Supplement to Alexius Meinong

Presentation of Objects via Psychological Content

A. Meinong’s Introduction of Psychological Content

According to Meinong, any variation on the side of the objects is correlated to a variation of some mental component which is the psychological content of the experience. The difference between the objects must somehow come down to an internal difference between the presentations in question. If you have two different representations, one of red and another of green, for example, the difference between the objects corresponds to a genuinely mental difference, namely the difference between the psychological red-content and the psychological green-content. Analogously, there are different thought contents which correspond to the different objectives you judge or assume (“that it is raining” and “that it is snowing”, for instance).

Meinong believed that a difference in the act components of experiences is a genuinely mental difference, and he also believed that acts of thinking of different objects constitute different mental events (experiences). The difference in the objects themselves, however, is not mental, although it is strongly correlated with a genuinely mental difference — the difference between the corresponding psychological contents.

Like Twardowski, Meinong put forward a variety of reasons in favor of the existence of psychological contents (1899, §2: 188 [143]): “This [the content] exists, is therefore real and present, is also mental of course, even when the object represented, so to speak, by means of it, may be non-existent, non-real, non-present, non-mental.”

The psychological content of a presentation is something immanent, but it is usually not an immanent object in the sense of both being the object of the presentation and also existing inside the presentation. The psychological content becomes such an immanent object only if it is the object of a so-called “self-presentation”, i.e., in a reflexive experience in which the content presents itself, so to speak (see below 4.2). Neither an existing real thing that is not mental, nor a subsisting ideal thing, can literally exist in the mind, and the same holds true of things like the golden mountain or the round square, because they lack any kind of being. Although Meinong admits non-existent objects, he claims that existing in the presentation (something like Anselm’s existing in the understanding) is not existence at all; it is at most “pseudo-existence” (1899, §2: 186 [142]; 1906, §10: 54–57). What, in fact, does exist in the case of the representation of the golden mountain, for example, is the whole representation of the golden mountain, which includes the act component and the content component as its parts. Contents are therefore individuals or particulars; they can be understood as mental tokens.

B. Mental Contents as Qualia that Can Be Introspected

In speaking of the qualitative peculiarity of content [das qualitativ Eigenartige am Inhalt] in view of the corresponding objects and meanings of words, Meinong alludes to the experiential character of content (1906, §11: 59). To have a content is, as it were, to feel a certain way. The content is an inherent particular quality, a kind of quale. “That we feel different” [dass uns anders zu Mute ist] when we see red and green, respectively, is not because of the object but because of the content. The objects red and green are not just those contents but what is grasped by them. The specific qualitative peculiaritiy of the whole experience depends on at least two different kinds of manifest mental aspects: the act and the content. Meinong’s interpretation of mental content as a special way of feeling is similar to William James’ view (1890, Vol. I, Chap. IX: 245–6, 265) that each word is felt, not only as a word, but as having a meaning: “We ought to say a feeling of and, a feeling of if, a feeling of but, and a feeling of by, quite as readily as we say a feeling of blue or a feeling of cold.

Meinong’s claim that wherever there are different objects, there must also be some qualitative difference, i.e. a difference of mental contents, was criticized by Russell. Russell repudiates the arguments by which Meinong supported his belief in mental contents (see above A and 4.1). Russell asserts, for example, that “the difference of object supplies all the difference required”, and he cannot find any introspective evidence that could lead us to admit such contents. (Russell 1913: 41–4; 1914: 447–52; see also Moore’s (1909/10, 1910) denial of an introspective access to mental contents; cf. Grossmann 1974: 53–56; Marek 2009.)

C. The Ideal Relation Between Contents and Their Objects: Adequateness

Meinong calls the relation of a content to its corresponding object “adequateness” [Adäquatheit] (1902, §§29–30; 1910, §§43–4), and he takes it to be an ideal relation. Ideal relations, in contrast to real relations, subsist necessarily between the terms of the relation. If one color, say red, is different from another, say green, than they must be different. If you compare colors located somewhere, the relation between a color spot and its location is called real because the concrete color, say red, could be located elsewhere, or another color could be in the place of the red color spot. Ideal relations, however, attach once and for all and with necessity to their terms.

Meinong postulates the adequateness relation in order to explain the representative function of mental content, but he offers mainly negative determinations of it. He stresses the point that adequateness is not a relationship of identity or of similarity. Since it is an ideal relation, real relations — for example pictorial or even causal relationships — are excluded. A positive hint is given by a kind of metaphorical use of the word “fit”: the mental content and its object must fit each other. If you assume that there is an ideal correspondence between the content and its object, the question still arises, “What makes it the case that the experience is directed to its corresponding object?” Meinong answers this question in a resigned tone: “As to how it happens that the relation of adequateness between content and object obtains in a case where there is such great similarity and in another case where there is such great dissimilarity, I admit I can give no answer at present” (1910, §43: 265 [191]).

As Meinong denies the real character of the adequateness relation, his account avoids being counted as naturalist or psychologistic. Psychologism (in its negative sense) is the “inappropriate use of psychological method” in philosophy, says Meinong (1904b, §8: 23 [95]). Not suffiently distinguishing between the mental content and object of a presentation would count as such an inappropriate use. Meinong argues, against psychologism, that logical, conceptual, and epistemological matters cannot be treated “as if there were only a psychological side of cognition” (1907, §26).

Copyright © 2019 by
Johann Marek <>

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