perception of the external world.

Another limit to noetic certitude arises from the experiential nature of human knowledge. One can only know an object well through personal experience of it. But personal experience entails an irreducible subjectivity of perception.

Experience is good for everything. Without it we would have only the most imperfect knowledge of anything. In my opinion, the only thing we cannot actually experience is death, because we can only die once. Consequently, we cannot know it very well. [EM, 1: 248]

Ironically, the very experience requisite for thorough knowledge of an object places the knowledge under a veil of doubt since experience inevitably carries the imprint of the noetic agent’s subjective history, emotions, and desires.

One particular problem in epistemology concerns self-knowledge. In Of the Knowledge of Others and of Oneself, Scudéry argues that self-knowledge can be attained only if one meets certain moral conditions for self-scrutiny. The virtues of justice, sincerity, and courage constitute the prerequisites for authentic self-knowledge.

One must begin by the desire to know oneself free of all flattery. Principally, one must observe oneself concerning four things: if one is just; if one is sincere; if one is capable of true friendship; if one has courage [CDS, 1: 103]

Unlike Descartes, who proposes an intellectualist path to attain knowledge of the internal cogito, Scudéry insists on the moral requirements for authentic disclosure of the self. It is the frank desire for an unvarnished and valid knowledge of oneself, a knowledge that may reveal the need for moral conversion, which permits the noetic agent to arrive at authentic knowledge of one’s soul. Opposed to the Cartesian path of introspection, Scudéry insists that self-knowledge can emerge only through scrutiny of one’s social interaction under the rubric of virtue and vice.

3.4 Philosophy of Religion

Scudéry develops her philosophy of religion through two principal strategies. Positively, she argues that God’s existence can be demonstrated through the philosophical use of reason. She favors a cosmological argument from design. Negatively, she criticizes the religious skepticism of salon libertines as irrational. Their dismissal of theological claims to truth is incoherent with their avid acceptance of many weaker claims to truth in the secular domain.

God’s existence can be known through a rational scrutiny of the cosmos, which ultimately reveals itself to be the handiwork of a supreme being. The Neo-Epicurean argument that the cosmos’s existence and design can be explained through the random play of physical atoms is untenable, since purely physical substances cannot create the elaborate laws which govern the universe. Moreover, matter cannot create the spirit which is obviously operative in human actions of intellect and will.

I strongly believe that undepraved human reason can and must know God through his works and that one can never reasonably think that these alleged Atoms—which they are called in order to gain reverence for them—could create the eternal principles of the universe. [MM, 1: 432]

Typically, Scudéry argues that moral defect (depravity) could blind someone to God’s existence. Authentic recognition of God entails moral judgment, repentance, and conversion. The superficial thought of materialists has failed to employ the higher reason of metaphysics in determining the ultimate cause of the existence of the physical and moral worlds. Like moral defect, defective reason can prevent someone from recognizing God’s existence.

The strongest argument for God’s existence is found in the design of the universe and of the human person. The complex and intelligent structure of the physical cosmos and of the human soul can only be explained by the action of a supreme being who possesses divine attributes.

How then can it happen that when human beings consider the admirable structure of the universe and the admirable structure of themselves, they are not inclined to believe they have been created by an intelligent, eternal, omnipotent, and unchangeable Being? This Being merits all of our admiration. [MM, 1: 431]

Scudéry suggests that the refusal to recognize God as the ultimate cause of the exquisite structure of the physical universe and of the human person is incomprehensible. The refusal to recognize God’s existence in light of this supremely intelligent design can only be explained by a mysterious willfulness.

For Scudéry, the religious skepticism of the libertines in the period’s salons merits little intellectual respect. Not only is this skepticism generated by the moral license of the libertines; it contrasts badly with the credulity they exhibit in other areas of knowledge.

The very people who don’t want to believe in an invisible Divinity are very inclined, on the word of a few travelers, to tell unbelievable things, such as what they tell us about this marvelous stone—called Heliotrope, I believe—which Croesus possesses among his treasures and which they claim can make one invisible. [CDS, 1: 176]

Whereas Christian revelation relies upon the inspired witness of Scripture and Tradition, the tales of Croesus and other mythical figures rely on the flimsiest hearsay. The libertine case for religious skepticism rests on little more than a credulous, inconsistent reason allied with a moral depravity impervious to the evangelical call to repent.

