# Inconsistent Mathematics

*First published Tue Jul 2, 1996; substantive revision Wed Nov 30, 2022*

Inconsistent mathematics is the study of the mathematical theories that result when classical mathematical axioms are asserted within the framework of a (non-classical) logic which can tolerate the presence of a contradiction without turning every sentence into a theorem.

- 1. Foundations of Mathematics
- 2. Arithmetic
- 3. Analysis
- 4. Geometrical Inconsistency
- 5. Chunk and Permeate
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Foundations of Mathematics

Inconsistent Mathematics began historically with foundational considerations. Frege and Russell proposed to found their mathematics on the naive principle of set theory: to every predicate is a set. But the naive principle leads rapidly to a proof of the existence of the Russell set, the set of all sets not members of themselves, which both is and is not a member of itself. This and other set-theoretic paradoxes noted by Russell and others led to attempts to produce consistent set theories as a foundation for mathematics. Perhaps the best known of these was Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory ZF. But ZF and others such as NBG and the like were in various ways ad hoc, having to include multiple independent principles instead of a single simple comprehension axiom. Hence, a number of people including da Costa (1974), Brady (1971, 1989), Priest, Routley, & Norman (1989, pp. 152, 498), considered it preferable to retain the full power of the natural comprehension principle, and tolerate a degree of inconsistency in set theory. Brady, in particular, has extended, streamlined and simplified these results on naive set theory in his book (2006). For a clear account see also Restall’s review (2007).

These constructions require, of course, that one dispense *at
least* with that principle of Boolean logic *ex contradictione
quodlibet* (ECQ) (from a contradiction every proposition may be
deduced, also called explosion). In passing, C.I.Lewis showed that ECQ
follows by a simple argument from the principle disjunctive syllogism
(DS) (from *A*-or-*B* and not-*A* deduce
*B*). So DS has to go too. Obviously, ECQ trivialises any
inconsistent theory (triviality = every sentence is provable).
Non-triviality should be regarded as a constraint on interesting
theories: a trivial theory is useless for mathematical calculation,
since a trivial theory does not distinguish principles in the theory
from their negations. Similarly, considerable debate (Burgess 1981,
Mortensen 1983), made it clear that dispensing with DS was not so
counter-intuitive, especially when a plausible story emerged about the
special conditions under which DS continues to hold.

It should also be noted that Brady’s construction of
inconsistent naive set theory opens the door to a revival of
Frege-Russell logicism (briefly, that mathematics reduces to logic.)
Logicism was widely held, even by Frege himself, to have been badly
damaged by the Russell Paradox. If the Russell Contradiction does not
spread, then there is no obvious reason why one cannot hold that naive
set theory provides an adequate foundation for mathematics, and that
naive set theory is deducible from logic via the naive comprehension
schema. The only change needed is a move to an inconsistency-tolerant
logic. Even more radically, Weber, in related papers (2010), (2012),
(2013), has taken the inconsistency to be a positive virtue, since it
enables us to settle several questions that were left open by Cantor,
namely, that the well-ordering theorem and the axiom of choice are
provable, and that the Continuum Hypothesis is false (2012, 284). Some
of these come out provably both true and false; wherein Weber is
concerned to advance proofs of the *classical recapture*, which
is the project of showing that traditional results remain provable
(2010, 72). This is invigorating new ground. Weber also showed
something essential to this project, namely, that Cantor’s
Theorem continues to hold; that is, it does not depend on
overly-strong logical principles which are contested by
paraconsistentists. Retaining Cantor’s Theorem is important in
Weber’s view, since different orders of infinity remain
available in inconsistent set theory.

In addition, mathematics contains machinery for a metalanguage, that
is for talking about mathematics itself. This includes the concepts:
(i) names for mathematical statements and other parts of syntax, (ii)
self-reference, (iii) proof and (iv) truth. Gödel’s
contribution to the philosophy of mathematics was to show that the
first three of these can be rigorously expressed in arithmetical
theories, albeit in theories which are either inconsistent or
incomplete. The possibility of a well-structured example of the former
of these two alternatives, namely inconsistency, was not taken
seriously, again because of belief in ECQ. However, in addition
natural languages seem to have their own truth predicate. Combined
with self-reference this produces the Liar paradox, “This
sentence is false”, an inconsistency. Priest (1987) and Priest,
Routley and Norman (1989, p. 154) argued that the Liar had to be
regarded as a statement both true and false, a true contradiction.
This represents another argument for studying inconsistent theories,
namely the claim that some contradictions are true, also known as
*dialetheism*. Kripke (1975) proposed instead to model a truth
predicate differently, in a consistent incomplete theory. We see below
that incompleteness and inconsistency are closely related.

