Mathematical Style

First published Thu Jul 2, 2009; substantive revision Mon Oct 4, 2021

The essay begins with a taxonomy of the major contexts in which the notion of ‘style’ in mathematics has been appealed to since the early twentieth century. These include the use of the notion of style in comparative cultural histories of mathematics, in characterizing national styles, and in describing mathematical practice. These developments are then related to the more familiar treatment of style in history and philosophy of the natural sciences where one distinguishes ‘local’ and ‘methodological’ styles. It is argued that the natural locus of ‘style’ in mathematics falls between the ‘local’ and the ‘methodological’ styles described by historians and philosophers of science. Finally, the last part of the essay reviews some of the major accounts of style in mathematics, due to Hacking and Granger, and probes their epistemological and ontological implications.

1. Introduction

The goal of this essay is to survey and analyze the literature on style in history and philosophy of mathematics. In particular, the problem of how one can philosophically approach the notion of ‘style’ in mathematics will be addressed towards the end. Although this is not one of the canonical topics in philosophy of mathematics, the presentation will avail itself of relevant discussions on style in the history and philosophy of science.

Speaking about mathematics in terms of style is a common enough phenomenon. One encounters such appeals to stylistic features in mathematics already early in the seventeenth century. Bonaventura Cavalieri, for instance, as early as 1635 contrasts his indivisibilist techniques with the Archimedean style:

I know in fact that all the things mentioned above [Cavalieri’s own theorems obtained by indivisibilist proofs] can be reduced to Archimedean style. (In the original Latin: “Scio autem praefata omnia ad stylum Archimedeum reduci posse.” (Cavalieri 1635, 235)).

Later in the century it is easier to find examples. For instance Leibniz (1701, 270–71) writes: “Analysis does not differ from Archimedes’ style except for the expressions that are more direct and more appropriate to the art of discovery” (French: “L’analyse ne diffère du style d’Archimède que dans les expressions, qui sont plus directes et plus conformes à l’art d’inventer”). It is an interesting fact that such occurrences predate the generalized use of the notion of style in painting, which only dates from the 1660s (sporadic occurrences, as pointed out in Sauerländer 1983, are also found in the sixteenth century). Earlier in the seventeenth century the word of choice in painting was “manière” (see Panofsky 1924; English translation (1968, 240)). Here are a couple of additional examples from the nineteenth and the twentieth centuries. Chasles in his Aperçu historique (1837) speaking about Monge says:

He initiated a new way of writing and talking about this science. Style, in fact, is so intimately welded to the spirit of a methodology that it must advance in step with it; likewise, if it has anticipated it, style must of necessity play a powerful influence over it and over the general progress of science. (Chasles, 1837, §18, 207)

Another example comes from Edward’s evaluation of Dedekind’s approach to mathematics:

Kronecker’s brilliance cannot be doubted. Had he had a tenth of Dedekind’s ability to formulate and express his ideas clearly, his contribution to mathematics might have been even greater than Dedekind’s. As it is however, his brilliance, for the most part, died with him. Dedekind’s legacy, on the other hand, consisted not only of important theorems, examples, and concepts, but of a whole style of mathematics that has been an inspiration to each successive generation. (Edwards 1980, 20)

Obviously, one could pile up quotations of the same kind (see, among others, Cohen 1992, de Gandt 1986, Dhombres 1993, Epple 1997, Ferreirós and Reck 2020, Fleckenstein 1955, Granger 2003, Høyrup 2005, Laugwitz 1993, Novy 1981, Reck 2009, Tappenden 2005, Weiss 1939, Wisan 1981) but that would not be very interesting. Even in mathematics style ranges from ‘individual styles’ to ‘national styles’ to ‘epistemic styles’, among others. What is needed is first of all an understanding of the major contexts in which appeal to ‘style’ in mathematics occurs, although this essay will not contain much discussion of ‘individual styles’ (examples of such would include, to follow a suggestion by Enrico Bombieri, the “very personal” styles of Euler, Ramanujan, Riemann, Serre and A. Weil).

In many cases the appeal to the notion of style is conceived as borrowed from the fine arts and some cases will be discussed forthwith. Harwood 1993 claims that “the concept of style was devised in order to classify cultural patterns observed in the study of fine arts”. Wessely 1991 talks about “transferring that concept [of style] to the history of science” (265). While this might perhaps be true for the twentieth century (see also Kwa 2012), one should keep in mind, as was pointed out above, that this claim must be qualified for the seventeenth century.

