Notes to Meaning Holism

1. There have been other ways of characterizing holism and atomism, most notably Fodor and Lepore's characterization of holism in terms of the metaphysical thesis that “A property is holistic just in case if anything has it, then lots of things do” (Fodor & Lepore 1992: 6). However, this typically isn't how meaning holism is defined, and holists in the more typical sense presented above might admit that there could be a language with just one word, yet still insist that for whatever number of words a language had, the meanings of those words would have to be interdependent. In particular, while they could admit that there could be languages with a single word, they would still insist that English is not one of them, and that the meanings of English terms were determined holistically (see Khalidi 1993). In what follows, then, I will be assuming that holism is characterized in terms of some version of the interdependence view.

2. So while Harman (1973) typically characterizes meaning in terms of inferential role, he is happy to claim that “What our words mean depends on everything we believe, on all the assumptions we are making” (Harman 1973: 14).

3. See Pagin 2006 for a more systematic attempt to characterize various ways of understanding the “interdependence” talk associated with holism.

4. Generalizing, perhaps incorrectly, from Wittgenstein's claim that “For a large class of cases—though not for all—in which we employ the word “meaning” it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language” (Wittgenstein 1953: 43).

5. That is, the “kind of mental content that does not depend on an individual's environment” (Brown 2011). Both arguments deriving holism from the needs of a preferred form of psychological explanation would presuppose that you can get holism about meaning by establishing holism about mental content, and many arguments for meaning holism rely on such a transition.

6. This formulation is taken from Devitt 1993: 281, who claims “at its most extreme, semantic, or meaning, holism is the doctrine that all of the inferential properties of an expression constitute its meaning” (Devitt 1993: 281).

7. For a discussion of the analytic/synthetic distinction and Quine's criticism of it, see Rey 2008.

8. For a discussion of this problem see Lewis 1983, 1984; the rather robust type of metaphysical realism that he suggests as a solution to this problem, is, for many philosophers, a cost in itself.

9. The move from Devitt 1980 to Devitt 1996 is a good illustration of this.

10. For a discussion for how such cases cause problems for asymmetric dependence theories, see Margolis & Laurence 1999: 68.

11. Of course, the atomist and molecularist could argue that the meaning holist faces a number of serious problems as well, and their reasons for thinking this will be the subject of the section 3.

12. Of course this view itself could be described as a type of “metasemantic” holism that is not without its interest, and some philosophers commonly associated with holism (such as Davidson 1984) might best be understood as metasemantic holists rather than meaning holists. While meaning holism suggests that any difference in my beliefs would produce a corresponding difference in what I mean, this merely metasemantic holism has no such commitment to instability. If, for instance, one endorsed a (roughly Davidsonian) holistic metasemantic view according to which what I meant by all my terms was equated to the set of assignments that maximizes the truth of all my beliefs, then what I meant by, say, “mug” would probably be the set of objects that made most of my “mug”-beliefs true, and there is little reason to think that the members of that set of objects would change if I were to replace my belief that “my favorite coffee mug is in the kitchen” with the belief “my favorite coffee mug is in the study”. What I meant would be a function of all my beliefs, but that function would not be not one-to-one. (For more on this, see Pagin 1997, 2006; Jackman 1999a, 2003a, 2006). Because of this, the worries about communication, language learning, disagreement, inference and change of mind that plague the meaning holist (see section 3.2) seem considerably less pressing (indeed, not pressing at all) for the merely metasemantic holist that denies that the function from use to meaning is one-to-one.

13. As he puts it:

The semantic values of all the logically compound sentences are computable entirely from the semantic values of less complex sentences. It is just that one may need to look at the values of many—in the limit all—the less complex sentences, not just the ones that appear as sub-formulae of the compound whose semantic value is being computed. The semantics is projectible and systematic, in that semantic values are determined for all syntactically admissible compounds, or arbitrary degrees of complexity. It is learnable—at least in principle, putting issues of contingent psychology aside, in the ideal sense that we have been working with. (Brandom 2008: 135)

14. Though for some doubts about how much further this sort of truth-conditional semantics can go, see Pietroski 2003, 2005.

15. This connection between meaning holism and instability is not only assumed by critics of holism, such as Fodor and Lepore 1992 and Devitt 1996, but is also taken for granted in sympathetic “expository” accounts of what holism is such as Block 1998 and Guttenplan 1994. Indeed Block (1995: 152), and to a certain extent Horwich (2005: 38), are willing to define meaning holism in terms of this purported consequence. (See also Becker 1998; Lormand 1996 and Margolis & Laurence 1998 for more accounts foregrounding the importance of instability, and Pagin 2006 for one of the few general expositions of the view that doesn't make this assumption.)

