Epistemological Problems of Memory

First published Mon Mar 27, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Matthew Frise replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

You tell your friend about a strange event you witnessed. Your friend presses you: how do you know it really happened? It’s natural to answer that you saw it happen. But that can’t be the full story of how you know. Past seeing, by itself, does not entirely explain present knowing or reasonable believing. When our past learning matters for what we can be confident of in the present, something connects the two. That something seems to be memory. Memory plays some role in our everyday believing, and upon closer inspection that role appears essential. Yet memory is secretive, always operating, almost always without our noticing, and often eluding any effort to appreciate its workings. Even in philosophy, we take for granted memory’s unflagging efforts. There is some mystery about how it supports good inductive reasoning, for example, though we recognize that good inductive reasoning relies on past observation. And memory is what allows this indispensable relying, almost by magic.

How does memory help us believe and reason well, if it ever truly does? What might bottle it up and stop it? This entry surveys influential answers.

1. The Nature of Memory

The epistemology of memory has been the epistemology of human memory. It’s the sort of memory we are most familiar with. Perhaps this everyday familiarity is informative enough for our epistemological theorizing. We can do well without looking closely at how human memory works, and the psychology and philosophy here can have a crisp and little-trafficked border. The epistemology of memory up through the twentieth century often carried on as if this were so. But more recently epistemologists have favored an empirically-informed approach.

1.1 Human Memory

Human memory is not one but several things or systems (Michaelian 2011c). The systems play different roles, most of which we might call “remembering”, even though the remembering may vary notably from one system to the next. Some memory systems also help us imagine possibilities or think about the future, however. As the entry on memory already taxonomizes human memory systems in detail, this entry will not. It will, however, briefly overview some of them. Psychologists and philosophers often distinguish declarative from non-declarative memory, which may roughly differentiate memory for accessible information from memory for everything else. Declarative memory includes episodic and semantic memory (Tulving 1972). How best to divide episodic and semantic memory turns out to be delicate and controversial. But they at least superficially differ in many ways, including in their characteristic content. To simplify: the content of semantic memory is propositional, while the content of episodic memory is (a representation of) an event from the rememberer’s past. Your friend might remember that a strange event took place recently, because you told her so. But despite your telling, she is in no position to remember the event. Here, she is the rememberer, and the event was in your personal past, not hers.

The epistemology of memory has focused on declarative memory, perhaps to no one’s surprise. Epistemology is the philosophical study of knowledge and of what makes believing reasonable. The epistemology of memory examines memory’s role in this. Epistemology covers most often the kinds of knowledge and reasonable believing that pertain to accessible information. Declarative memory seems more relevant here than non-declarative. Moreover, since epistemology covers most often the kinds of knowledge and reasonable believing that have propositional content, semantic memory seems more relevant here than episodic. The line from remembering that p to knowing that p makes fewer corkscrews than the line from remembering some event concerning p to knowing that p. Consequently, semantic memory has dominated the epistemology of memory. But in the last few decades, episodic memory has stolen the show in the broader philosophy of memory. It’s safe to bet that a renaissance in the epistemology of episodic memory is not far off.

Recent, empirically-minded epistemology of memory has been sensitive to a key feature that at least some of our memory systems seem to bear: they are constructive. It is most clearly the case that episodic memory in particular is constructive (for the case laid out for a general audience, see Schacter 1996, 2001). Remembering events is not the straightforward affair we might have supposed. We might have supposed that memory functions like an archive for the records of what we have experienced; to learn is to deposit into the archive, to remember is to withdraw an unchanged deposit, and to forget is for the archive to malfunction. The prevailing view now, however, is that memory is constructive, and not just occasionally but normally (Michaelian 2011b, 2016). Remembering is not (simply) reproducing a record, but generating new content.

This may seem to suggest that memory’s role in our knowing and reasonably believing is more limited than we’d thought. New content from memory is suspicious—likely inaccurate or unsupported—particularly if memory is supposed to function like an archive. But the evidence to support this suspicion is wanting (Michaelian 2011b, 2016). Episodic memory is generative, but not in general at the cost of truth. Puddifoot and Bortolotti (2019) argue, for instance, that the cognitive mechanisms responsible for certain false memory beliefs are indeed “epistemically innocent” , as they overall increase a subject’s chances of having other true beliefs or knowledge (see also Bortolotti and Sullivan-Bissett 2018). Episodic memory’s epistemic credentials are not clearly comprised. Section 2.4 below further explores the significance of memory construction in epistemology.

1.2 Theories of memory

A theory of memory is roughly a theory of how memory works or of what remembering consists in. Almost no theories of memory are essentially epistemological. Almost none require any discussion of epistemology. For that reason, this entry will say little about theories of memory (but see entry on memory). One unique theory of memory, however, merits coverage here: the epistemic theory of memory. Why? For one, it is essentially epistemological. And for another, it stands apart from what most of this entry will focus on. Section 2 covers theories that, in a way, use memory to illuminate epistemology, and epistemology to illuminate memory’s epistemic power. The theories comment on the conditions in which memory provides or cannot provide some epistemic good, and why. The epistemic theory of memory, however, uses epistemology to illuminate the memory’s nature. Rather than explain knowing in terms of remembering, the epistemic theory explains remembering in terms of knowing.

The epistemic theory places an epistemic necessary condition on remembering. More specifically, propositional remembering requires knowing (Anscombe 1981; Ayer 1956; Audi 2002; Locke 1971; Malcolm 1963; Moon 2013; Owens 2000; Pappas 1980; Williamson 2000). Any subject who remembers that p knows that p. This theory can lift a lantern to the nature of remembering, as it implies that every necessary condition for knowing is also one for remembering. If knowing requires believing, remembering requires it too. If knowing requires truth, so does remembering. And so on.

Stronger versions of the epistemic theory say that remembering at a moment requires knowing not only then but also previously. They add, moreover, that that earlier knowing explains, or bears some other special connection to, the later knowing. Any subject who remembers that p at a moment knows that p then because she knew that p before.

The epistemic theory faces more than one danger. To begin, it is worth noting that the different versions of the epistemic theory generally will not be complete theories of remembering. They state just necessary conditions on remembering, not sufficient conditions. They might be correct, but they do not say all that remembering is. Indeed, they often could say much more. Suppose remembering requires knowing because of past knowing. The “because” here masks an omission. How does one know at one time because of knowing at an earlier time? The most natural answer is: by memory. But we should hesitate to accept that answer here. The epistemic theory is supposed to be clarifying what remembering is. Paired with the natural answer, the epistemic theory says roughly that to remember requires memory to connect knowing with earlier knowing. The explanation of remembering critically involves some residual, opaque memory activity. An explanation minimally citing memory, or one further elucidating its activity, might be more insightful.

