The Minim friar Marin Mersenne (1588–1648) played a central role in French intellectual life of the first half of the seventeenth century. At a time when scientific periodicals were still sorely lacking, he was rightly referred to as “The Secretary of Learned Europe” (“le secrétaire de l’Europe savante”, Hauréau 1877, p. 177) thanks to his sprawling correspondence, which extended his network across the whole of learned Europe, to his role as translator, editor, disseminator of scientific information, and to his ability to generate research and discoveries by creating “fine questions” (de belles questions, Pascal 1658, p. 1) addressed to the foremost scholars of the time. His tireless activity certainly helped to create a new image of a mathematical, mechanistic and experimental science in the making, based on the exchange of information and co-operation between European scholars. Part of his fame is also due to his lifelong connection to Descartes. From the time the latter settled in Holland, Mersenne was his main, and at times unique, correspondent, providing him with rich information on intellectual life, and relentlessly questioning him on philosophical and scientific matters.
Although these features of Mersenne’s activities (as an animator of scientific life and as Descartes’s friend and correspondent) are the most well-known, they should not conceal Mersenne’s own original contribution to philosophy. While his first works were polemic in tone, offering “scientific apologetics” (Lenoble 1943) using arguments taken from the sciences to defend Christian catholic religion against all sorts of heterodox trends threatening it, his latter publications (from 1634 onward), far less concerned with apologetics, illustrated and promoted the new mechanical, mathematical, and experimental sciences. A key thread running through his complex intellectual career, music, understood as the general science of harmonics, received Mersenne’s constant attention and was the subject of several important publications.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Scientific Apologetics
- 3. Metaphysical Issues
- 4. Epistemological Issues
- 5. Music and Universal Harmony
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Works
Marin Mersenne was born on 8 September 1588 near Oizé in the French region of Haut-Maine (nowadays the Sarthe). He came from a family of merchants and small landowners. After studying at the college du Mans, he was sent in 1604 to the newly created Jesuit college of La Flèche, where he received the established Jesuit education, coupling humanist—Ciceronian—and Aristotelian traditions (Dear 1988). He may have met there the young René Descartes, who entered La Flèche in 1606, although it is unlikely that their friendship started then, as Descartes was 8 years his junior. When he left the college, Mersenne completed his training in theology, Greek and Hebrew in Paris at the Collège Royal and at the Sorbonne where he was instructed by the Thomist theologians François Ysambert and Philippe de Gamache (see Coste 1648; Armogathe 1994). Attracted to the strict rule of the Minims, a Franciscan order recently introduced into France, he took the habits in 1611, and after periods of novitiate and teaching in Meaux, Paris and Never, was recalled to Paris in 1619 at the new house on the Place Royale (the present Place des Vosges) where he remained permanently, apart from a few trips to the French provinces, to the Netherlands in 1630, and to Italy from 1644 to 1645.
From the years 1620 onward, Mersenne deployed overflowing intellectual activity. Through the mediation of Claude Fabbri de Pereisc whom he had met in 1616, he was introduced to the Parisian intellectual elite, and later to Pierre Gassendi with whom he remained close friends. In Paris, he associated with the mathematician Claude Mydorge, and, perhaps through him, renewed acquaintance with Descartes. Mersenne called on Descartes’s mathematical expertise on questions of optics. His questions led Descartes to his first formulation of the law of refraction, which he was to publish later in his 1637 “Dioptrics”. Mersenne was among those attending the famous meeting of 1628, at the residence of the apostolic nuncio, where Descartes, having revealed his project of founding the sciences on a new method, had been encouraged to do so by the highest religious authorities. After Descartes left for Holland, Mersenne remained in close contact with him through correspondence. He was privy to most of Descartes’s secret addresses, which made him the man one has to see in order to get access to the French exile, to send him letters or questions. Only four letters from Mersenne to Descartes are extant, but 146 letters from Descartes—about a quarter of his known correspondence—testify to the intensity and continuity of the exchange. Mersenne endlessly provided Descartes with books, fresh information, and editorial services, requesting in exchange answers to queries of all sorts. Acting as mediator in Descartes’s controversies, with Fermat, Roberval, Beaugrand, Morin, or Voëtius, he sometimes caused quarrels himself, through his indiscretions, such as the one which made Descartes definitively fall out with his erstwhile mentor Isaac Beeckman. Mersenne also acted as intermediary for the edition of the Meditationes de prima philosophiae, and was instrumental in the gathering of the six sets of objections that were added to the text with Descartes’s responses, including those of Hobbes and Gassendi. He contributed himself to the objectiones, penning the second set (“gathered by the R. P. Mersenne from the mouth of various theologians and philosophers”, AT IX-1: 96) and perhaps parts of the sixth.