3.5 Aesthetics

In the dialogues Scudéry develops a philosophy of art that largely adheres to neoclassical aesthetics. Art is the imitation of nature; nature itself possesses an internal harmony reflective of the hidden divine beauty. In her emphasis on the individuality of artistic perception and of the individual work of art, however, Scudéry adds her own subjectivist account of art to the classical mimetic theory to which she subscribes.

Of Magnificence and Of Magnanimity presents Scudéry’s mimetic theory of art in capsule form. All art represents an imitation of nature, “nature” here being understood as the physical world. “Art has imitated what Nature has made in different places of the world” [CN, 1: 23]. Each art imitates a particular section of nature. Dance, for example, imitates the motion of the stars. “The people who invented dance took the order and movement of the stars as their model” [CN, 1: 38]. Through artistic mimesis, a distinctive sector of the natural world is transmuted into a particular genre of art. It is this specialized study of material nature that explains the demarcation among the various genres constituting the beaux arts.

Beauty does not lie solely in the work fashioned by the artist; nature itself manifests a complex beauty in each of its discrete parts. Observations on Butterflies details the beauty to be found in the structure of the butterfly, one of Scudéry’s favored objects of scientific observation.

The wings of these little animals account for what is most admirable in them. Each butterfly has four wings; their wings are so well coordinated that it seems the butterflies have only two wings when we watch them flying. Their structure is marvelous. They are made of a kind of cartilage…which colors the wings of these little animals. It makes them appear thin and transparent, like a fine piece of parchment or like a very dry and very clear stroke of the brush. [EM, 2: 309]

The artistic construction of a work of art rests on the careful imitation of a nature whose intricate structure already expresses a harmony matching the beauty produced by the finest artisans and artists.

The artistic mimesis defended by Scudéry does not entail a servile imitation of nature. On the contrary, each work of art represents an idiosyncratic interpretation of nature which reflects the unique temperament, style, history, and skill of the individual artist. The practice of painting reflects the individual differences which emerge in works based on careful observation of the same physical object in the same studio setting.

In celebrated academies of painting they have often presented one single model to the same view of all the artists. They saw him; they observed him; he gave them all the time they wanted without changing his position. Still, I can assure you that even those who depict him from the same angle will show notable differences in their works. [CN, 1: 450]

Scudéry adds a subjectivist note to the mimetic account of art. Although the artist imitates external nature, in fact a single precise external object in nature, the final work of art portraying that nature will bear the idiosyncratic stamp and style of the individual artist. Even at its most realistic, the artwork cannot be reduced to a facsimile of the physical cosmos.

As in the rest of her philosophy, moral considerations weigh heavily in Scudéry’s philosophy of art. Since art powerfully shapes the moral imagination of those who view it, the artist must produce an art that reflects the moral order as well as the physical order of nature. Her strictures on the composition of fables, a favorite salon literary genre, express Scudéry’s concern for the moral rectitude of the artwork.

It [the fable] should censure vice and reward virtue….Imagination should always be subordinate to judgment. Extraordinary events should be clearly justified….The style should be neither too elevated nor too low. Nowhere should social conventions or morals be offended. [CDS, 2: 475]

The moral strictures on art also reflect the rationalism of Scudéry’s aesthetics. Even in the realm of the fable, the reasonable and the measured should trump the imaginative and the fantastic.

Given its moral pedagogical power, art should be a major political concern. The state should vigorously promote art that both edifies and pleases by its aesthetic quality. Good public art is particularly apt to promote the aristocratic virtues. “When the prince promotes them, the love of science and the beaux arts is very helpful in establishing the practice of politeness” [CN, 1: 185]. In her censure of the vice of sloth, Scudéry singles out for criticism the indolent artists who do not make the contribution they could make to society’s artistic heritage and moral atmosphere.

3.6 Nature and Science

During her lifetime, Scudéry acquired a reputation as an amateur botanist and zoologist. Her celebrated garden contained many exotic trees and flowers considered difficult to cultivate in the Parisian climate. Like other pet lovers, she rejected Descartes’s theory of the animal as a soulless machine. Her dialogue History of Two Chameleons indicates her rejection of Descartes’s mechanistic theory of nature in favor of a vitalist account of nature which attributes emotions and even moral qualities to non-human animals. The dialogue reflects Scudéry’s own experimentation on two chameleons imported from Alexandria and entrusted to her care.