To simplify the motivation, mathematics, like many another science, encounters anomalies, puzzles and paradoxes. Paradoxes typically appear in the form of contradictions where there are grounds for accepting incompatible sides of the contradiction. Mathematics progresses at least in part by eliminating anomalies in favour of consistent reconstructions. This has typically been the method of addressing anomalies, and it is facilitated by noticing that the contradictions emerge in the foundations of mathematics. But it was noticed in the later twentieth century that there is another way, namely accept the contradiction and develop mathematical theories containing both sides of the contradiction. This would be impossible if the contradictory theory was erected on a logical foundation containing the Boolean principle Ex Contradictione Quodlibet ECQ, from a contradiction everything follows. So ECQ has to be abandoned, but fortunetely that proves possible, indeed mathematically straightforward. What remains is a rich field, of novel mathematical applications interesting in their own right, which sidestep the vexing questions of which foundational principles to adopt, by developing contradictions in areas of mathematics such as number theory or analysis which are far from foundations. This is inconsistent mathematics.

## 2. Arithmetic

But these remarks have been about foundations, and mathematics is not
its foundations. Hence there is a further independent motive, to see
what mathematical structure remains *wherever* the constraint
of consistency is relaxed. But it would be wrong to regard this as in
any way a repudiation of the structures studied in classical
mathematics: inconsistent structures represent an *addition* to
known structures.

Robert K. Meyer (1976) seems to have been the first to think of an inconsistent arithmetical theory. At this point, he was more interested in the fate of a consistent theory, his relevant arithmetic R#. This amounts to the axioms for Peano arithmetic, with a base of the quantified relevant logic RQ, and Meyer hoped that the weaker base of relevant logic would allow more models. He was right. There proved to be a whole class of inconsistent arithmetical theories; see Meyer and Mortensen (1984), for example. In a parallel with the above remarks on rehabilitating logicism, Meyer argued that these arithmetical theories provide the basis for a revived Hilbert Program. Hilbert’s program was the project of rigorously formalising mathematics and proving its consistency by simple finitary/inductive procedures. It was widely held to have been seriously damaged by Gödel’s Second Incompleteness Theorem, according to which the consistency of arithmetic was unprovable within arithmetic itself. But a consequence of Meyer’s construction was that within his arithmetic R# it was demonstrable by finitary means that whatever contradictions there might happen to be, they could not adversely affect any numerical calculations. Hence Hilbert’s goal of conclusively demonstrating that mathematics is trouble-free proves largely achievable as long as inconsistency-tolerant logics are used.

The arithmetical models used by Meyer and Mortensen later proved to
allow inconsistent representation of the truth predicate. They also
permit representation of structures beyond natural number arithmetic,
such as rings and fields, including their order properties.
Axiomatisations were also provided. Recently, the finite inconsistent
arithmetical collapse models, a strictly larger class than those
studied by Meyer and Mortensen, have been completely characterised by
Graham Priest. Collapse models are obtained from classical models by
collapsing the domain down to congruence classes generated by various
congruence relations. When members of the same congruence class are
identified, the theories produced are inconsistent. For example,
Meyer’s initial construction collapsed the integers under the
congruence *modulo 2*. This puts 0 and 2 in the same congruence
class, so that in a suitable three-valued logic, both 0=2 and
not-(0=2) hold. Priest showed that these models take a certain general
form, see Priest (1997) and (2000). Strictly speaking, Priest went a
little too far in including “clique models”. This was
corrected by Paris and Pathmanathan (2006), and extended into the
infinite by Paris and Sirokfskich (2008). Even more recently, Tedder
(2015) obtained axiomatisations for the class of finite collapse
models with a different background logic, Avron’s A3.

## 3. Analysis

One could hardly ignore the examples of analysis and its special case, the calculus. For a model-theoretic approach to these see Mortensen (1990, 1995).

Now Meyer’s original approach to the natural numbers, that is
R#, was axiomatic rather than model-theoretic. The axiomatic approach
has also been taken in *analysis* by McKubre-Jordens and Weber
(2012). In axiomatising analysis with a base of paraconsistent logic,
their paper pushes Meyer’s approach to arithmetic via R# a long
way further. These same authors (2017) rework the theory of
integration as it was in Archimedes’ hands, which employs the
method of exhaustion, using paraconsistent reasoning. This gives a
result “up to inconsistency”, which means that one is able
to prove “Classical result or contradiction”. The
classical result can be then seen to be recapturable by the classical
move disjunctive syllogism applied to the classically-false
(inconsistent) second disjunct.