2. Style as a central concept in comparative cultural histories

Notwithstanding the previous caveats, it is a fact that some major twentieth century appeals to the category of style in mathematics have done so in reference to the arts. This is especially true of those authors who were motivated by accounting in a unified way for the cultural production of mankind and who saw thus a uniformity in the processes of scientific and artistic production. It was in such context that Oswald Spengler in The Decline of the West (1919, 1921) attempted a morphology of world history and claimed that the history of mathematics was characterized by different stylistic epochs which depended on the culture that produced it:

The Style of any mathematics which comes into being, depends wholly on the Culture in which it is rooted, the sort of mankind it is that ponders it. The soul can bring its inherent possibilities to scientific development, can manage them practically, can attain the highest levels in its treatment of them—but is quite impotent to alter them. The idea of the Euclidean geometry is actualized in the earliest forms of Classical ornament, and that of the Infinitesimal Calculus in the earliest forms of Gothic architecture, centuries before the first learned mathematicians of the respective Cultures were born. (Spengler 1919, 59)

Not only are there parallels between mathematics and other artistic productions of a culture. Relying on Goethe’s statement that the complete mathematician “feels within himself the beauty of the true” and on Weierstrass’s pronouncement that “who is not at the same time a bit of a poet will never be a true mathematician”, Spengler went on to characterize mathematics itself as an art:

Mathematics, then, is an art. As such it has its styles and style periods. It is not, as the layman and the philosopher (who is in this matter a layman too) imagine, substantially unalterable, but subject like every art to unnoticed changes from epoch to epoch. (Spengler 1919, 62)

The most extensive treatment that builds on the parallel between art and mathematics and exploits the notion of style as a central category for an analysis of the history of mathematics is that of Max Bense. In a book appropriately entitled Konturen einer Geistesgeschichte der Mathematik (1946), Bense devoted a whole chapter (ch. 2) to articulating how the notion of style applies to mathematics. For Bense style is form:

For style is form, essential form, and we designate this form as the “Aesthetic”, if it controls categorially the sensible, a material. (Bense 1946, 118)

Bense saw the history of art and the history of mathematics as aspects of the history of mind [Geistesgeschichte]. In fact “style is given wherever the human imagination and the capacity of expression arrive to creation”. Bense was certainly prone to draw parallels between styles in the history of art and styles in mathematics (he especially treated the baroque and the romantic styles in his book) but he kept, in opposition to Spengler, the nature of art and mathematics separate. Indeed he recognized that a stylistic history of mathematics could not be reduced “to a coincidence between certain mathematical formal tendencies and the great artistic-worldviews-spiritual styles of single epochs such as the Renaissance, Classicism, the Baroque or Romanticism” (p.132; see Fleckenstein 1955 and Wisan 1981 for more recent parallels between the baroque in art and the mathematics of the seventeenth century). He referred to Felix Klein’s “Elementarmathematik vom höheren Standpunkte aus” to point out that certain lines of development characterized by Klein could be seen as pointing to styles in the history of the development of mathematics (see Klein 1924, 91).

Attempts such as Spengler’s and Bense’s appeal certainly to those theoreticians who would like to use the category of style as a tool for describing, and perhaps accounting for, cultural patterns. However, they leave the reader who is knowledgeable in mathematics and/or history of art skeptical on account of the usually far-fetched parallels that are supposed to provide evidence for the account. Of course, this is not to reject ultimately the approach or the usefulness of the appropriateness of the category of style in mathematics but one would like its use to be more directly related to aspects of mathematical practice. A recent attempt at connecting the notions of style in literature and in mathematics is van Bengedem and van Kerkhove 2014.

In general, one can distinguish two types of theorizing that can be associated with such attempts. The first is purely descriptive, or taxonomic, and satisfies itself with showing certain common patterns between a certain area of thought, such as mathematics, and other cultural products of a certain society. The second approach presupposes the first but also enquires after the causes that account for the presence of a certain style of thought or production and normally tries to ascribe it to psychological or sociological factors. In Spengler and Bense there are elements of both although the emphasis is more on the parallels than on the causes underlying or explaining the parallels.

Attempts to extend the use of the concept of style in art to other domains of human endeavors abound in the early twentieth century. A well-known case is Mannheim’s sociological attempt to characterize styles of thought within different social groups (Mannheim 1928). While Mannheim had not excluded scientific thought from the realm of sociological analysis of knowledge, he did not actively pursue such an analysis. By contrast, Ludwik Fleck practiced a sociological analysis of science in which “styles of thought” played a central role. Fleck focused however on medicine (Fleck 1935).

Here it is important to point out that the notion of thought style has received, by and large, two different developments in contemporary research, which also affect mathematics. First, there is the notion encountered in Fleck. Depending on how generous one wants to be in drawing connections, one could see this approach to styles of thought to be related to the later work by Kuhn, Foucault and Hacking (see below for a discussion of Hacking). There is however a different way of thinking about styles of thought, which usually goes under the name of cognitive styles. This is an area of interest to cognitive psychologists and mathematical educators (for an overview of the psychological research in this area see Riding 2000 and Stenberg and Grigorenko 2001). Here the focus is on the psychological make up of the individual who displays preference for a certain cognitive style either in learning, understanding or thinking about mathematics (i.e., processing and organizing mathematical information). The old distinction between visual and analytic mathematicians emphasized by Poincaré (see Poincaré 1905) is still part of the picture although there are a great variety of models and classifications. For an historical overview and a theoretical proposal centered on mathematics see Borromeo Ferri 2005.