Mersenne’s dealings with Descartes were only a small part of the network of intellectual communication that he built up throughout his career. He was largely responsible for introducing Galileo into France, offering in 1630—without receiving an answer—to publish his future work on the Two Chief Systems of the World. In 1634, he published Les Méchaniques de Galilée, a free translation of a manuscript on mechanics by the Florentine scholar, completed with ideas borrowed from Guidobaldo and Stevin, and with original comments of his own, and, in 1639, the Nouvelles pensées de Galilée, a translation or adaptation of certain parts of the Discorsi a due nuove scienze, published in Italy one year earlier. Mersenne was also in regular contact with English scholars. He translated into French the De Veritate of Herbert of Cherbury (although the book had been placed in the Index, i.e., the list of prohibited books published by the Catholic Church); in good terms with Hobbes, he published one of his optical treatises, and Sorbière’s French translation of the De Cive. He corresponded with Kenelm Digby and Lord Cavendish and others.
In Paris, a small scientific circle of mathematicians and physicists gradually formed around Mersenne. From 1633 or so, meetings were organized on Thursdays at the houses of one or another of his friends or protectors. This “Academia Parisiensis”, as it came to be called, brought together men such as Étienne Pascal, Mydorge, Hardy, Roberval, Fermat. It was later to welcome the young Blaise Pascal, and Jacques Le Pailleur who was to become the group’s leader when Mersenne died in 1648. Discussions were mostly “mathematical” (MC V: 209). Mersenne used to submit problems of his own invention to his friends, and some were often remarkably stimulating and the origin of important discoveries such as the “roulette” problem, solved by Roberval in 1634; and then more indirectly by Fermat and Descartes. Mersenne himself undertook to establish a first list of what will eventually be called the “Mersenne primes”, prime numbers that can be written in the form 2n − 1, whose properties and determination are still topical questions in contemporary mathematics. Mersenne envisaged his meeting group, and his own net of correspondents, as the prototype for a larger institution that would bring scholars together in a pacified Europe, foreshadowing the foundation of the later Académie des sciences in 1666, or the Royal Society in England (MC V: 301–302, and Goldstein 2013)
In 1623 and 1625, Mersenne published three massive philosophical works. The Questiones celeberrimae in Genesim (which covers almost 1900 folio columns), a commentary on the six first chapters of the book of Genesis, larded with long scientific and philosophical digressions, was intended as an apology of Christian religion against all forms of “atheism”. It contains attacks on various Platonist, cabbalistic and hermetic authors such as Bernardino Telesio, Pietro Pomponazzi, Giordano Bruno, Jacques Gaffarel, or the English hermetic author, Robert Fludd. The tone is virulent, sometimes offensive, and the book attracted several outraged answers. Fludd in particular reacted in his Sophia cum moria certamen (1629) which itself drew a long reply from Gassendi, writing upon Mersenne’s request (Gassendi 1630). The same inspiration governs L’Impiété des Déistes, published in French the next year. It is as a point-by-point refutation of the 106 Quatrains du Déiste or Anti-Bigot, a long anonymous poem denouncing Christian revelation, bigoted superstition and belief in a personal God. Mersenne’s response, written as a dialogue between a deist and a theologian, leads to the conversion of the deist, to whom the existence, justice and mercy of the Christian God are demonstrated. Dedicated to Richelieu, and perhaps written on command, the book may be seen as taking part in a larger campaign orchestrated by the French state and the catholic church, at a time that witnessed Vanini’s execution in Toulouse, the trial of Theophile de Viau, and a strengthening of repressive measures against anti-Aristotelian philosophical novelties. La Vérité des sciences (1625) is a dialogue between an alchemist, a skeptic and a Christian philosopher, the latter opposing both the over-confidence of the first and the excessive doubts of the second. The second, third and fourth parts of the book, dealing with arithmetic and geometry, is an 800 page compilation of ancient and recent achievements in the mathematical sciences, intended to show that there are regions of human knowledge immune from doubt, and which do not contradict Christian wisdom.