It is certainly important and worthy to pursue this direction, but a mild caution is entered here: the axiomatic project is a bit different from inconsistent mathematics. As noted earlier, Meyer in this phase was consistentist – he sought a consistent theory with an inconsistency-tolerant logic. With similar motivation, he was also concerned to try to settle what he called “the gamma problem”, which was essentially the question of whether the axiomatic theory R# could be shown to contain classical Peano arithmetic as a sub-theory. If this were so, then his proof of nontriviality for R# would immediately yield a new proof of the negation consistency of classical Peano arithmetic! Note that this would not be contrary to Godel’s Second Theorem, since presumably the proof of the gamma result would not be confined to finitary techniques. (In the case of Meyer’s theory, it turned out to be not so.)

There have proved to be many places throughout analysis where there
are distinctive inconsistent insights. The examples in the remainder
of this section are drawn from Mortensen (1995). For example: (1)
Robinson’s (1974) non-standard analysis was based on
infinitesimals, quantities smaller than any real number, as well as
their reciprocals, the infinite numbers. This has an inconsistent
version, which has some advantages for calculation in being able to
discard higher-order infinitesimals. Interestingly, the theory of
differentiation turned out to have these advantages, while the theory
of integration did not. A similar result, using a different background
logic, was obtained by Da Costa (2000). (2) Another place to find
applications of inconsistency in analysis is topology, where one
readily observes the practice of cutting and pasting spaces being
described as “identification” of one boundary with
another. One can show that this can be described in an inconsistent
theory in which the two boundaries are both identical and not
identical, and it can be further argued that this is the most natural
description of the practice. (3) Yet another application is the class
of inconsistent continuous functions. Not all functions which are
classically discontinuous are amenable of inconsistent treatment; but
some are, for example *f*(*x*)=0 for all *x*<0
and *f*(*x*)=1 for all *x*≥0. The inconsistent
extension replaces the first < by ≤, and has distinctive
structural properties. These inconsistent functions may well have some
application in dynamic systems in which there are discontinuous jumps,
such as quantum measurement systems. Differentiating such functions
leads to the delta functions, applied by Dirac to the study of quantum
measurement. (4) Next, there is the well-known case of inconsistent
systems of linear equations, such as the system (i)
*x*+*y*=1, plus (ii) *x*+*y*=2. Such
systems can potentially arise within the context of automated control.
Little work has been done classically to solve such systems, but it
can be shown that there are well-behaved solutions within inconsistent
vector spaces. (5) Finally, one can note a further application in
topology and dynamics. Given a supposition which seems to be
conceivable, namely that whatever happens or is true, happens or is
true on an open set of (spacetime) points, one has that the logic of
dynamically possible paths is open set logic, that is to say
intuitionist logic, which supports incomplete theories par excellence.
This is because the natural account of the negation of a proposition
in such a space says that it holds on the largest open set contained
in the Boolean complement of the set of points on which the original
proposition held, which is in general smaller than the Boolean
complement. However, specifying a topological space by its closed sets
is every bit as reasonable as specifying it by its open sets. Yet the
logic of closed sets is known to be paraconsistent, ie. supports
inconsistent nontrivial theories; see Goodman (1981), for example.
Thus given the (alternative) supposition which also seems to be
conceivable, namely that whatever is true is true on a closed set of
points, one has that inconsistent theories may well hold. This is
because the natural account of the negation of a proposition, namely
that it holds on the smallest closed set containing the Boolean
negation of the proposition, means that on the overlapping boundary
both the proposition and its negation hold. Thus dynamical theories
determine their own logic of possible propositions, and corresponding
theories which may be inconsistent, and are certainly as natural as
their incomplete counterparts.

On closed set logic and boundaries as a natural setting for contradictory theories, see Mortensen (2003, 2010). Weber and Cotnoir (2015) also explore the inconsistency of boundaries, arising from the incompatibility of the three principles (i) there are boundaries, (ii) space is topologically connected, and (iii) discrete entities can be in contact (i.e., no space between them). This is a very interesting problem, as all three are plausible; in particular there do seem to be boundaries in our world. An initially surprising feature of this account is that boundaries come out as “empty”; after all, null entities are contrary to the spirit of mereology. But this is not so shocking as it turns out that they are only empty in the sense that they have members inconsistently.