A more common criticism of the epistemic theory is that knowledge requires something that remembering does not (Bernecker 2010; see also Audi 1995; Lai 2022). One form of the criticism goes as follows. Knowledge roughly requires good and undiminished reason to believe. Suppose you remember that p—you’ve come to know that p and therefore have reason good enough for knowing that p. Later you gain reason to doubt that p (see discussion of defeaters in Section 2.2.3). Your reason to believe that p is no longer good enough for knowing that p. But can you now remember that p? The epistemic theory must say, perhaps unintuitively, you cannot. Perhaps even worse, the epistemic theory seems to imply that you remembered that p up until you gained the reason to doubt. So you recently remembered that p, but can remember no longer, and not because of any forgetting. It’s because of some learning—your gaining reason to doubt. It may instead be more plausible to suppose the epistemic theory is mistaken. Remembering does not require good and undiminished reason to believe, in which case it does not require knowing.

Also, if the epistemic theory is correct, there is no remembering falsely. Knowledge requires truth. Remembering, if it requires knowing, also requires truth. Propositional misremembering, then, isn’t remembering at all. At best it’s mere apparent remembering. It’s not memory’s doing. In other words, whether a subject is remembering that p is not settled by the mechanisms that produce p as an output for the subject and by the functions of those mechanisms. Instead, the accuracy of p also matters for whether the subject counts as remembering. The epistemic theory is only as plausible as this consequence (cf. De Brigard 2014).

Finally, the epistemic theory’s prospects may depend on the empirical matter of whether and how memory is generative. Perhaps research in neuroscience and cognitive psychology could make it plausible that propositional remembering is in some cases generative. This would doom at least the stronger versions of the epistemic theory. Knowing that p in the past would be unnecessary for remembering that p now, if memory can generate p as the content of some propositional remembering.

Defenses of the epistemic theory tend to suggest that its alternatives are themselves flawed (Adams 2011; James 2017) or that the alleged counterexamples to it are insufficiently clear (Moon 2013; Sakuragi 2013).

2. Memory and Justification

We seem to have epistemic justification for much of what we believe. And memory seems to play some role in our having this justification. Suppose appearances are correct here. Just what is memory’s role? What can memory do, what can’t it do, and why? There are many theories about the nature of epistemic justification, and they might shed light on memory’s role. Or things might work the other way around—our intuitive judgments about memory’s role could shed light on which theories of justification are correct, and which we should abandon. This section begins to explore memory’s relationship with justification.

2.1 Foundationalism and Coherentism

One way to illuminate memory’s justificatory role is to turn the spotlight to the structure of justification. Some of what we justifiedly believe helps us justifiedly believe other things. But, according to foundationalism, not all that justifies stands in need of justification itself. There are foundations for our justification, places where we need look for no further support. If there is foundational justification, memory might provide some of it. Perhaps memory is not relevantly different from perception, which is a good candidate for being a basic source of justification. Visual perception provides justification for believing how spatially distant things are. Memory simply provides justification for believing how temporally distant things are (Taylor 1956).

Or memory might not provide foundational support. Instead all support it gives might come from other justifiers; it does not sit at the bottom of the structure. Most contemporary epistemology accepts foundationalism (see entry on foundationalist theories of justification). So, several sections below help locate memory in the foundationalist structure. But there are alternatives to foundationalism.

One alternative is coherentism, according to which, roughly, a belief is justified if and only if it coheres with other beliefs (see entry on coherentist theories of justification). Beliefs that fit together well are mutually supporting, or supporting as a set. Coherentism is not as popular as it once was, but still has some advocates (Poston 2014). But even if coherentism is false, coherence relations may still matter for justification. Coherence might not create justification, but it may increase any already present (Lewis 1946). Thanks to memory you might have several beliefs that all fit together. If these beliefs are already justified, their fitting together could boost their justification. And even if coherence does not help, incoherence may hurt (Audi 1995; Olsson 2017). A poor fit among recollections might eliminate justification that memory would otherwise help provide.

2.2 Internalism and Externalism

Learning can be understood as gaining evidence. And we seem to keep some evidence over time. Presumably it is memory that does this keeping. A natural way of understanding how memory helps us have justification centers on the evidence we have thanks to memory. This fits well with internalism about epistemic justification. Internalism says a subject’s justification is settled by her mental life. Mentally identical subjects will be equally justified in having the same doxastic attitudes toward the same propositions. Memory is part of the mental life. We needn’t look beyond the evidence memory provides to see how it helps us have justification.

Contrast internalism with externalism about epistemic justification, which says non-mental factors can result in differences in justification, even among mentally identical subjects (see entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification). According to externalism, something contingent that makes no difference to a subject’s mental life can make a difference to her justification. Her memory may tend to err, for example. This tendency has to do with facts external to the mind—facts about how for instance the past was. Perhaps if memory is to provide justification, it will tend to get these facts right.

2.2.1 The Problem of Forgotten Evidence

A few apparent epistemological problems of memory may favor externalism over internalism. One of these is the problem of forgotten evidence (Goldman 1999; Harman 1986; Owens 1999; Pappas 1980; see also Frise 2015 [Other Internet Resources]; Huemer 1999; Madison 2017; McCain 2015). We tend to use evidence when forming justified beliefs. But we also tend to forget this evidence, even while continuing to believe. Pappas (1983: 266 n.1) thinks “one typically loses one’s original justification”. When the originally justified belief is kept but the original evidence for it is not, its justification might be replaced by other justification, or lost and not replaced, or not lost at all. In many cases it is intuitive that the kept belief is still justified one way or another. The problem of forgotten evidence is that of explaining how this could be.

Some externalist theories seem to have an explanation readily available. One such theory is process reliabilism (see entry on reliabilist epistemology). Very roughly, it says a belief’s justification depends on the reliability of the process that forms or keeps the belief. Memory seems relevantly reliable. Even if a subject forgets her original evidence for a belief that was originally justified and that she keeps, she may keep the belief due to a reliable memory process. Reliabilism appears able to explain how the belief is still justified—it’s because of the memory process’s reliability.

But internalist theories have other resources. A subject may have forgotten her original evidence, but memory could still provide her with something that justifies a belief she has kept and that was originally justified: seeming recollection. A subject who seems to recollect that p has prima facie justification for believing that p (Pollock 1986). (Prima facie justification is an epistemic good that suffices for overall justification, as long as the subject has no reason to doubt the belief or its justification). If that’s right, seeming recollection could provide justification even in a case of forgotten evidence. This recollection is a part of the mental life, so internalism can appeal to it in solving the problem of forgotten evidence.

There are different accounts of why seeming recollection justifies. The phenomenology of a recollective experience may account for it (Feldman & Conee 2001; Madison 2014). Or the persistence of seeming recollection, even in the face of evidence of its inaccuracy, may account for the justification (Brogaard 2017). Or, seeming recollection that p may justify believing that p because it justifies believing something else that is relevant, namely, that one justifiedly believed that p in that past (Schroer 2008).

There might be no relevant difference between, on the one hand, seeming to recollect or seeming to remember or seeming to recall and, on the other, recollecting or remembering or recalling. Seeming to recollect may be sufficient for remembering. But it is insufficient for knowing. (One might, after all, seem to recollect a falsehood, but one cannot know a falsehood.) If seeming recollection suffices for remembering, then the epistemic theory of memory appears mistaken. The epistemic theory, again, says that a subject who remembers that p knows that p, perhaps because of her past knowing that p. But some seeming recollection would allow remembering without knowing.