By the end of the 1620s, Mersenne’s former animosity towards the anti-aristotelians authors withered, giving way to a more lenient if not tolerant approach. Galileo whom he had listed among the dangerous ones in 1623 is now the object of great praise. Mersenne seemed much less concerned with the proliferation of atheists and heretics, and he expressed regrets about the offensive tone of his previous works (Letter to Rivet 12 nov. 1639, MC X: 599). His travel to Holland in 1630 put him in contact with Protestant scholars, such as André Rivet and the Socinian Ruarus, who became regular correspondents. Mersenne who used to vilify the heretics, was now taken to task for his sympathies with the enemy, and he was sometimes dubbed the “Huguenot monk”. In any case the staunch defense of orthodoxy of the first works is nowhere to be found in Mersenne’s next publications, which, from 1634 onward, are almost entirely devoted to the promotion of the mathematical sciences, broadly conceived. It has been a question among biographers and commentators whether these changes reflect a conversion to a new agenda or a new philosophical outlook. Robert Lenoble (1943: 38) considers that until 1634, Mersenne was still looking for a better philosophy of nature and held provisionally to Aristotelianism, “whereas at that date he discovered what he had sought for many years, namely Mechanism”. Sylvie Taussig (2009b) considers that Mersenne went through a serious crisis, both moral and intellectual, at the end of the 1620s, and that under the influence of Peiresc and Gassendi he came to adopt a more skeptical outlook on philosophical and religious matters. Without denying Mersenne’s change of tone and accent, Garber (2004) and Dear (1988) tend to underplay the extent and meaning of Mersenne’s “conversion” to the new philosophy, considering that his agenda of promoting mixed mathematics was to him still compatible with a traditional philosophical outlook—“the learning of the schools”, that Dear described as conjoining Christianized Aristotelianism, Renaissance humanism and a skeptical or probabilistic approach to philosophical matters. We shall come back to these issues in due course.
The five treatises published in a row in 1634 are representative of the kind of intellectual productions Mersenne would henceforth offer. Two of them (Questions inouyes, and Questions théologiques…) are eclectic lists of “curious” questions, intended for entertainment (récréation) as well as for instruction of the learned: can one walk on water without miracle? How many grain of sands can be contained in the sphere of the earth ? From where does the satisfaction come when one believes one has found a new demonstration or truth? In these questions metaphysical, apologetic and even theological considerations are (in spite of the title of the second treatise) barely present.
The Questions harmoniques and the Préludes to the harmonie universelle prepare the way for the publication of Mersenne’s great achievement on musical theory, The Harmonie Universelle (1636–7), where he offers what is still considered a major contribution to the scientific understanding of “consonance” and acoustics.
Finally the Mechaniques de Galilée illustrates Mersenne’s constant interest in physico-mathematical questions of Galilean type, that is Archimedean mechanics stricto sensu, dealing with basic machines, such as the lever, the wheel, the pulley, but also the sciences of motion, free fall, ballistics, pneumatics, hydrostatics, and optics. Mersenne pursued these interests in the 1640s, when he started to make his own campaigns of experiments in order to verify Galilean numerical data on free fall and on the velocity of a cannon ball, especially during his journey to Italy (1644–1645) where he met Torricelli. These researches resulted in the publication of his Cogitate physico-mathematica (1644) and his Novarum observum physico-matheaticarum (1647), which includes in its first part a treatise by Roberval on the system of the world. A book on optics was to be published after Mersenne’s death (L’Optique et la catoptrique, 1651).
