Notes to Meritocracy

1. There’s a related debate about the role of merit in the distribution of educational opportunities. See, e.g., Anderson 2007, Brighouse & Swift 2006, Guinier 2015, Khanna & Szonyi 2022, and Satz 2007. For meritocrats about justice (§4), it’s important to distinguish the distribution of children’s educational opportunities (say, secondary school) from adults’ (graduate school). When it comes to adults, strict meritocratic distribution reigns. But for children, educational opportunities are distributed to create that “equal starting line” (§2.3) which equal opportunity, and meritocracy, require. College is an interesting, borderline case. It’s unclear whether college students are (i) autonomous adults or (ii) children in the final stage of the equal opportunity framework.

2. Goldman (1977) gives a hybrid justification for meritocratic hiring. Society has a right, he says, to the superior benefits which meritocratic hiring obtains, and on that basis (in part) the most meritorious applicant deserves the job. Arguments like this often appeal to the idea that selectors (e.g., hiring committees) have a fiduciary duty to third parties, like society at-large, which they fulfill by hiring on the basis of merit.

3. David Miller 1999 reprints (with some edits) Miller’s “Deserving Jobs” (Miller 1992) and “Two Cheers for Meritocracy” (Miller 1996).

4. On reaction qualifications broadly, see also Alexander 1992, Lippert-Rasmussen 2009, and Mason 2006. Note that most scholars are not concerned with when a reaction qualification is a merit or not (the metaphysical question at issue here), but whether they are morally legitimate grounds on which to discriminate. Lippert-Rasmussen (2009) is an exception.

5. Two other potential bases have been considered but by now largely abandoned. The first is effort. While extraordinarily important as an instrument toward making an economic contribution, it is dubious that effort per se deserves compensation. The other is cost, in the sense of sacrifices made or literal costs incurred to work. But costs can be and are reflected in higher compensation (what economists call compensating differentials). For example, doctors undergo long, difficult, and expensive training, which is offset by subsequent, high salaries. More promising is the idea that purposeful effort—i.e., effort exerted towards a worthwhile end—should be rewarded, even if the effort was ultimately unsuccessful. On these matters, see Ake 1975, Dick 1975, Dwyer 2020, Hurka 2003, Lamont 1994 and 1995, Levine 1999, David Miller 1976, Milne 1986, Olsaretti 2003a, Sadurski 1985, and Wolff 2003.

6. Another way to think about these matters, as welfare economists often do, is to consider how people’s utility (i.e., happiness) gets affected by economic activity. In other words, one’s contribution turns on how one’s economic activity affects others’ happiness—not their dollar-valued welfare.

7. Rawls does not, however, explain in detail his Fair Equality of Opportunity (FEO) principle. As Lindblom puts it, “Rawls himself says very little about [FEO], and some of what he says is not easy to interpret” (2018: 235). Nevertheless, FEO is usually interpreted as “equal opportunity” has been in this entry: as a call for nullifying social advantage.

Copyright © 2023 by
Thomas Mulligan <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free