16. Given the assumption that no one means the same thing by all of their words, the conclusion that meaning is idiosyncratic follows directly from meaning holism. The suggestion that meaning must also be unstable follows not from meaning holism alone, but rather from combination of meaning holism and the assumptions that meaning is a function of our use. For instance, the worry that meaning holism entails that no one means the same thing by their words today as they did yesterday (because everyone makes at least some change to their belief each day) presupposes not just meaning holism, but also such a tight (perhaps even one-to-one) connection between meaning use (here understood in terms of belief). (Thanks to David Chalmers stressing this.). That said, while meaning holism doesn't entail that meaning be tied to use in this way, of the arguments for meaning holism typically presuppose such a connection, so the objections to meaning holism that assume that the meaning holist understands meaning in terms of use still have considerable bite. The meaning holist can't simply give up the meaning/use connection without undercutting the motivation for their own view. (Though we will see that some responses to the objections to meaning holism work by at least loosening the connection between meaning and individual use.)

17. Though see MacFarlane 2007 for a discussion of this “natural” sense of disagreement, and a suggestion for a more nuanced explication of disagreement that the meaning holist might avail themselves of (though MacFarlane has explaining disagreement for the Relativist not the holist in mind).

18. This would be less serious if one had a notion of belief in which one already, in some sense, believed all of the inferential commitments of one's explicit beliefs (Brandom 1994), though it would still have the consequence of an invalid inference changing the meanings of the terms involved because of the new commitments acquired.

19. This objection downplays, of course, the importance of psychological generalizations such as “If someone wants \(X\) more than \(Y\), and is given a choice between \(X\) and \(Y\), they will choose \(X\)”, which could still be confirmed even if everyone meant something different by what went in the “\(X\)” and the “\(Y\)” slots.

20. Of course it would also entail that the narrow meanings of “water” for oneself and one's Twin-Earth counterpart would not be similar at all (since we would endorse none of the same “wide” water inferences). This makes the “narrow” content still externalist in some sense (which might be a good or bad thing depending on one's perspective—for instance, this lack of similarity could explain why my twin and I purportedly don't really succeed in communicating about “water”), and thus suggests that the notion of “similarity” we end up with is quite different from the intuitive one (in which we and our Twin-Earth counterparts have mental states with similar contents). If one typed beliefs by their “partial character” (White 1982), one could avoid this problem and argue that contents were similar if they were tied to many beliefs with the same partial character.

21. Margolis & Laurence 1999: 64, though see Block 1993: 68, for a very different take on the independence of narrow and wide content.

22. Bilgrami's defense of the “locality of content” should not be confused with Devitt's “localism” which is a type of context-invariant meaning molecularism that Bilgrami would reject. (For a discussion of this, see Talmage 1998.)

23. One possibility is that Bilgrami's view, rather than being a type of contextualism about content is actually a type of relativism, and that the same belief could be ascribed different contents (though always a subset of the speaker's aggregate content) depending on the varying interests of different ascribers and interlocutors (should the speaker be speaking to a group, or have his utterance reported to a different audience). (Though see note 30 for some reasons for thinking that Bilgrami himself couldn't go this way, even if other contextualists could.)

24. See Burge 1979, and the discussion in Lau & Deutsch 2012.

25. This particular problem would be eliminated if the anti-individualist tied meaning to the inferences or beliefs that a society ultimately endorsed rather than merely the ones that they currently do (see Jackman 1999b). However, this sort of anti-individualism is comparatively rare, and for present purposes, would leave us with a position that is very much like the “normative” response to instability that we will discuss in more detail below.

26. Though, of course, Brandom would not indentify them himself in quite this way.

27. It is, then, not surprising, that defenders of Normative accounts often focus on counterfactual supporting inferences as being meaning determining (Brandom 2009: 55, 172; Sellars 1948), and thus avoid the worry above. Of course, moving from merely truth preserving to counterfactual supporting inferences might seem to push one towards molecularism, but even a comparatively limited set of inferences could still exhibit the spreading effect mentioned in section 2.1. (That is, even if only a subset of inferences were relevant to the meaning of each term, these subsets could still be extensive enough for the meanings of each term to be interrelated.)

28. Or if the meaning holist understood things in terms of inferences, we could talk about the validity of the corresponding inferences being guaranteed by the meanings of the terms involved.

29. As suggested earlier, one could be a meaning holist and still claim that many of our beliefs aren't meaning-constitutive, provided that the set of beliefs one did let in were interconnected enough for every term in the language to be ultimately entangled with every other. However, most meaning holists take the more extreme position of letting every belief count.

30. Unless, of course, one took the person evaluating me and my interlocutor as creating a new context, and relative to that context our claims are false. This would, of course, entail a much more widespread relativism than the sort MacFarlane (2014) defends. Incidentally, this relativist, rather than contextualist, reading of the locality principle would sit badly with Bilgrami's claim that, unlike aggregate contents, Local contents have a type of “psychological reality” (Bilgrami 1992: 12), and Bilgrami's stated lack of sympathy with relativism (see Bilgrami 2011), so it is unlikely that Bilgrami himself would want to take the position in this direction.

Copyright © 2014 by
Henry Jackman <>

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