Category theory throws light on many mathematical structures. It has certainly been proposed as an alternative foundation for mathematics. Such generality inevitably runs into problems similar to those of comprehension in set theory; see, e.g., Hatcher 1982 (pp. 255–260). Hence there is the same possible application of inconsistent solutions. There is also an important collection of categorial structures, the toposes, which support open set logic in exact parallel to the way sets support Boolean logic. This has been taken by many to be a vindication of the foundational point of view of mathematical intuitionism. However, it can be proved that that toposes support closed set logic as readily as they support open set logic, to date the only category-theoretic semantics for a paraconsistent logic. This should not be viewed as an objection to intuitionism, however, so much as an argument that inconsistent theories are equally reasonable as items of mathematical study. See Mortensen (1995 Chap 11, co-author Lavers). This position has now been taken up, extended and ably defended by Estrada-González (2010, 2015a, 2015b). The same author (2016) undertakes to provide a category-theoretic description of trivial theories, with the aim of showing that triviality is not such an uninteresting feature for mathematical theories to have. The present author remains unconvinced, since a trivial theory is surely useless for mathematical calculation; but the ingenuity of the arguments must be conceded.

Duality between incompleteness/intuitionism and
inconsistency/paraconsistency has at least two aspects. First there is
the above topological (open/closed) duality. Second there is Routley *
duality. The Routley Star * of a set of sentences *S*, is
defined as *S** =_{df} {*A*:
~*A* is not in *S*}. Discovered by the Routleys (1972)
as a semantical tool for relevant logics, the * operation dualises
between inconsistent and incomplete theories of the large natural
class of de Morgan logics. For example, starring Peano arithmetic
gives a deductively-closed inconsistent complete non-trivial classical
arithmetical theory containing all of PA, which presents an
interesting challenge for the Godel incompleteness results, see
Mortensen (2013). Both kinds of duality interact as well, where the *
gives distinctive duality and invariance theorems for open set and
closed set arithmetical theories. On the basis of these results, it is
fair to argue that both kinds of mathematics, intuitionist and
paraconsistent, are equally reasonable.

## 4. Geometrical Inconsistency

A geometrical development is the application to explaining the
phenomenon of inconsistent pictures. The best known of these are
perhaps M. C. Escher’s masterpieces *Belvedere,
Waterfall* and *Ascending and Descending*. In fact the
tradition goes back millennia to Pompeii. Escher seems to have derived
many of his intuitions from the Swedish artist Oscar Reutersvärd,
who began his inconsistent work in 1934. Escher also actively
collaborated with the English mathematician Roger Penrose. There have
been several attempts to describe the mathematical structure of
inconsistent pictures using classical consistent mathematics, by
theorists such as Cowan, Francis and Penrose. As argued in Mortensen
(1997), however, no consistent mathematical theory can capture the
sense that one is seeing an impossible thing. Only an inconsistent
theory can capture the content of that perception. This amounts to an
appeal to a cognitive justification of paraconsistency. One can then
proceed to display inconsistent theories which are candidates for such
inconsistent contents. There is an analogy with classical mathematics
on this point: projective geometry is a classical consistent
mathematical theory which is interesting because we are creatures with
an eye, since it explains why it is that things look the way they do
in perspective.

Inconsistent geometrical studies are further developed in Mortensen (2002a), where category theory is applied to give a general description of the relationships between the various theories and their consistent cut-downs and incomplete duals. For an informal account which highlights the difference between visual “paradoxes” and the philosophically more common paradoxes of language, such as the Liar, see Mortensen (2002b).

More recently, inconsistent mathematical descriptions have been
obtained for several classes of inconsistent figures, exemplified by
Escher’s Cube (found in his print *Belvedere*), the
Reutersvärd-Penrose triangle, and others. See Mortensen
(2010).

This raises another interesting issue. Ever since Euclid, the method of reductio ad absurdum has been thoroughly exploited in geometrical proofs (assume he opposite of what you want to prove and deduce a contradiction). But here we have a different technique (employ a contradiction to describe how inconsistent figures look, to demonstrate that the content is genuinely contradictory). If successful, this is a demonstration that human conceptualisation exceeds the merely possible (consistent). For discussion see Mortensen (2019, 2022).