2.2.2 The Problem of Stored Beliefs

Even if seeming recollection solves one problem, it is a resource of limited use. It does not obviously account for all the justification memory provides. It is plausible that at any given time, thanks to memory, we have a vast number of beliefs. But we are not seemingly recollecting the content of all these beliefs. Indeed, at best we recollect the content of few at any particular time. The beliefs we are not recollecting are sometimes called “stored” or “dispositional” or “nonoccurrent”. Some of these beliefs are justified. The problem of stored beliefs is that of accounting for this justification. (Pappas 1980 discusses a knowledge-version of the problem).

If internalism is true, something mental other than seeming recollection accounts for this justification. But it’s at least initially difficult to see what that might be (Goldman 1999; Senor 1993; Moon 2012a presents internalism with a knowledge-version of the problem). Externalist theories like reliabilism, however, can still say the reliability of the memory process responsible for these stored beliefs helps justify them.

Seeming recollection apparently does not solve the problem of stored beliefs. But something closely related might help. It’s not just recollecting, but being disposed to recollect, that helps justify (Audi 1995; Conee & Feldman 2011; Ginet 1975; McCain 2014; see also Feldman 1988; Piazza 2009). Having a disposition to recollect p provides justification for believing p. Typically, a justified stored belief is one the subject is disposed to recall. This disposition makes sense of the stored belief’s justification. Or perhaps a seeming to recollect can itself have a dispositional status, just as a belief can have this status, and so seemings do justify the right stored beliefs after all (Madison 2014).

It is controversial whether recollective dispositions justify. McGrath (2007) argues they do not, for if they do, it follows there is justification in some cases of forgetting where intuitively there is no justification. Kelly (2016) argues that what matters for justification is not a recollective disposition, but instead remembering, and not all remembering involves a recollective disposition. Frise (2017a) argues that it is insufficiently clear just when a subject has a recollective disposition, and also that in some cases in which a subject is disposed to recall that p, the justified attitude for her toward p is nonetheless suspending judgment rather than believing. McGrath (2016) and Senor (1993) press a more basic question: exactly why is a disposition to recollect justifying evidence?

Not all attempts to solve the problem of stored beliefs appeal to recollective dispositions or even to the reliability of the processes that keep stored beliefs. One potential way out is neutral between internalism and externalism. It denies there are stored beliefs at all, so there is no justification of stored beliefs to account for. Frise (2018a) argues that if representationalism—a leading theory on the nature of belief—is true, then we have no stored beliefs. This is because human memory turns out not to function in the ways required for storing beliefs. According to representationalism, believing that p requires bearing a special relation to a mental representation that p (see entry on belief). Frise argues human memory does not store many representations, and that our relation to stored representations is generally underdetermined. Representationalism may be false. But if true, the problem of stored beliefs is illusory.

2.2.3 The Problem of Forgotten Defeat

Seeming recollection seems to help solve the problem of forgotten evidence, but to help little with the problem of stored beliefs. And there may be a further concern about whether seeming recollection helps even with the first problem. The concern has to do with a different sort of forgetting. A subject might form a belief without justification, and then keep the belief while forgetting how it came about. Or, the subject might have some reason to believe that p and some reason to doubt that p, and go on to believe that p and eventually forget the reason to doubt. A reason to doubt or not believe is sometimes called a “defeater” . Forgetting a defeater, which here includes forgetting that a belief arose in the absence of justification, might matter for overall justification. It might matter even for prima facie justification. The problem of forgotten defeat is that of accounting satisfactorily for justification in cases of forgotten defeat.

Forgetting defeat is not pivotal if seeming recollection justifies. Suppose a subject who seems to recollect that p has prima facie justification for believing that p. A subject might have formed a belief that p without reason, kept the belief but forgotten how it came about, and now seems to recollect that p. The seeming recollection results in prima facie and overall justification, even though this is a case of forgotten defeat. Intuitions about whether there can be either sort of justification in a case of forgotten defeat, then, bear on whether seeming recollection justifies. These intuitions, then, bear on whether the seeming recollection solution to the problem of forgotten evidence is viable.

Many deny that forgetting a defeater can result in an increase in justification (Annis 1980; Goldman 1999; 2009; Greco 2005; Huemer 1999; Jackson 2011; Senor 2010, 2017; Teroni 2018). According to Senor (2010), a belief should not “become justified simply on the basis of being retained”. But it appears this could occur when a defeater is forgotten. According to Teroni (2018), a belief that p with defeated justification has, when the defeater is forgotten, bad etiology. Seeming to recollect that p in a case of forgotten defeat explains why the subject is inclined to judge that p is true, but does not explain why this judging is justified. Jackson (2011: 569) puts it simplest: “garbage in, garbage out”. What memory delivers is no better than what it originally received, regardless of any forgetting in the meantime. Senor (2007) offers further reason to deny forgotten defeat can increase justification: there should be a kind of parity in the positive and negative effects of what we forget. Just as there is no decrease in justification when we forget supporting evidence, there should be no increase in justification when we forget reason to doubt.

According to others, forgetting a defeater can result in an increase in justification (Bernecker 2010; Feldman & Conee 2001; Dogramaci 2015; Feldman 2005; Lackey 2005, 2007; McGrath 2007). For Feldman (2005) and McGrath (2007), one reason to suppose there is an increase in justification is that the subject might have lost reason to doubt. The subject may then be left only with reason to believe, or at least with no reason to stop believing. Believing looks like the best option. Feldman and Conee (2001) and Lackey (2007) argue that a subject who knows herself to be a generally careful believer has support for a memory belief of uncertain origin, even when a defeater for the belief has been forgotten. Lackey (2007) notes that forgetting evidence and forgetting defeaters can indeed have asymmetrical effects on justification, so intuitions about cases of forgetting evidence can be uninformative about cases of forgotten defeaters. Dogramaci (2015) argues that the pragmatic function of critical language is to promote trustworthy testimony. But criticism will not promote that in normal cases of forgotten defeat. This is because the subject has forgotten why she originally formed her belief. So it is mistaken to identify the forgetter’s belief as unjustified.

2.3 Time-slice and Historical Theories

The problems of forgotten evidence and forgotten defeat have to do with the justification a subject has at one time, given what the subject has forgotten since an earlier time. If these problems aren’t just superficial, the subject’s past matters for her present justification in a nontrivial way. A trivial way that it could matter is as follows: a subject had some justifying evidence at an earlier time, and her memory causes her to have this evidence now, and this evidence justifies her beliefs now. There is a trivial connection here between the subject’s present justification and her past, in that the subject’s past only indirectly affects her present justification. It affects her present justification just by affecting what evidence she has in the present. But ultimately it is just her evidence now that determines what justification she has now.

In short, some of the problems above draw attention to how a state of affairs at a time might directly matter for justification at another time. If a subject can have justification for believing that p now even if she has forgotten her original evidence for p and has no other support for p now, it appears her past can directly affect her present justification. It is because she had justification or justifying evidence that she has justification. Similarly, if a subject who seems to recall that p can fail to have justification for believing that p now because she has forgotten a defeater for p, her past seems to directly affect her present justification.