Knowledge of the chameleon is acquired by careful observation of its physical features over time. Scudéry is especially attentive to the eyes of the chameleon, which pivot in a much wider range than that possible for human eyes. Experiments with different types of food gradually reveal the chameleon’s eating habits. Careful observation in different environments and lightings cannot resolve the question of the precise causes of the chameleon’s changes of color but does yield surprising evidence that changes in temperature appear to effect substantial alterations in coloration. Months-long observation leads Scudéry to the conclusion that classification of the chameleon as a reptile is mistaken:

It is wrong to call [the chameleon] a reptile. Its stomach never touches the earth, not even when it is walking or even sleeping. At those times it rests on its feet and on its tail. [CN, 2:503]

For Scudéry, proper observation of nature is necessarily an aesthetic observation. In her study of the chameleon, she often recounts the animal’s beauty. “This animal has a slow, grave, and majestic walk” [CN, 2: 503]. She repeatedly records the beauty of the varied spotting manifest by the chameleon.

Nearly everyday at several different moments, it had the most beautiful spots in the world: from the top of its head to the end of its tail and to the bottom of its little fingers. [CN, 2: 513]

The chameleon also manifests emotional and moral qualities. Scudéry claims that her two chameleons showed a clear affection for each other.

During the five weeks I had the animals together, I noticed an intense affection between them. Neither ever showed the least chagrin. [CN, 2: 515]

The older chameleon even seems to possess moral as well as emotional traits. Happiness appears to be maximal in midday.

It seems to me that when my chameleon had the best spotting was the moment when he seemed the happiest and at is his best. This was usually midday from ten in the morning until three or four in the afternoon. [CN, 2: 528]

Sadness and even a certain sloth seem to characterize early morning.

When I saw him the next day I found him very sad. Still, he heard me and recognized who I was, as he usually did. But I saw that he was very lazy in his rising. [CN, 2: 532]

Scudéry’s interpretation of the natural world is not only empirical; it involves a sympathetic and aesthetic embrace of material nature.

3.7 Philosophy of Gender

Questions of gender and sexuality suffuse the entire corpus of Scudéry. Her prolix novels celebrate an egalitarian love between men and women. Despite their exotic settings, they condemn the typical oppressions endured by the era’s women: forced marriage, abduction, and domestic violence. Her fictitious orations emphasize the right of women to exercise political authority. Scudéry’s defense of the right of women to participate in the public sphere of civil society is particularly emphatic in her writings focused on the figure of the poet Sappho. As Newman argues in her edition of these writings (2003), The Story of Sappho, embedded in the novel Artamène or the Great Cyrus, and the Harangue of Sappho, the twentieth of the speeches presented in Illustrious Women or Heroic Harangues, clearly indict the social repression of women. The institution of marriage itself serves as an object of censure.

The Harangue of Sappho presents Scudéry’s philosophy of gender in lapidary form. Speaking to her auditor Erinne, Sappho condemns the denial of women’s rights to education and self-expression through a cult of false humility. A distorted virtue of modesty has reduced women to silence.

You must overcome the doubt concerning yourself that is planted in your soul. It is this false modesty which prevents you from employing your mind to achieve all that it is capable of attempting. [FI, 1, 423–424]

This anti-intellectual modesty, which women are supposed to cultivate as one of the distinguishing traits of their sex, has only made women doubt their own worth. Modesty has condemned self-expression to the status of a sin.

Even graver in this silencing of women is society’s sharp demarcation between gender roles in the public square. Women are to excel in the cultivation of physical beauty and the social graces; men are to excel in the pursuit of art and science.

People who claim that beauty is woman’s sphere and that the arts and letters and all the liberal and rarified sciences belong to men—and that we women are barred from them—are very far from either truth or justice. [FI,1: 424]

To contest this gendered differentiation in the sphere of study and work, women must recognize that the set of beliefs supporting this sexual segregation is simply a “custom and corruption of our time” [FI, 426]. In fact, society offers numerous counter-examples of men who focus on the development of physical beauty and social charm and of women who excel in scientific culture and intellectual debate. Both men and women can develop the powers of analysis and judgment as well as those of imagination. To refuse women the right to develop their intellectual gifts is to oppose Nature itself, which has clearly equipped women with such capacities.

The gods have made nothing useless in all nature….Now, why should we women be the only ones supposed to rebel against this natural order as if we were ungrateful to the gods? Why should our minds be kept in a perpetual state of uselessness and mediocrity?….No reason could possibly justify the belief that what is infinitely admirable in itself is supposedly wrong and criminal in ourselves. [FI,1: 432]

The development of women’s intellectual capacity requires the refutation of the social prejudices concerning gender differentiation. This refutation must demonstrate how these damaging prejudices contradict the order of nature itself.