In the area of history and philosophy of mathematics there are no book length accounts of mathematical styles that explain the emergence of a certain style with sociological or psychological categories (although Netz 1999 has been of interest to theoreticians of style as an attempt at a cognitive history of an important segment of Greek mathematics). This is in contrast to books in history of the natural sciences such as Harwood 1993, whose goal is to explain the emergence of the thought style of the German genetics community through sociological arguments. The closest one comes to such an account is Bieberbach’s conception of style in mathematics as dependent on psychological and racial factors. He will be discussed in the next section on national styles.

3. National styles in mathematics

Something less ambitious than the previous attempts at a general history of human cultural productions or far-reaching parallels between art and mathematics consists in a use of the notion of style as an historiographical category in the history of mathematics without particular reference to art or other human cultural activities. If one goes back to the beginning of the twentieth century, one finds that “national styles” were often referred to for categorizing certain features characterizing mathematical production that seemed to fall squarely within national lines. In the history of science such cases of “national styles” have often been studied. One should recall here J. Harwood’s book Styles of Scientific Thought (1993) and the contributions Nye 1986, Maienschein 1991, and Elwick 2007. A case of interest for mathematics is the opposition between French and German style in mathematics studied by Herbert Mehrtens.

Mehrtens (1990a, 1990b, 1996) describes, in terms of styles, the conflict in mathematics between “formalists” and “logicists” on the one hand and “intuitionists” on the other hand as a battle between two conceptions of mathematics (see also Gray 2008 for a critical take on of Mehrtens’s approach while emphasizing the “modernist” transformation of mathematics). Hilbert and Poincaré are used as paradigms for the sources of the opposition that later led to the Hilbert-Brouwer foundational debate in the 1920s (on the history of the Brouwer-Hilbert debate see Mancosu 1998). Mehrtens also points out that this opposition did not necessarily run along national lines as, for instance, Klein could be seen as close to Poincaré. Indeed, a certain internationalism in mathematics was dominant at the end of the nineteenth century and the early part of the twentieth century. However, WWI was to change the situation and gave rise to strong nationalistic conflicts. A central player in ‘nationalizing’ the opposition was Pierre Duhem who opposed the esprit de finesse of the French to the esprit de géométrie of the Germans:

To start from clear principles…then to make progress step by step, patiently, painstakingly, at a pace that the rules of deductive logic discipline with extreme severity: this is what German genius excels at; the German esprit is essentially esprit de géométrie…The Germans are geometers, they are not subtle [fin]; the Germans completely lack esprit de finesse. (Duhem 1915, 31–32)

Duhem intended his model to apply to the natural sciences but also to mathematics. Kleinert 1978 showed that Duhem’s book was only part of a reaction by French scientists to the 1914 declaration “Aufruf an die Kulturwelt” signed by 93 prominent German intellectuals. This led to the so called “Krieg der Geister” in which the polarization between Germany and France reached the point not only of criticizing the specific ways of making use of science (say practicing science with military aims) but also led to a characterization of scientific knowledge as essentially determined by national characteristics. In fact this strategy was basically used by the French in criticizing “La Science Allemande” but it will, twenty years later, be used by the Germans with the replacement of “national” by “rassisch”. The best known case is that of “Deutsche Physik” but here the focus will be on “Deutsche Mathematik” (see also Segal 2003 and Peckhaus 2005).

The most extreme form of this ideological confrontation, which ironically reversed the role of Germans and French in the comparison used by Duhem, is found in the writings of Ludwig Bieberbach, the founder of the so-called “Deutsche Mathematik”. Taking his start from the dismissal of Landau from the mathematical Faculty in Göttingen, Bieberbach tried to rationalize why the students had forced Landau’s dismissal. In a Kurzreferat for his talk he summarized his aims as follows:

My considerations aim at describing the influence for my own science, mathematics, of the people [Volkstum], of blood and race, on the style of creation by using several examples. For a national-socialist this requires of course no proof at all. It is rather an insight of great obviousness. For all our actions and thoughts are rooted in blood and race and receives from them their specificity. That there are such styles is also familiar to every mathematician. (Bieberbach, 1934a, 235)

In his two papers 1934b and 1934c, he claimed that the mathematics practiced by Landau was foreign to the German spirit. He compared Erhard Schmidt and Landau and claimed that in the first case

The system is directed towards the objects, the construction is organic. By contrast, Landau’s style is foreign to reality, antagonistic to life, inorganic. The style of Erhard Schmidt is concrete, intuitive and at the same time it satisfies all the logical demands. (Bieberbach 1934b, 237)

Other important oppositions brought forward by Bieberbach as “evidence” for his claims were Gauss vs. Cauchy-Goursat on complex numbers; Poincaré vs. Maxwell in mathematical physics; Landau vs. Schmidt; and Jacobi vs. Klein.