It is not obvious just how time and justification connect, and the role memory plays in this connection. The basic options are few. Here are some: it could be that all that directly matters for justification at a time is how things are at that time. Call a theory that implies this a time-slice theory of justification. Or, it could be that past states of affairs also directly matter for justification at that time. Call a theory that implies this a historical theory of justification. (See Kelly 2016 and Moss 2015 for further discussion). A less explored possibility is that future states of affairs directly matter for justification at a time—but since time-slice and historical theories are the two most popular candidates, this entry focuses on them. To include memory in these options, and to center on the present: perhaps memory affects a subject’s justification now only by way of how her memory currently is or is active—for example what a subject now recalls or is disposed to recall or otherwise has tucked away in memory. Or, perhaps what was once a part of a subject’s memory also matters for her justification now even if it is not in her memory now. Or perhaps what she will later remember matters for her justification now.

Note that the time-slice and historical distinction crosscuts the internalism and externalism distinction. Wherever a theory of justification lands in one distinction, it could land anywhere in the other. For example, an internalist theory of justification can state that just the way a subject is now, including the way her memory is now, directly matters for her justification now (Feldman & Conee 2001). Or it could state that elements of her past, including its influence on a subject’s memory, directly matter for her justification now (Huemer 1999; McGrath 2007, 2016). Some combinations are more common and perhaps more plausible than others. Internalists more often favor time-slice views, while externalists more often favor historical views. Goldman’s (2009) reliabilism is a paradigm externalist, historical view: a memory belief’s current justificatory status is chiefly a matter of memory preserving the belief’s past status, and that the past status is partially determined by factors external to the subject, such as the reliability of the process that originally formed the belief. An externalist theory could be time-slice, but that is less common.

Time-slice theories have some assets. For one, they are relatively simple. On a time-slice theory, what explains a subject’s justification at a time is just the way things are then. It is more complicated to identify the way things are at other times as also being relevant. Moreover, the way things are at a time might fully explain a subject’s justification then. For example, a subject’s recollective dispositions and what she seems to recollect at a time might account for all her justification from memory then. Appealing to the past seems unnecessary. And it’s plausible that a simpler explanation, all else being equal, is better. So time-slice theories, all else being equal, appear better than historical theories, since the latter cite the past as also directly mattering for a subject’s present justification. Another asset of time-slice theories may be this. Two subjects can have different pasts but be identical in the present. They at the moment have all the same beliefs, memories, experiences, and so on. Because they are the same now, it might seem that they are the same with respect to what they are justified in believing, disbelieving, and suspending judgment in now. But if that’s right, their differing pasts don’t matter (Moon 2012b). If the differences in their pasts don’t matter, it appears their pasts don’t matter at all. And if subject’s past doesn’t matter, it’s hard to see what else about the past could matter. Justification in the present is settled just by how things are. Similarly, it might seem that a past that a subject currently has no memory of shouldn’t matter for her present justification (Feldman & Conee 2001).

But historical theories might have their own merits. For example, the causal history of a belief appears relevant to its justification in the present (Goldman 1979). It is not just the immediate cause of a belief that counts. How a belief originated and has since been kept in memory, and what justificatory status it has had along the way, might seem to directly bear on its justificatory status now. An historical theory of justification can accommodate these intuitions, while a time-slice theory must deny that the causal history of a belief matters as such. For the time-slice theory, this history could matter for justification in the present only indirectly, insofar as it affects the world in the present. The past, including past memory, doesn’t matter for justification, except insofar as it affects the present, which does matter for justification.

Historical theories may have an easier time explaining how reasoning is able to provide justification. Most reasoning is temporally extended. It takes place over time. Burge (1993: 463) says that “Any reasoning in time must rely on memory”. To reason to a supported conclusion, presumably all steps of reasoning along the way need to be supported too. Burge (2003: 300) thinks that it is memory that holds any support for past steps constant during later steps of the reasoning. When arriving at a supported conclusion, the subject might not be thinking about evidence for the earlier steps in the reasoning or doing anything else that would support these steps. The subject must be inheriting support for these steps from the past via memory. The subject’s current step of reasoning couldn’t itself fully support the conclusion. We must cite the support that memory ushers in from the past for previous reasoning steps.

Buoying historical theories further, Kelly (2016) looks at a case of extended reasoning that involves a nontrivial error. At the end this reasoning the subject may end up mentally identical to a subject who reasoned without error. (The rest of the world at that time may be identical too.) It’s plausible that the subjects are unequal in their justification, since one of them reasoned erroneously and the other didn’t. But because the subjects are identical mentally at the later time, a time-slice theory must say the subjects are identical in their justification then.

Annis (1980) thinks historical theories are better at accounting for the justification that children have. A child’s current mind may not yet be sophisticated enough to explain how some of her current justified beliefs in memory are indeed justified. Rather, what justifies these beliefs now must be found in the past. Annis also argues time-slice theories flounder on the problems of forgotten evidence and forgotten defeat.

One historical theory of particular note is epistemic conservatism (Harman 1986; McCain 2008, 2019; McGrath 2007, 2016; Poston 2014). According to epistemic conservatism, a subject who believes a proposition has some prima facie reason to continue believing it. Unless a subject has reason to drop her belief, she has some justification for keeping it. This theory is historical because it says having a belief at one time directly results in having justification for it later. Past believing matters for justification in the present. Notably, this theory is also friendly toward internalism, and it is internalists rather than externalists who tend to be friendly toward it. It identifies elements of the past that affect the subject’s present justification, but these elements are all mental, namely, the subject’s past beliefs. McGrath (2007) brings epistemic conservatism to bear on a range of epistemological problems of memory. He (2007: 14) thinks it solves the problem of forgotten evidence. A subject may have forgotten her original evidence for her belief that p, and yet it might be intuitive that this belief is still justified. Epistemic conservatism can explain why: the subject had already believed that p, and this past believing, in the absence of a defeater, is enough for her belief to be justified now. McGrath (2007: 21) also thinks epistemic conservatism solves the problem of stored beliefs. A justified belief that is stored in memory is presumably one that was believed a moment ago too. Believing then explains why the belief is justified now.

This solution to the problem of stored beliefs faces challenges (Frise 2017a). A subject, Ric, may have justified stored beliefs. An evil demon could bring about another subject, Vic, who is mentally identical to Ric. When Vic comes about, he too has stored beliefs. But he had no beliefs prior to existing. Epistemic conservatism does not explain how any of his stored beliefs could be justified at the moment of his creation. And there is reason to think some are justified then—Vic is Ric’s mental twin, and Ric’s has justified stored beliefs then. What’s more, Vic might not change at all mentally from the moment of his creation to the next moment. But because Vic has beliefs at this first moment, according to epistemic conservatism, he has prima facie justification for them at the second moment. Epistemic conservatism explains the justification of his stored beliefs at the second time but not the first, even though he is his own mental duplicate at these times.