To liberate women’s intellectual gifts, Scudéry privileges the role of writing. In writing and publishing her work, a woman attracts acclaim in the future as well as in the present. The act of writing is far superior to being written about by others in the fashionable literary portraits of the time.

It is better to grant immortality to others than to receive it from others. It is better to find glory within yourself than to borrow it from somewhere else….Poetry has many advantages. You only have to encourage others to speak about you in order to make yourself known to posterity. If you simply speak with good grace, you will be known well enough….You have only to condemn the vices of your time and society will not fail to laud you. [FI,1: 438]

The writing of social criticism is especially appropriate for women who have overcome the social stereotypes imprisoning women in the private sphere of sentiment.

4. Reception and Interpretation

Toward the end of her long life, Scudéry faced the mixed reception which would be the destiny of her works for centuries to come. Her writings, especially her novels, reached an enormous cultivated public. Thousands of readers anxiously awaited the appearance of a new chapter in the serials. The royalties and government pensions attached to her writings permitted her to live comfortably in the fashionable Marais neighborhood. The translation of her works into English, Spanish, Italian, German, and Arabic indicates the breadth of her appreciative public. But an influential literary elite dismissed her works as illegible and unintelligible. Molière, Furetière, and Boileau caricatured Scudéry as a pendant whose picaresque tales and inconclusive dialogues only masked intellectual confusion. A leading literary critic, Nicolas Boileau’s criticism proved especially influential in subsequent dismissals of the thought of Scudéry. In Satire X, Boileau argues that the type of love celebrated by Scudéry is immoral.

You can see this in Clélie, where the heroine receives her lovers under the delicate name of friend. At first, she only takes small, permissible liberties. But soon you are in deep waters on the river of Tendre and you can navigate at will. [OC, 67]

Boileau’s critique in Dialogue on Heroes of the Novel is more categorical. He denounces Scudéry’s works

for their lack of seriousness, for their airs, for their vague and superficial dialogues, for their fawning portraits of quite mediocre people, even on occasion very ugly people, and for their interminable and verbose effusions on love. [OC, 445]

This critical portrait has remained influential in the negative appraisal of Scudéry down to the present.

In the nineteenth century, the rehabilitation of Scudéry’s intellectual reputation began. President of the Sorbonne, Victor Cousin (1858) studied how Scudery’s writings reflected the salon society of the period. Despite his own philosophical pedigree, however, Cousin evinced more interest in Scudéry’s role as salon hostess than in her own philosophical theories. The current revival of interest in Scudéry is tied to the contemporary feminist expansion of the canon of the humanities in order to include the voices of women authors who had been neglected due to misogynist bias. The new English translations and commentaries by Newman (2003) and Donawerth and Strongson (2004) focus on the writings of Scudéry treating issues of gender. Recent studies by Beasley (1990), De Jean (1991), Duggan (2017), Goldsmith (1988), Harth (1992), and Timmermans (1993) have situated the works and theories of Scudéry in the context of women’s writing, salon culture, and the various attitudes toward women in the France of early modernity. Burch (2013) examines in what sense she can be considered a philosopher, specifically a “femme philosophe” of the period. Hogg (2018) and Suzuki (2018) analyze her political theory while Duggan (2016) and Sahlins (2015) explore her approach to science. Although these contemporary editions of and commentaries on Scudéry have underscored the gendered nature of Scudéry’s philosophy, they have tended to neglect other dimensions of her thought. Scudéry’s philosophy of virtue, religion, art, and knowledge invites further exploration.


Works by Madeleine de Scudéry

Cited Works

Citations are to the page numbers of the original French version. Passages from the French quoted in this entry are translated by John Conley.

[CN] Conversations nouvelles sur divers sujets, 2 vols., Paris: C. Barbin, 1684.
[CDS] Conversations sur divers sujets, 2 vols., Paris: C. Barbin, 1680. [Translated as Conversations upon Several Subjects. Written in French by Mademoiselle de Scudéry. And done into English by Mr. Ferrand Spence. In Two Tomes, London: H. Rhodes, 1683.]
[EM] Entretiens de morale, 2 vols., Pars: J. Anisson, 1692.
[FI] Les femmes illustres, ou Les harangues héroïques, 2 vols., Paris: Quiney et de Sercy, 1644. [New Edition: Les femmes illustres, 1641, Claude Maignien (ed.), Paris: Côté-femmes, 1991.]
[MM] La Morale du Monde, 2 vols., Paris: T. Guillain, 1686.