By relying on the psychology of types by the notorious Marburg psychologist Jaensch he then went on to oppose Jewish/Latin and German psychological types. The fault line, so to speak, was between a mathematics driven by intuition, typical of German mathematics, and the formalism allegedly espoused by the Jewish/Latin mathematicians. Obviously, Bieberbach was forced to do a lot of gerrymandering to make sure that important German mathematicians did not end up on the wrong side of the equation (see what he says of Weierstrass, Euler and Hilbert). The basis of these mathematical differences was to be found in racial characteristics:

In my considerations I have tried to show that in mathematical activity there are issues of style and that therefore blood and race are influential in the way of mathematical creation. (Bieberbach 1934c, 358–359)

The reason for discussing Bieberbach in this context is that his case exemplifies an attempt at rooting the notion of style in something more fundamental, such as national characteristics interpreted in terms of psychology and racial features. Moreover, his case is also of interest as his approach to style shows how such theorizing can be put in the service of a twisted political program.

Fortunately, talk of national styles in mathematics does not have to carry with it all the implications that were found in Bieberbach. Indeed, when historians today refer to national styles they do so without the nationalism that motivated the older contributions. Rather, they are concerned with describing how “local” cultures play a role in the constitution of knowledge (see also Larvor 2016). While increased mobility and email communications make it harder for national styles to thrive, special political conditions might also favor the persistence of such a style. This is the case, for instance, of the Russian style in algebraic geometry and representation theory. As Robert MacPherson has pointed out to the author, this case of national style would deserve a more extensive investigation and it would be interesting to study how the fall of the Soviet Union impacted this style. By contrast, an instance of a national style that has been extensively studied is that of Italian style algebraic geometry. This case has been studied with care by a number of historians of mathematics and in particular by Aldo Brigaglia (see also Casnati et al. 2016). For instance in a recent article, Brigaglia writes:

Moreover, the Italian school was not strictly a national ‘school,’ but rather a working style and a methodology, principally based in Italy, but with representatives to be found elsewhere in the world. (Brigaglia 2001, 189)

The scare quotes highlight the problem of trying to grasp the difference between ‘schools’, ‘styles’, ‘methodologies’ etc. (see Rowe 2003) There has been no attempt to discuss analytically the notion of ‘national style’ for the history of mathematics—in any case, nothing comparable to what Harwood 1993 does in the first chapter of his book. The situation is also complicated by the fact that different authors use different terminologies while perhaps referring to the same issue. For instance, there has been much talk recently of ‘images of mathematics’ (Corry 2004a, 2004b, Bottazzini and Dahan Dalmedico, 2001). In the last section, we shall return to reflect on these different usages of style in the historiographical literature on mathematics and how they compare with those in the natural sciences.

4. Mathematicians on style

So far the discussion has focused on style as a tool for philosophers of culture and for historians of mathematics. But do mathematicians recognize the existence of styles in mathematics? Once again, it would not be difficult to give isolated quotes where mathematicians might talk about the style of the ancients or the abstract algebraic style or categorial style. In logical work one finds occurrences of style in such denominations as ‘Bishop-style constructive mathematics’. What are difficult to find are systematic discussions by mathematicians of the notion of style. The case of Bieberbach was mentioned above but no detailed discussion of the examples he adduced as evidence of differences in style was given there, partly because they are so twisted by his desire to provide support for his ideological point of view that there are reasons to doubt that one would gain much by way of an analysis of his case studies.

An interesting contribution is an article by Claude Chevalley from 1935 titled “Variations du style mathématique”. Chevalley takes the existence of style for granted. He begins as follows:

Mathematical style, just like literary style, is subject to important fluctuations in passing from one historical age to another. Without doubt, every author possesses an individual style; but one can also notice in each historical age a general tendency that is quite well recognizable. This style, under the influence of powerful mathematical personalities, is subject every once in a while to revolutions that inflect writing, and thus thought, for the following periods. (Chevalley 1935, 375)

However, Chevalley did not try to reflect on the notion of style here involved. Rather he was concerned to show by means of an important example the features of the transition between two styles of doing mathematics that had characterized the passage from nineteenth century mathematics to twentieth century approaches. The first style described by Chevalley is the Weierstrassian style, ‘the style of ε’. It finds its ‘raison d’être’ in the need to rigorize the calculus moving away from the unclarities related to such notions as “infinitely small quantity” etc. The development of analysis in the nineteenth century (analytic functions, Fourier series, Gauss’ theories of surfaces, Lagrangian equations in mechanics etc.) led to a critical analysis

of the algebraic-analytical framework in front of which they found themselves; and it is from this critical examination that a completely new mathematical style was to emerge. (Chevalley 1935, 377)

Chevalley went on to single out the discovery of a continuous nowhere differentiable function, due to Weierstrass, as the most important element of this revolution. As Weierstrass’ function can be given in terms of a Fourier expansion with a quite normal appearance, it became obvious that many demonstrations in mathematics assumed closure condition that needed to be rigorously established. The concept of limit, as defined by Weierstrass, was the powerful tool that allowed such investigations. The reconstruction of analysis pursued by Weierstrass and his followers turned out to be not only foundationally successful but also mathematically fruitful. Here is how close Chevalley comes to characterizing this style:

The use on the part of the mathematicians of this school of the definition of limit due to Weierstrass can be noticed in the external appearance of their writings. First of all, in the intensive, and at times immoderate, usage of the “ε” equipped with various indexes (this is the reason why we have spoken above of a style of the “ε”s). Secondly, in the progressive replacement of equality for inequality in the demonstrations as well as in the results (approximation theorems; upper bound theorems; theory of increase, etc.). This last aspect will occupy us for it will make us understand the reasons that forced the overcoming of the Weierstrassian style of thinking. Indeed, while equality is a relation that is meaningful for mathematical beings whatsoever, inequality can only be applied to objects equipped with an order relation, practically only on the real numbers. In this way one was led, in order to embrace all of analysis, to reconstruct it entirely from the real numbers and from functions of real numbers. (Chevalley 1935, 378–379)

Out of this approach one could also build the system of complex numbers as pair of reals and the points of spaces in n dimensions as n-tuples of reals. This gave the impression that mathematics could be unified by means of constructive definitions starting from the real numbers. However, things went differently and Chevalley tries to account for the reasons that led one to give up this “constructive” approach in favor of an axiomatic approach. Various algebraic theories, such as group theory gave rise to relationships that could not be constructed starting from the real numbers. Moreover, the constructive definition of complex numbers was equivalent to fixing an arbitrary reference system and thus endowing these objects with properties that hid their real nature. On the other hand one was familiar with Hilbert’s axiomatization of geometry which, although rigorous, did not have the character of artificiality of the constructive theories. In this case the entities are not constructed but rather defined through the axioms. This approach developed to influence analysis itself. Chevalley mentioned the theory of Lebesgue integral that was obtained by first setting down what properties the integral had to satisfy and then showing that a domain of objects satisfying those properties existed. The same idea was used by Frechet by setting down the properties that were to characterize the operation of limit thereby arriving at a general theory of topological spaces. Another example mentioned by Chevalley is the axiomatization of field theory given by Steinitz in 1910. Chevalley concluded that

The axiomatization of theories has modified very deeply the style of contemporary mathematical writings. First of all, for every result obtained, one always needs to find out which ones are the strictly indispensable properties needed to establish it. One will seriously address the problem of giving a minimal demonstration of such result and to that effect one will need to delimit exactly in which domain of mathematics one is operating in such a way as to reject methods that are foreign to this domain since the latter are likely to bring about the introduction of useless hypotheses. (Chevalley 1935, 382)

Moreover, the constitution of domains that are perfectly suited to certain operations allows one to establish general theorems on the objects under consideration. In this way one can characterize the operations of infinitesimal analysis algebraically but without any of the naïveté which had characterized the previous algebraic approaches.

Chevalley’s article is a precious source from a contemporary mathematician on the topic of style. He forcefully shows the difference between the late nineteenth century arithmetization of analysis and the early twentieth century axiomatic-algebraic approach. However, it has its limitations. The notion of style is not thematized as such and it is not clear that the features adduced to explain the particular historical events might provide the general tools for analyzing other transitions in mathematical style. But perhaps that should, if anything, be the task of a philosopher of mathematics (for a detailed analysis of Chevalley’s approach to style see Rabouin 2017; for further developments, focused on Bourbaki style, see Marquis 2021).

5. The locus of style

In a book entitled “Introducción al estilo matematico” (1971) the Spanish philosopher Javier de Lorenzo attempted to write a history of mathematics (admittedly partial) in terms of style. Although by 1971 Granger’s work, to be discussed in section 5, had already appeared, de Lorenzo was not aware of it and the only source on style he uses is Chevalley’s article. Indeed this book is merely an extension of Chevalley’s study to include many more ‘styles’ that have appeared in the history of mathematics. The list of mathematical styles studied by de Lorenzo is the following:

  • Geometric style;
  • Poetic style;
  • Cossic style;
  • Cartesian-algebraic style;
  • The style of indivisibles;
  • Operational style;
  • Epsilon style;
  • Synthetic vs analytical styles in geometry;
  • Axiomatic style;
  • Formal style.

The general set up reminds one much of Chevalley’s approach and one would look in vain in de Lorenzo’s book for a satisfactory account of what style is. It is true that there are some interesting observations about the role of language in determining a style but a general philosophical analysis is missing. There is however an important point to be emphasized concerning the treatment given by Chevalley and de Lorenzo, which seems to point to an important feature of the use of ‘style’ in mathematics.

In his paper “De la catégorie de style en histoire des sciences” (Gayon 1996), and in the later Gayon 1999, Jean Gayon presents the different usages of ‘style’ in the historiography of science as falling between two camps (in a way he follows Hacking 1992 here). First, there is the usage of ‘scientific style’ on the part of those who pursue a ‘local history of science’. Usually this type of analysis focuses on ‘local groups or schools’ or on ‘nations’. For instance, this type of history deemphasizes the universal component of knowledge and stresses the difficulties involved in translating experiments from one setting to another. Such difficulties are shown to depend on the ‘local’ traditions, which include specific technical and theoretical know-how which is “fundamental to setting-up, realizing, and analyzing the outcome of those experiments” (Corry 2004b) Secondly, there is the use of ‘scientific style’ exemplified in works such as Crombie’s 1994 ‘Styles of Scientific Thinking in the European Tradition’. Crombie enumerates the following scientific styles:

  1. postulation in the axiomatic mathematical sciences
  2. experimental exploration and measurement of complex detectable relations
  3. hypothetical modelling
  4. ordering a variety by comparison and taxonomy
  5. statistical analysis of populations, and
  6. historical derivation of genetic development (quoted from Hacking 1996, 65)

Gayon remarks that this latter notion of ‘style’ could be replaced by ‘method’ and that ‘the styles discussed here have nothing to do with local styles’. He also remarks that when it comes to local styles the groups that act as sociological support for such analyses are either ‘research groups’ or ‘nations’. There has been much emphasis in recent history of the experimental sciences on such local factors (see, for instance, Gavroglu 1990 for the ‘styles of reasoning’ of two low temperature laboratories, that of Dewar (London) and that of Kamerlingh Onnes (Leiden)).

Historians of mathematics are now attempting to apply such historiographical approaches also to pure mathematics. A recent attempt in this direction is the work of Epple in terms of ‘epistemic configurations’ such as his recent article on Alexander and Reidemeister’s early work in knot theory (Epple 2004; but see also Rowe 2003 and 2004, and Epple 2011). The support groups for such investigations are not referred to as ‘schools’ but rather as ‘mathematical traditions’ or ‘mathematical cultures’.

What about the ‘methodological’ notion of style à la Crombie? Have historians of mathematics made much use of this? Apart from numerous treatments of the first style (axiomatic method), there is not much in this area but an interesting historical contribution is Goldstein’s work on Frenicle de Bessy (2001). She argues that the pure mathematics as practiced by Frenicle de Bessy had much in common with the Baconian style of experimental science. Perhaps one should mention here that experimental mathematics is now a blossoming field which might soon find its historian (see Baker 2008 for a philosophical account of experimental mathematics and Sørensen 2016 for an analysis in terms of mathematical cultures). This tends to be a topic of high interest for philosophers, as it impinges on issues of mathematical method. The problem can be simply put as follows: in addition to what Crombie lists as methodological style (a) [axiomatic], what other styles are pursued in mathematical practice? Corfield 2003 touches upon the problem in the introduction to his book “Towards a philosophy of ‘real’ mathematics” when he, referring to the Crombie list above, says:

Hacking applauds Crombie’s inclusion of (a) as ‘restoring mathematics to the sciences’ (Hacking 1996) after the logical positivists’ separation, and extends the number of its styles to two by admitting the algorithmic style of Indian and Arabic mathematics. I am happy with this line of argument, especially if it prevents mathematics been seen as an activity totally unlike any other. Indeed, mathematicians also engage in styles (b) (see chapter 3), (c) and (d) [7] and along the lines of (e) mathematicians are currently analyzing the statistics of the zeros of the Riemann zeta function. (Corfield 2003, 19)

In note 7 Corfield mentions John Thompson’s comment to the effect that the classification of finite simple groups is an exercise in taxonomy.

It is not the goal of this essay to address squarely the vast set of issues that emerge from the previous quotes. But it should be pointed out that these issues represent a fresh and stimulating territory for a descriptive epistemology of mathematics and that some work has already been carried out in this direction (see Etcheverría 1996; van Bendegem 1998; Baker 2008).

Finally, how to put together the ‘local’ and ‘methodological’ styles with what is found in Chevalley and de Lorenzo? In the case of mathematics there is good evidence that the most natural locus for ‘styles’ falls, so to speak, in between these two categories. Indeed, by and large, mathematical styles go beyond any local community defined in simpler sociological terms (nationality, direct membership in a school etc.) and are such that the support group can only be characterized by the specific method of enquiry pursued. On the other hand, the method is not so universal as to be identifiable as one of the six methods described by Crombie or in the extended list given by Hacking. Here are some possible examples, where the names attached to each position should not mislead the reader into thinking that one is merely dealing with ‘individual’ styles.

  1. Direct vs. indirect techniques in geometry (Cavalieri and Torricelli vs. Archimedes)
  2. Algebraic vs. geometrical approaches in analysis in the seventeenth and the eighteenth century (Euler vs. McLaurin)
  3. Geometrical vs. analytical approaches in complex analysis in the nineteenth century (Riemann vs. Weierstrass)
  4. Conceptual vs. computational approaches in algebraic number theory (Dedekind vs. Kronecker)
  5. structural vs intuitive styles in algebraic geometry (German school vs. Italian school)

Of course, it might just be the case that also in history and philosophy of science there are ‘intermediate’ levels of style such as the ones being described here (one example that comes to mind is ‘Newtonian style’ in mathematical physics) but the fact that Jean Gayon did not detect them as central seems to point to the fact that the situation in history and philosophy of mathematics is quite different, as these ‘intermediate’ styles are those that have been more thoroughly discussed and that correspond to the styles analyzed by Chevalley and de Lorenzo. Moreover, discussions of local mathematical cultures tend to do without the concept of style.