Epistemic conservatism may also solve the problem of forgotten defeat (McGrath 2016). When a subject has forgotten all defeaters, she has no reason to abandon belief. For her to change from believing to not believing for no reason looks unreasonable. Keeping the belief looks reasonable. Epistemic conservatism explains this, as it says in the absence of defeat the past believing results in justification for continuing to believe. Beliefs in memory that aren’t based on other beliefs are “innocent until proven guilty” (McGrath 2016: 80).

Epistemic conservatism and certain other historical theories may face a problem specifically concerning memory. Suppose a subject justifiedly forms a belief that p. Later, she remembers that p. The remembering might justify believing that p. But historical theories like epistemic conservatism say that past believing or past justified believing confers justification via memory. So it looks like the remembering subject now has two sources of justification for the belief that p: the remembering and the past believing. If having these two sources increases justification, it appears that memory is boosting the justification. Remembering can ratchet up justification. But that seems incorrect (Bernecker 2008; Huemer 1999).

There may not be a boost in justification in this sort of case, however, but rather an overdetermination of belief (McGrath 2007). There are two justifying causes for the belief. It doesn’t follow that the belief has more justification than if it had one justifying cause. One nuanced version of epistemic conservatism offers another response. On it, belief that p confers justification for continuing to believe that p only if the subject has no evidence for or against p (Poston 2014). If remembering that p is evidence for p, then the past believing is not justifying the subject in continuing to believe that p. On this response, then, the case of remembering while retaining past belief involves only one source of justification. So there’s no boost upon remembering.

A variation of the boost objection is that a subject might retain her original justifying evidence for p, and might thanks to memory believe that p. It might appear that on epistemic conservatism, the subject again has two sources of justification. But the subject should not have any degree of justification beyond what the original evidence confers. One reply to this boost objection is that believing while retaining the original evidence here may not result in a greater degree of justification, but simply result in justification that is more difficult to defeat (McGrath 2016: 81).

The most popular and influential historical theory of justification is process reliabilism. As noted, it links the justification of a belief with the reliability of the process that yields the belief. One sufficient condition it states for justified belief puts memory and the past in the forefront. A process that yields beliefs could have a range of types of inputs. Some of these inputs could themselves be beliefs. An inferential process, for example, takes beliefs as inputs and yields a belief. Reliabilism says that if these input beliefs are justified, and the process has a certain kind of reliability (namely, it tends to yield true belief when the belief inputs are true), then the resulting belief is justified (Goldman 1979). This helps explain how memory can justify, and how the past directly matters for present justification. Some memory processes are reliable in the relevant way. And a memory process can take a past justified belief that p as an input and yield belief that p as an output later. (Continuously believing that p via memory may be due to a memory process feeding the belief that p into itself.) The output belief is, according to reliabilism, therefore justified.

Reliabilism might solve several epistemological problems of memory (Goldman 2009, 2011; Senor 1993, 2010). Consider the problem of forgotten evidence. On reliabilism, forgetting the original evidence for a belief need not compromise its justification. If the belief was justified and has been kept by a suitably reliable process, it is justified now. And consider the problem of stored beliefs. On reliabilism a belief that is stored in memory can be justified in the same way as in cases of forgotten evidence, even if nothing in the subject’s current mental life is justifying evidence for the belief. Finally, consider the problem of forgotten defeat. Suppose a subject had a defeater that eliminated all her justification for a belief. The belief that enters memory is unjustified. The belief may be an input to a suitably reliable memory process, but because the input belief itself is unjustified not all inputs to the process are justified. So even if the defeater is forgotten, reliabilism is not implying here that the output of this memory process is justified; the sufficient condition for justification has not been met. Reliabilism can deliver the result that there is no justification in a case of forgotten defeat, and maybe that result is correct. Reliabilism faces many criticisms (BonJour 1980; Cohen 1984; Conee & Feldman 1998; Frise 2018d). But many think it fares well in the epistemology of memory.

2.4 Preservationism and Generativism

Reliabilism and epistemic conservatism differ considerably. Still, there is common ground, and not just because both are historical theories. They agree that the past matters for present justification in a specific way; they each imply a thesis sometimes called “preservationism”. More than one thesis in the epistemology of memory bears this name, however (Frise 2015 [Other Internet Resources]). It is important to see how they are distinct.

One thesis called “preservationism” has to do with how memory is not or does not function like a traditional foundational source of justification, such as perception. The thesis, roughly, is that memory can at best preserve justification from other sources of justification, but memory cannot generate justification. At its core this thesis is about a limit to memory’s justificatory power. Memory does not generate justification. It might preserve justification, but perhaps it fails at even that. Strictly speaking, this preservationism itself has no implications about whether the past directly matters for justification in the present. In other words, the thesis need not be historical, though it usually is bundled together with historical views.

A distinct thesis called “preservationism” has to do with memory’s justificatory power, not a limit to its power. It states, roughly, that a belief entering memory with justification keeps it. Memory sustains justification when sustaining a belief that had justification. This thesis itself says nothing about whether memory can or cannot generate justification. When stated carefully this preservationism is typically an historical theory of justification. Memory delivers justification in the present to a belief that it keeps and that had justification in the past. Like the other thesis called “preservationism”, this thesis is also often bundled together with other views, and sometimes the two preservationisms are endorsed at once, which can obscure that they are separable.

The second preservationism is the common ground between reliabilism and epistemic conservatism, at least if memory is relevantly reliable (Frise 2017b). Suppose a reliable memory process receives as an input only a justified belief that p, and yields belief that p as an output. Reliabilism implies that the output belief is justified. Memory is delivering justification to a belief it held onto and that had justification. And epistemic conservatism says even mere believing provides justification for retaining belief. Justified believing must be able to do as much.

2.4.1 Preservationism as Anti-generativism

Because these preservationist theses are distinct they merit separate discussion. The lion’s share of the literature on preservationism is on the first thesis: memory can at best preserve justification, but cannot generate it. Preservationism of this stripe is popular (Annis 1980; Goldman 2009, 2011; Jackson 2011; Naylor 2015; Owens 2000; Senor 2007, 2010). While there are arguments for this view, it sometimes is treated as though it has a default status. It has borne the crown since it was born. Arguments for it are unnecessary. Opposing views, rather, are what require arguments. Perhaps preservationism has attained this status because it seems intuitive or simply common sense to many. And it is not hard to see why it seems like common sense, given our common sense understanding of how memory works: memory accumulates and keeps information from other sources. It’s not adding information. It’s only natural that memory would at best accumulate and keep justification from these sources. It’s not adding justification.

The main view that denies this preservationism says, roughly, that memory can generate justification. Aptly enough, this view is called “generativism” (or “generationism”; Michaelian 2011b). If memory can generate justification, one plausible way it might do so is by way of remembering or seeming to recollect. As noted, some responses to the problems of forgotten evidence and stored beliefs are that seeming recollection, or perhaps also a disposition to recollect, can justify. If a subject’s seeming to recollect that p results in her having justification for believing p that she did not previously have, memory appears to be generating this justification. Unsurprisingly, generativism is popular among those who think seeming recollection justifies. Because preservationism and generativism deny each other, and generativism is the positive thesis and preservationism the negative, preservationism is sometimes called “anti-generativism” (Frise 2015 [Other Internet Resources]).