One more point: do these geometrical paradoxes lend support to full
dialetheism? The answer is no. If you can draw a contradictory picture
then *something *exists that is inconsistent. And, distinct
inconsistent figures imply distinctions between types of
contradictions which ECQ does not permit. But this should not be
pushed too far. Nothing says that because a picture has a content,
that content must somehow be *true*: many pictures are
fictional in content. For more on this theme see Mortensen
(2019a).

## 5. Chunk and Permeate

Recently, an alternative technique for dealing generally with contradictions has emerged. Brown and Priest (2004) have proposed a technique they call “Chunk and Permeate”, in which reasoning from inconsistent premisses proceeds by separating the assumptions into consistent theories (chunks), deriving appropriate consequences, then passing (permeating) those consequences to a different chunk for further consequences to be derived. They suggest that Newton’s original reasoning in taking derivates in the calculus, was of this form. This is an interesting and novel approach, though it must meet the objection that to believe a conclusion obtained on this basis, one should believe all the premisses equally; and so an argument of the more common form, appealing to all the premisses without fragmenting them, should be eventually forthcoming. The objection is thus that Chunk and Permeate is part of the context of discovery rather than the context of justification.

Later, Benham *et. al.* (2014) have extended these methods to
the Dirac delta function. This broadens the class of applications, and
so strengthens the technique. However, it also becomes clear there,
that there is a close parallel between (one large class of) Chunk and
Permeate applications, and (consistent) non-standard analysis:
wherever Chunk and Permeate takes a derivative by shifting chunks to
one where infinitesimals are zero, non-standard analysis takes a
derivative by defining derivatives to be “standard parts
only”. Of course, equivalence between these two techniques does
not show which is explanatorily deeper. Developments are to be awaited
with interest.

## 6. Conclusion

To conclude: there has been appearing lately quite a bit of
philosophical material, that is sympathetic to the cause of
inconsistent mathematics. Colyvan (2000) addresses the issue that
inconsistent mathematical theories imply inconsistent mathematical
objects as their subject-matters. He also takes up the important task
of providing an account of how inconsistent mathematics can have a
branch which is *applied* mathematics. Priest (2013), like
Colyvan, notes that inconsistent mathematics adds to the platonist
mix. Berto (2007) usefully surveys paradoxes and foundational issues,
and sets out some of the arithmetical results that bear on important
philosophical issues like the Incompleteness Theorems. Van Bendegem
(2014) pursues the interesting motivation that change is always a
state of anomaly, so that always changing implies always anomalous.
Examples include infinitesimals, complex numbers and infinity. Caution
should be adopted over thinking that inconsistency is always
anomalous, however, if only because it is simply more material for
mathematical study.

It should be emphasised again that these structures do not in any way challenge or repudiate existing mathematics, but rather extend our conception of what is mathematically possible. This, in turn, sharpens the issue of Mathematical Pluralism; see e.g., Davies (2005), Hellman and Bell (2006), or Priest (2013). Various authors have different versions of mathematical pluralism, but it is something along the lines that incompatible mathematical theories can be equally true. The case for mathematical pluralism rests on the observation that there are different mathematical “universes” in which different, indeed incompatible, mathematical theorems or laws hold. Well-known examples are the incompatibility between classical mathematics and intuitionist mathematics, and the incompatibility between ZF-like universes of sets respectively with, and without, the Axiom of Choice. It seems absurd to say that ZF with Choice is true mathematics and ZF without Choice is false mathematics, if they are both legitimate examples of mathematically well-behaved theories.

The primary question for the philosophy of mathematics is surely
*what is mathematics*. Duality operations like topological
duality or Routley* reinforce the point that incomplete/inconsistent
duals are equally reasonable as examples of mathematics. From this
point of view, disputes about which of intuitionist or classical or
inconsistent mathematics to accept seem pointless; they are all part
of the subject matter of mathematics. This point is made effectively
by Shapiro (2014, in contrast see his 2002). Shapiro’s
distinctive position has other ingredients: mathematics as the science
of structure, and mathematical pluralism implying logical pluralism
(on logical pluralism see also Beall and Restall 2006); but we do not
take these up here.

For what it is worth, the present writer thinks that some version of mathematical pluralism is obviously true, if one takes mathematics to be firstly about mathematical theories allowing for inconsistency , and only secondly about the objects internal to those theories. There is, of course, no problem about incompatible theories co-existing, if considered as structures of propositions. The primacy of theories fits, too, with the natural observation that the epistemology of mathematics is deductive proof. It is only if one takes as a starting point the primacy of the mathematical object as the truth-maker of theories, that one has to worry about how their objects manage to co-exist.

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