6. Towards an epistemology of style

The problem of an epistemology of style can perhaps be roughly put as follows. Are the stylistic elements present in mathematical discourse devoid of cognitive value and so only part of the coloring of mathematical discourse or can they be seen as more intimately related to its cognitive content? The notion of coloring here comes from Frege who distinguished in “The thought” between the truth condition of a statement and those aspects of the statement which might provide information about the state of mind of the speaker or hearer but do not contribute to its truth conditions. In natural language, typical elements of coloring are expressions of regret such as “unfortunately”. “Unfortunately, it’s snowing” has the same truth conditions as “it’s snowing” and “unfortunately”, in the first sentence, is only part of the coloring. Jacques and Monique Dubucs have generalized this distinction to proofs in “La couleur des preuves” (Dubucs and Dubucs 1994) where they deal with the problem of a ‘rhetoric of mathematics’, a problem quite close to that of an analysis of style. Dubbing traditional rhetoric as ‘residualist’, for it takes into account only phenomena of non-cognitive significance such as ornamentation etc. of the mathematical text but leaves the object (such as the content of a demonstration) untouched, they explored the options for a more ambitious “rhetoric of mathematics”.

One can thus begin to articulate the first position that can be defended with respect to the epistemological significance of style. It is a position that denies style any essential cognitive role and reduces it to a phenomenon of subjective coloring. According to this position, stylistic variations would only reveal superficial differences of expression that leave the content of discourse untouched.

Two more ambitious positions have been defended in the literature concerning the cognitive content of style. The first seems to be compatible with a form of Platonism or realism in mathematics whereas the second is definitely opposed to it. What is being alluded to are the two main proposals available in the literature, namely those of Granger 1968 and Hacking 1992, which will now be briefly described.

Granger’s Essay of a philosophy of style (Essai d’une philosophie du style 1968) is the most systematic and worked-out effort to develop a theory of style for mathematics. Granger’s program is so ambitious and rich that a thorough discussion of the structure of his book and of his detailed analyses would need a paper by itself (see also Benis-Sinaceur 2010). Due to limitation of space, the aim here is to give just a rough idea of what the project consists in and to show that the epistemological role of style defended by Ganger is compatible with a realism about mathematical entities or structures.

Granger’s aim is to provide an analysis of ‘scientific practice’. He defines practice as “an activity considered with its complex context, and in particular the social conditions which give it meaning in a world effectively experienced (vécu)” (1968, 6). Science he defines as “construction of abstract models, consistent and effective, of the phenomena” (13). Thus, a scientific practice has both ‘universal’ or ‘general’ components and ‘individual’ components. The analysis of scientific practice requires at least three types of investigations:

  1. There are many ways of structuring, by means of models, a certain phenomenon; and the same models can be applied to different phenomena. Moreover, scientific constructions, including mathematical ones, reveal a certain “structural unity”. Both of these aspects will be the theme of a stylistic analysis.
  2. The second investigation concerns a ‘scientific characteriology’, aimed a studying the psychological components which are relevant in the individuation of scientific practice;
  3. The third investigation concerns the study of the ‘contingency’ of scientific creation, always located in space and time.

All three aspects would be necessary for an analysis of ‘scientific practice’ but in his book Granger only focuses on 1. Where do style and mathematics come in? Mathematics comes in as one of the areas of investigation that can be subjected to a stylistic analysis of science (Granger’s book provides applications not only to mathematics but also to linguistics and the social sciences). What about style? Every social practice, according to Granger, can be studied from the point of view of style. This includes political action, artistic creation and scientific activity. There is thus a general stylistics that will try to capture the most general stylistic features of such activities and then more ‘local’ stylistic analyses such as the one provided by Granger for scientific activities. Obviously, the concept of style here invoked must be one that is much more encompassing than the one usually associated with this term and indeed one that would make application to such areas as political activity or scientific activity not just metaphorical but rather ‘connaturate’ to such activities.

Granger’s analysis of mathematical style takes up chapters 2, 3, and 4 of his book. Chapter 2 deals with Euclidean style and the notion of magnitude; chapter 3 with the opposition between ‘Cartesian style and Desarguian style’ (on the Cartesian style see also Rabouin 2017); finally, chapter 4 concerns the ‘birth of vectorial style’. All of these analyses center around the concept of “geometrical magnitude”.

One gets a good sense of what Granger is after by simply looking at an example that he describes in his preface. This is an example concerning the complex numbers.

Style, according to Granger, is a way of imposing structure to an experience. Experience must be taken here to go beyond empirical experience. In general the kind of experience the mathematician appeals to is not empirical. From this experience come the “intuitive” components that are structured in mathematical activity. But one should not think that there is an “intuition” to which, as it were externally, one then applies a form. The mathematical activity gives rise at the same time to form and content within the background of a certain experience.