In favor of preservationism over generativism, Senor (2010) says memory’s job is preservative, both with respect to belief and the justificatory status of belief. Naylor (2015) and Senor (2017) think preservationism helps explain what happens with stored beliefs, in a way that might help solve the problem of stored beliefs. Presumably, the justification of stored beliefs does not increase simply by the beliefs being stored in memory. And this is what preservationism predicts. Preservationism also seems to help with the problem of forgotten defeat. In a case of forgotten defeat, a subject forgets a defeater for the justification of a belief. Goldman (2009) and Jackson (2011) find it plausible that memory will not increase the justification of that belief. And preservationism seems to predict just this too. Senor (2017) adds that, even if memory can generate justification, this is rare. More often, memory inherits justification from other sources.

Nuanced versions of and arguments for generativism abound. In favor of generativism over preservationism, Owens (1996) and Lackey (2005, 2007) cite cases of recalled but previously unattended to information. A subject may witness an event, and store in memory certain details about it that she does not notice until later. Only well after the event does she remember the details and form a belief about them. The belief seems justified, and memory is generating this justification. Michaelian (2011b) notes that in this sort of case, however, memory had stored information and then generated new justified belief in it. But the information was not new. Bernecker (2010) notes that the justification from memory in this sort of case is merely doxastic, not propositional (it is the justification of an attitude, not justification for having the attitude). The propositional justification for the believing the remembered details originated from perception at the time of witnessing the event, not from memory.

Michaelian (2011b) argues that memory can do more. It can generate new content and, on reliabilism, new justification for belief in it, because memory is reliable. (Similarly, Huemer 1999 argues that seeming to remember can generate new justification for belief in new content.) Fernández argues (2016) that memory can generate new justification for belief in specific new content. He argues that an episodic memory contains information about how the memory itself originates from earlier perception of the way the world was. This information about the memory’s origin is new—it was not part of content of the earlier perception of the world. Memory generates this new content and, because memory is reliable, it can generate justification for believing the new content.

Lackey (2005) and Bernecker (2010) identify another sort of case in favor of generativism. A subject may have a misleading defeater for the justification for her belief that p. The defeater can then be lost (perhaps due to forgetting). Thanks to memory the subject still has the original justification for believing that p. So it looks like the subject’s belief that p, thanks to memory, is now justified. Senor (2007) points out that the justification in this sort of case is overall, but not prima facie. Memory is not generating new support, but is instead preserving previously defeated support that then ceases to be defeated.

Bernecker and Grundmann (2019), in support of generativism, cite cases of incomplete remembering. Here, memory pares down the content of a belief that may not have been acquired well. Incomplete remembering can make up for the initial poor belief formation, perhaps by simplifying the believed information and thus making it more likely true. The original belief may not have been reliably formed. But incomplete remembering reliably forms a new belief, and so the belief is justified. This justification originates from memory.

Frise (2021) argues an extreme form of generativism follows from reliabilism. The extreme form says memory can generate justification even for an otherwise unjustified belief. On reliabilism, memory does this by overdetermining belief. Memory might preserve a subject’s belief that p that had been formed without justification. Independently of her already believing that p, the subject might now reconstructively recollect that p. For that reason also she believes that p. This recollection is reliable. On reliabilism, the belief is now justified. But if that’s right, then reliabilism is less historical of a theory than it had seemed. Memory does not always preserve a belief’s past justificatory status. If the case of overdetermined belief counts as a case of forgotten defeat, then even reliabilism allows for justification in cases of forgotten defeat.

Generativism and preservationism may be able to broker an uneasy truce. Perhaps certain types of memory (such as episodic memory) can generate justification but others (such as semantic memory) only preserve it (Teroni 2014). Perhaps memory can generate justification for new beliefs but not for unjustified beliefs it simply stores (Huemer 1999; Senor 2017). Or perhaps memory can generate justification, but not knowledge (Audi 2002).

2.4.2 Preservationism as an Historical Theory

The other thesis called “preservationism” says, again, that a belief in memory keeps its justification over time. If a subject believes that p with justification at one time, and her belief that p stays in memory later, then her belief that p is prima facie justified at the later time. There is less discussion of this preservationist thesis than the other. But it is at least as popular as the other. Its proponents are numerous (Annis 1980; Bernecker 2008; Burge 1997; Goldman 2009, 2011; Harman 1986; Huemer 1999; McGrath 2007; Naylor 2012; Owens 1999; Pappas 1980; Senor 2010). A knowledge version of this preservationism thesis is also popular (Locke 1971; Malcolm 1963; Martin 2001; Shoemaker 1967).

Preservationism is attractive in part because it may help with a kind of skepticism (Shoemaker 1967). We find ourselves with many beliefs, and many of them seem justified. What accounts for their justification? Our present support for those beliefs may not fully explain their justification. But if beliefs inherit justification from the past, that might explain the justification of many in the present. Similarly, preservationism seems to help with the problems of forgotten evidence and stored beliefs (Goldman 2009, 2011). Even if a subject forgets the original justifying evidence for her belief, memory hangs on to the past justifiedness of the belief in the present. If a subject has a belief stored in memory that had been justified, memory hangs on to its justification, even if nothing in the subject’s current mental life justifies the belief. Preservationism also fits with a natural understanding of memory’s main function, namely, that it is preservative. Memory stores information and attitudes toward information. It’s plausible that memory also stores the justificatory status of these attitudes.

Note that this version of preservationism is compatible with generativism; this helps illustrate how the two versions of preservationism are distinct. On this version of preservationism, memory keeps justification in certain cases. But this version says nothing about the limits to memory’s justificatory power. It could be that memory also generates justification in some other cases, as generativism says it can. This version of preservationism is incompatible, however, with time-slice theories of justification. Preservationism here allows a subject to have justification at one time because she had it at another time. The way the subject or world is now does not fully explain why the subject has justification now. Rather, the way the subject or world was directly affects her justification now. But on a time-slice theory of justification, nothing outside a time directly matters for justification at that time.

While this preservationism is a standard view, problems for it have bubbled to the surface. Three problems concern preservationism’s consequences for the degree of justification that memory allegedly preserves. Justification may not simply be binary (fully present or absent), but instead come in a range of greater and lesser strengths. If preservationism has implications about the degree to which memory preserves justification, the most natural view is that the degree of justification stays the same. But according to Huemer (1999: 354) “The passage of time introduces new possibilities of error; therefore, it lowers one’s justification for believing a proposition”. The idea is that as time goes on memory could be erring, and so this possibility diminishes justification over time. Yet preservationism seems to say the degree of justification stays fixed.

It is not entirely clear which possible errors this problem centers on, nor whether the mere passage of time matters. Suppose just a moment has passed—must justification decrease? Perhaps only longer intervals of time matter. But suppose two subjects start out the same mentally, and end up the same again mentally, but only after notably unequal amounts of time (e.g., it takes one subject a year to end up mentally as the other subject is after just an hour). Perhaps not even a longer interval itself results in less justification.