Other Works

  • Discours de la Gloire, Paris: Pierre le Petit, 1671. [Translated as Essay Upon Glory by Elizabeth Elstob: J. Morphew, 1708.]
  • Lettres de Scudéry à M. Godeau, évêque de Vence, ed. M Monmerqué, Paris: A. Levavasseur, 1835.
  • Mademoiselle de Scudéry, sa vie et sa correspondance, avec un choix de ses poésies, par MM. Rathy et Boutron, Paris: Léon Techener, 1873.
  • Nouvelles conversations de morale, 2 vols., Paris: Mabre-Cramoisy, 1688.
  • La Promenade de Versailles, Paris: C. Barbin, 1669.
  • Selected Letters, Orations, and Rhetorical Dialogues, trans. and ed. Jane Donawerth and Julie Strongson, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2004.
  • The Story of Sapho, trans. and ed. Karen Newman, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003. [excerpt from Artamène ou le Grand Cyrus (1648–1653)]

Secondary Sources

  • Aronson, Nicole, 1978, Mademoiselle de Scudéry, Boston: Twayne Publishers.
  • Beasley, Faith E., 1990, Revising Memory: Women’s Fiction and Memoirs in Seventeenth Century France, New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press.
  • Boileau-Despréaux, Nicolas, 1966 [OC], Oeuvres complètes, François Escal (ed.), Paris: Gallimard.
  • Burch, Laura J., 2013, “Madeleine de Scudéry : Peut-on parler de femme philosophe ?” Revue philosophique de la France et de l’Etranger, 203(31): 361–375.
  • Cousin, Victor, 1858, La Société française au XVIIe siècle d’après “Le Grand Cyrus” de Mademoiselle de Scudéry, 2 vols., Paris: Didier.
  • De Jean, Joan, 1991, Tender Geographies: Women and the Origins of the Novel in France, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Duggan, Anne E., 2016, “Madeleine de Scudéry’s Animal Sublime, or Of Chameleons,” European Journal of Literature, Culture and Environment, 7(1): 28–41. [Duggan 2016 available online]
  • –––, 2017, “Les Femmes illustres, or the Book as Triumphal Arch,” Papers on French Seventeenth Century Literature, 44(87): 247–266.
  • Goldsmith, Elizabeth, 1988, Exclusive Conversations: The Art of Interaction in Seventeenth-Century France, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Green, Karen, 2010, “The Amazons and Mademoiselle de Scudéry’s Refashioning of Female Virtue,” in Expanding the Canon of Early Modern Women’s Writing, P. Salzman (ed.), Newcastle upon Tyne, England: Cambridge Scholars, pp. 150–167.
  • –––, 2009, “Madeleine de Scudéry on Love and the Emergence of the ‘Private Sphere,’”, History of Political Thought, 30(2): 272–285.
  • Harth, Erica, 1992, Cartesian Women: Versions and Subversions of Rational Discourse in the Old Regime, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Hogg, Chloé, 2018, “The King in Trinkets: Madeleine de Scudéry’s Conversations and the Downsizing of Absolutism,” Journal for Eighteenth Century Studies, 41(3): 355–371. doi:10.1111/1754-0208.12523
  • Liot Backer, Dorothy Anne, 1974, Precious Women: A Feminist Phenomenon in the Age of Louis XIV, New York City: Basic Books.
  • Niderst, Alain, 1976, Madeleine de Scudéry, Paul Pellisson et leur monde, Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • Sahlins, Peter, 2015, “A Tale of Three Chameleons: The Animal between Science and Literature in the Age of Louis XIV,” in French Thinking About Animals, eds. Louisa Mackenzie and Stephanie Posthumus, East Lansing, MI: Michigan State University Press.
  • Suzuki, Mihoko, 2018, “Political Writing Across Borders,” in A History of Early Modern Women’s Writing, ed. Patricia Berrahou Philippy, Cambridge, England: Cambridge University Press, 364–381. doi:10.1017/9781316480267.021
  • Timmermans, Linda, 1993, L’Accès des Femmes à la Culture (1598–1715), Paris: Éditions Champion.

Other Internet Resources

  • Digital versions of Madeleine de Scudéry’s writings in the original French editions can be found by searching at Gallica: Bibliothèque numérique, a section of the website of the Bibliothèque nationale de France.

Copyright © 2019 by
John Conley <>

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