Style appears to us here on the one hand as a way of introducing the concepts of a theory, of connecting them, of unifying them; and on the other hand, as a way of delimiting the what intuition contributes to the determination of these concepts. (Granger 1968, 20)

As an example Granger gives three ways of introducing the complex numbers; all three ways account for the structural properties which characterize the algebraic structure in question. The first way introduces the complex numbers by trigonometric representation using angles and directions. The second introduces them as operators applied to vectors. In the first case, one defines a complex number as a pair of real numbers and the additive properties are then immediate. By contrast, in the second case, it is the multiplicative properties that are immediately seized. But, and this is the third way, one can also introduce complex numbers by regular square matrices. This leads to seeing the complex numbers as a system of polynomials in x modulo x2+1.

These different ways of grasping a concept, of integrating it in an operative system and of associating to it some intuitive implications—of which one will have to delimit the exact extent—constitute what we call aspects of style. It is evident that the structural content of the notion is not here affected, that the concept qua mathematical object subsists identically through these effects of style. It is however not always so and we will encounter stylistic positions which demand true conceptual variations. What changes always, in any case, is the orientation of the concept towards this or that usage, this or that extension. Thus, style plays a role that is perhaps essential both with respect to the dialectic of the internal development of mathematics and to that of its relation to worlds of more concrete objects. (Granger 1968, 21).

Thus, in Granger’s theory mathematical styles are modes of presentation, or modes of grasping the mathematical structures. At least in some cases these effects of style leave the mathematical objects or structures unaffected although they will affect the cognitive mode in which they are apprehended, therefore affecting how they might be subjected to extension, applied in various areas etc. Even though Granger might have sympathized with a Kantianism without a transcendental subject, and thus think of style as constitutive, it seems that his position is at least compatible with a form of realism about mathematical entities. This does not seem to be the case for the third and final epistemological position to be discussed, which is due to Ian Hacking.

As pointed out earlier, Hacking, following Crombie, has proposed investigating the notion of style as a “new analytical tool” for history and philosophy of science. His preference is to speak of styles of reasoning (see also Mancosu 2005) as opposed to Fleck’s thought styles or Crombie’s styles of thinking (his most recent preference is to speak of ‘Styles of scientific thinking & doing’; for the most recent discussion of Hacking’s program at the time of writing see Kusch 2010 and the special issue of Studies in History and Philosophy of Science (issue 43, 2012), including Hacking 2012 and several other contributions). The reason is that Hacking wants to move away from the psychological level of reasoning and work with the more ‘objective’ level of arguments. He explicitly defines his project as a continuation of Kant’s project aimed at explaining how objectivity is possible. And indeed, Hacking’s position rejects realism and embraces a strongly constitutive role for style. According to Hacking, styles are defined by a set of necessary conditions (he does not attempt, wisely, to provide sufficient conditions):

There are neither sentences that are candidates for truth, nor independently identified objects to be correct about, prior to the development of a style of reasoning. Every style of reasoning introduces a great many novelties including new types of: Objects; evidence; sentences, new ways of being a candidate for truth or falsehood; laws, or at any rate modalities; possibilities. One should also notice, on occasion, new types of classification and new types of explanation. (Hacking 1992, 11)

It should be clear that this notion of style, just like Granger’s, attributes a very important role to style as grounding the objectivity of an entire area of scientific activity but that, unlike Granger’s, it is committed ontologically to a rejection of realism. Styles are essential in the constitution of mathematical objects and the latter do not have a form of existence independent of them. Hacking has not extensively discussed case studies from the history of mathematics although one of his papers (Hacking 1995) deals with four constructionalist images of mathematics (the word “constructionalism” is borrowed from Nelson Goodman) and shows how well they fit with his picture of ‘styles of thinking’. By implication, it is also clear that more robustly committed realistic positions will not fit well with Hacking’s account of reasoning styles.

Thus, three possible models for explicating the epistemological role of ‘styles’ in mathematics have been considered. There are surely many more possible positions waiting to be articulated but so far this is all that can be found in the literature.

7. Conclusion

As pointed out at the outset, the topic of mathematical style is not one of the canonical areas of investigation in philosophy of mathematics. Indeed, this entry is the first attempt to encompass in a single paper the multifarious contributions to this topic. Nonetheless, it should be clear by now that reflection on mathematical style is present in contemporary philosophical activity and deserves to be taken seriously. But the work is just beginning. One needs many more case studies of mathematical styles and a clearer articulation of the epistemological and ontological consequences yielded by different conceptualizations of style. In addition, one would like to see a better integration of all this work with the work on cognitive styles that is found in cognitive psychology and mathematical education. Finally, standard philosophical chestnuts, such as the relationship of form and content to style, and the relation of style to normativity and intentionality would also have to be addressed (for a very good discussion of such topics in aesthetics see Meskin 2005).


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I would like to thank Karine Chemla for having encouraged me to think about this topic and Andrea Albrecht, Enrico Bombieri, Leo Corry, Jacques Dubucs, Jean Gayon, James Hamilton, Robert MacPherson, Marco Panza, Chris Pincock, Martin Powell, Erich Reck, and Jamie Tappenden for useful comments on a previous draft and for their help in tracking down relevant literature. This essay is dedicated to Alessandra Schiaffonati, in memory of her inimitable style.

Copyright © 2021 by
Paolo Mancosu <mancosu@socrates.Berkeley.EDU>

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