Here is a second problem for preservationism that has to do with degrees of justification (Frise 2017b). Suppose a subject formed a justified belief that p in the past and still believes that p, and has no relevant defeaters. The subject now wonders whether p is true, but does not recall. Does this failure to recall lower the subject’s justification for believing p? If so, it is hard to explain this lowering of justification in a way that is friendly to preservationism; rival theories offer simpler explanations. If not, preservationism has strange results. In a case of retrieval failure it allows a subject’s belief that p to be as justified as it would be if she had successfully recalled that p. But had the subject only dimly recalled that p, presumably her justification would be lower than if she had successfully recalled that p. It then follows that dimly recalling is worse than trying and not recalling at all. Dim recollection results in less justification than failed recollection does, on preservationism.

A final problem concerning preservationism and degrees of justification has to do with forgetting (BonJour 2016; Kelly 2016). A subject might forget evidence that had justified her belief that p to a very high degree. It’s plausible that forgetting this evidence should at least somewhat affect the degree of justification she has for p. But preservationism runs afoul of this if it implies that the high degree of justification remains. The level of justification might decay over time in cases of forgotten evidence. Still, perhaps it never fully decays. If it does not, a version of preservationism without implications about degrees of justification still stands (Goldman 2016).

But this version of preservationism still has other troubles. For one, it is at best an incomplete account of our justification from memory (Salvaggio 2018). Memory appears to be reconstructive, generating new content. And we often believe this new content. If any belief from memory in new content is justified, preservationism doesn’t say how. It only explains how a preexisting belief can be justified. Another trouble is this. Preservationism allows that a belief that p can be justified now for a subject who has forgotten her original justifying evidence for p, and who has no other support for p. But suppose the subject learns something that discredits her original but forgotten evidence (Frise 2017b). Is her belief that p still justified? If so, then preservationism allows an odd grandfathering of past justification; recently defeated evidence can’t justify now, but old justification from recently defeated evidence remains. But if her belief that p is no longer justified, then preserved justification can disappear from seemingly arbitrary learning. A subject can lose justification for her belief that p by learning something unimportant to p or to her evidence for p.

3. Justification and Beyond

This section continues to explore memory’s relationship to justification and other epistemic goods. It does so by touching on memory’s relationship to testimony, the extended mind, metacognition, knowledge-how, forgetting, and skepticism.

3.1 Testimony and Memory

Memory may have a special connection to testimony (see entry on epistemological problems of testimony). There is debate about whether the two have similar epistemic functions (Burge 1993; Lackey 2005; Malmgren 2006). Supposing they do, it is a further question what those functions are. Perhaps neither generates knowledge or certain other epistemic goods (Audi 1997). It could be that a speaker’s testimony can pass on knowledge to a hearer, but cannot create knowledge for the hearer when the speaker lacks it. In a way, testimony is not a foundational source of knowledge or justification. If preservationism (as anti-generativism) is true, memory is not a source either. Or, perhaps both can generate knowledge. Or, perhaps memory and testimony simply have distinct epistemic functions.

Another possible connection: memory is a kind of testimony. Specifically, memory may merely be testimony to your current self from your past self. Remembering is like reading your own diary. Your justification for believing what you seem to remember depends on your background justification for trusting your prior judgments and trusting memory to indicate these judgments. This parallels a simple view about justification from testimony. Your justification for believing someone’s testimony depends on your background justification for trusting what the testifier believes and trusting this person’s testimony to indicate her beliefs.

The diary view of memory may be wrong. It fits poorly with cases in which a subject recalls two beliefs that originally were unequal in justification but does not recall her original reasons for these beliefs. The diary view of memory here counts the beliefs as equally justified. So it must contend that the reasons for the beliefs have changed, even when it is stipulated that the subject has neither learned nor forgotten anything relevant. The diary view incorrectly treats some testimony from your former self equally (Barnett 2015). Here’s another reason to doubt that memory is a kind of testimony. When memory reports p, this is evidence that p, rather than evidence about what memory reports (Weatherson 2015). But when a testifier reports p, this isn’t evidence that p, but rather evidence about what the testifier reports.

It could be that memory has a special connection to testimony, but one that is problematic. Sometimes a subject experiences an event, and afterwards hears misleading testimony about the event. The subject may later incorporate the content of that testimony when constructively recollecting the event, and for that reason form a false belief about the event. This is the much-discussed “misinformation effect” (Loftus 1979 [1996]). Less discussed is the “information effect”. Here, the subject hears accurate testimony about an event she has witnessed, and that testimony shapes how she later reconstructively recollects the event, leading to a true belief. Although the belief is accurate, it’s accuracy may be due to a kind of luck that prevents knowledge; at best this is a “Gettier case” (see entry on the analysis of knowledge). Michaelian (2013) argues that when the information effect occurs, not only does memory’s reliability increase, but knowledge is also still possible. The information effect does not involve problematic luck. According to Shanton (2011), constructive recollection in general is unreliable and leads to false belief in a nearby possible world. But she suggests it is more plausible that this recollection can still yield knowledge, than that knowledge requires either reliability or no false belief in close worlds.

3.2 Extended Mind

Cognitive processing may not be limited to biological brain-processing. It may extend also to artifacts inside the skull, or even outside. A subject’s notebook, for example, may be a part of his cognitive processing, in the way his memory is part of his cognitive processing (Clark & Chalmers 1998). Information stored in the notebook can be part of the subject’s dispositional memory knowledge (Carter & Kallestrup 2016). The subject does not instead merely relearn the information upon accessing it. Knowledge may not only extend to memory technology, but this knowledge may in ways be better than knowledge from biomemory (Carter 2018; Heersmink & Carter 2020). It may for example be more stable and less effortful to maintain. Michaelian (2012a), however, argues that an important case for the extended cognition hypothesis fails. The case highlights functional similarity between biomemory and alleged memory that is external to the subject’s body. The case specifically has to do with their similar, purely preservative functioning. But, Michaelian argues, biomemory lacks this function, so alleged external memory is not relevantly similar to biomemory after all. Notably, the view that biomemory has a purely preservative function has in part motivated views about its epistemic powers, such as both versions of preservationism.

3.3 Metacognition

We are not only cognitively active creatures, but we also monitor and control our own cognitive activity, typically unreflectively. This monitoring and controlling is metacognition. Memory involves metacognition (Arango-Muñoz 2013, 2014; Arango-Muñoz & Michaelian 2014; Michaelian 2012b; Proust 2013). Thanks to memory we retrieve information, but then we also evaluate it and our own retrieval of it. For example the information may not indicate its origin, and we use heuristics to determine a probable one—experience as opposed to, say, imagination. We also monitor how quickly or slowly we retrieve the information, and our epistemic feelings toward it (such as, say, a feeling of knowing). An endorsement mechanism controls for example whether we continue or cease to seek from memory the desired information.

Michaelian (2012b) argues that the metacognitive endorsement mechanism is reliable and justifying despite its relying on sources of information that do not always deliver accurate information. Michaelian (2012c) argues that metacognitive monitoring helps one’s own memory to function reliably, yet that monitoring testifiers for untrustworthiness is unimportant to testimony’s reliability. Proust (2013) thinks metacognition helps us have justification, but contends that internalism about epistemic justification struggles to explain how this is so. Frise (2018c) argues that metacognition in memory supports a kind of internalism about epistemic justification over process reliabilism.

3.4 Knowledge-How

This entry has discussed memory and knowledge, but only one type of knowledge. The type is knowledge-that, or propositional knowledge. What is known here is, or has the form of, a proposition. Maria knows that the 49ers should have won Super Bowl LIV, and this is propositional knowledge, or knowledge-that. Another type of knowledge is knowledge-how (see entry on knowledge how). Maria knows how to throw a football. This is knowledge-how.

There is much discussion of how these two types of knowledge relate. A standard view is that they are importantly distinct types. A controversial view, however, is that knowledge-how consists in or requires knowledge-that. This view is intellectualism. The philosophy and psychology of memory might shed light on how the two types of knowledge relate. There is evidence that the two types rely on distinct memory systems (Michaelian 2011c). Not all knowledge-how involves knowledge-that. Thus, intellectualism appears false. Additionally, memory for how to execute physical actions, or remembering-how, appears closely related to knowledge-how. Remembering-how can endure longer than related propositional knowledge, allowing individuals with dementia to retain certain skills (Sutton & Williamson 2014). If remembering-how suffices for knowledge-how, this may be further evidence against intellectualism. The subject has lost the knowledge-that while keeping the relevant knowledge-how.

3.5 Forgetting

Forgetting is normatively significant. Not only does some of it invite moral blame (Bernecker 2018), but it is essential to the epistemological problems of forgotten evidence and forgotten defeat. But it is not entirely clear what forgetting is. And surprisingly little work addresses the nature of forgetting. Some forgetting is a process, other forgetting is a mental state; forgetting might have different types of content (e.g., a proposition or an event or an experience); forgetting involves some characteristic relation to its content that distinguishes it from other processes or states with the same content; forgetting has some scale, either binary or a further graded range (Frise 2018b).

It might seem commonsensical that forgetting, whatever it is exactly, is incompatible with knowing. What you forget, you no longer know. But perhaps sometimes a subject forgets what she still knows (Moon 2012b; Pappas 1983, 1987). The forgetting may involve trying but failing to mentally access previously learned information. The information may be mentally accessible to the subject via her memory. The subject fails to access it, however. She still dispositionally knows what she’s forgetting. Other ways of forgetting are harder to square with knowing. For example, some forgetting involves information being lost. And it’s plausible that a subject does not still know information that she has lost.

Forgetting appears to be an epistemic defect, in part because some forgetting appears incompatible with knowing. It would be better not to forget, because not forgetting would allow for more knowing. However forgetting might be a feature of a virtuously functioning memory system (Michaelian 2011a). Not forgetting, or too little forgetting, would be a problem. The problem wouldn’t be that human memory would run out of storage space, hampering further learning. Rather, human memory works better by clearing out clutter, such as learned information we don’t care about. Forgetting allows faster, more reliable recall, and perhaps a greater ratio of recall for what we do care about.

3.6 Skepticism

Memory fails at times, as we have each experienced. As a result, we might be inclined to inquire into memory’s trustworthiness. Inquiring may be unnecessary for our having justification. Perhaps memory could provide it as long as there’s no reason to doubt its trustworthiness (Moon 2017). Memory is trustworthy, and finding this out is additional evidence in favor of what we believe via memory. But memory still generates or preserves justification prior to our inquiry.

Or perhaps if memory is to provide justification for a subject, she must have reason to suppose her memory is trustworthy. It is not immediately obvious what the relevant trustworthiness consists in. It may be a matter of memory functioning in a certain way. And this could be a matter of memory in general being reliable, tending to yield more true beliefs than false beliefs. A potential reason to suppose memory is reliable is that to suggest otherwise is, in a way, self-defeating (Locke 1971). To show memory is unreliable, we’d presumably need to cite evidence of its failures. But this evidence comes from memory. So if we show memory is unreliable, it is because memory supported believing something, namely, its own unreliability. So even if it is plausible that memory is unreliable, memory supports some believing.

It might not matter whether memory in general is reliable. Perhaps it just matters whether memory is reliable in the right circumstances or for a certain range of beliefs, or whether a given memory system is reliable, or whether a given memory is likely correct. An inference to the best explanation argument supports the latter: a given memory, if accurate, can make better sense of why a subject now experiences what that memory predicts she would experience (Hasan 2021).

If memory is to justify certain beliefs it might need to be trustworthy in a different way. It might need to be conditionally reliable. Mere reliability is a matter of a process tending to yield more true beliefs than false beliefs. Conditional reliability is a process tending to do this when all belief inputs are true. Memory processing could be unreliable, yet conditionally reliable. It tends to yield false beliefs, but not when the inputs to it (such as past beliefs) are all true. If, as per one sort of preservationism, memory cannot generate justification, it does not seem to matter whether memory is reliable simpliciter. It just matters whether memory is conditionally reliable. Its conditional reliability would allow memory to preserve the justification of a past belief, according process reliabilism. Reliability simpliciter does not matter for whether memory preserves justification. Reliability simpliciter does matter for whether memory generates new justification, but preservationism (as anti-generativism) denies memory can do this.

Inference to the best explanation may also support memory’s conditional reliability. That memory is conditionally reliable is part of the best explanation of our having doxastic attitudes at all (Frise & McCain 2021). Suppose memory functions in a way where it supplies us with doxastic attitudes, such as beliefs. If memory is not creating all these attitudes anew, it is taking some attitudes as inputs and later on yielding attitudes as outputs. On the simpler and better accounts of how memory does this, it minimally changes the input along the way. If there is no or little relevant change, the belief output will have the same truth-value as the input, as it might even have the same content. So when all belief inputs to memory are true, memory tends to yield true beliefs rather than false beliefs. It is conditionally reliable.

However, even if memory is trustworthy in all ways that matter, the typical person may have an importantly flawed view of how some memory systems work, such that the typical person fails to know via those memory systems (Frise 2022). For instance, our folk understanding of episodic memory fails to appreciate its constructive nature. Leaning on this folk understanding may imperil knowledge of past events from episodic memory, as it is plausible that a subject cannot know that p if her justification for believing that p essentially depends on a falsehood.

Instead of focusing on memory’s trustworthiness, we might focus on whether a given belief about the past is correct. Russell (1921) points out that all or nearly all our beliefs about the past could be false. We might seem to remember various events and facts about what has occurred. But we might have come to exist just five minutes ago. The apparent past is misleading. Russell’s skeptical hypothesis is similar to skeptical hypotheses concerning other alleged sources of knowledge and justification, such as perception. It is no surprise, then, that many responses to Russell’s skeptical hypothesis parallel responses to skepticism of other sorts (see entry on skepticism).


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