2. Scientific Apologetics
Mersenne was indubitably an heir to the Thomistic view of a necessary synthesis between Christian faith and philosophy. As expressed in the praefatium of the Quaestiones in Genesim, it is “a duty of the learned to refute atheists”, the tacit assumption being that “true philosophy never contradicts the teachings of the Church” (ID II: 490–1). This synthesis was vindicated in the rather troubled political, and religious context of early seventeenth-century France, which still bore the scars of half a century of religious wars, and appeared exposed and vulnerable to what Catholics considered a severe crisis of orthodoxy, raging on all fronts. A rising tide of libertines, deists, skeptics, cabbalists, alchemists, and naturalist metaphysicians, all more or less consciously in league with the Protestants, seemed to Mersenne on the verge of overwhelming the “true” Christian faith. Mersenne often pointed out the connection between Protestantism and the various forms of heterodoxy and atheism: the Calvinist belief in predestination insensibly drives men toward superstition and atheism, as it appears more difficult to believe that God wants our damnation, than to represent Him as a “cruel Saturn who devours his children”, or simply to own that there is no God at all (ID II: 589). So, Mersenne’s early-interventions may be seen as taking part in the larger movement of “re-catholization” of the French state after the pacification allowed by the Edit de Nantes. In this regard, Mersenne’s advocacy of a harmonious conciliation of faith and reason was not without similarities with a noted feature of Galileo’s “cultural program” in the same years: both wanted to contribute to the Counter-Reformation, and both defended the specific idea that Catholics should not leave to Protestant heretics the monopoly of reason and scientific knowledge. Mersenne was however wary of any anti-Aristotelian philosophical novelties (including those of Galileo himself), as he saw them as ipso facto dangerously verging towards contesting religious truth. According to Garber (2004), the Aristotelian framework, particularly prominent in the first works, was adopted not so much for its philosophical virtues as such, but rather as a rampart of orthodoxy, as a tried doctrine, that has long proved its ability to be harmoniously conjoined with Christian faith, and as it were to protect it. By contrast, alternative ways of thinking offered no such guarantee against heresy, as they were often defended with a zeal that was dangerously close to fanaticism. As Mersenne stated in the preface to the Quaestiones (1623):
These men who desire to found a new philosophy, and to demonstrate it from fundamental principles, never regard the glory of God. Rather they strive with an ignorant obsessive zeal [cacozelia], by which they seek to shake up and overturn the Catholic religion, if they are able to do it—unless I am mistaken. (QG Praefatio, translated in Garber 2004: 141)
Thus it seems quite clear that the stakes of a book like the Quaestiones were not simply a defense of natural religion but also, and perhaps primarily, a defense of catholic faith (and its mysteries) against the caricature conveyed in a growing number of writings, that represented it as resulting from superstition and ignorance:
It is appropriate to Catholics, and especially to theologians to know the sciences and to scrutinize God’s works, not only because we thus receive the meaning of His will as from the pages of a Book, but also because we show how unfounded is the atheist’s representation of Catholics as melancholic, agitated with thousands scruples and superstitions. (QG: col 2 – translation here and elsewhere from the author, unless otherwise indicated)
To realize this aim, Mersenne’s strategy was twofold: polemical and constructive. On the one hand he attacked his polymorph enemy with the rhetorical instruments of a skilled debater, using the weapons of the adversaries, or making one refute the other (as in the dialogue between the alchemist and the skeptic in the first book of La Vérité des sciences). Hermetic authors such as Robert Fludd, or cabbalistic Christians such as Giovanni Pico and Jacques Gaffarel were vehemently denounced, as they availed themselves of spurious allegorical interpretations of the Bible. Even when their reading of the Bible is not wrong, they are dangerous as they make people believe they can deduce a priori, or through divine inspiration, what can only be known a posteriori, through revelation and experience. Heretic tendencies were pointed out in the doctrines of the Alchemists, who, in the wake of Paracelsus’s Mysterium magnum, tried to give naturalist interpretations of Christian mysteries, such as the resurrection or the miracle of Creation. Mages, sorcerers, and adepts of esoteric mysteries such as the Rosicrucians prosper on men’s propensity to superstition. Naturalist metaphysicians—Bruno, Campanella, Pomponnazi—who endowed nature with creative powers, verge dangerously toward pantheism, casting doubt on creation, on the transcendence and freedom of God. A leading thread in all these criticisms, is the idea that the Catholic belief in miracles and mysteries, far from being superstitious, is much more attuned to sound reason than the doctrines that are opposed to it. A light knowledge of philosophy may induce some doubts, but the more one knows the sciences, the more these Catholic beliefs and mysteries are reinforced and may be vindicated against false religion and atheism. A smattering of knowledge in optics can for example cast doubt on the truth of divine epiphanies, but a better knowledge of this same science allows one to exclude the idea that miracles can be illusions caused by reflections or refractions and therefore makes more sensible their divine origin (QG: col. 522, 538). This sort of negative argument shows that Mersenne’s rationalist defense of religion allows for truths beyond the capacity of men’s reason. In this, Mersenne stand explicitly against the deist. Both allowed for “natural religion”, but whereas the deist denounced the superstition and anthropomorphism of popular belief, Mersenne reversed the attacks and denounced the far worse anthropomorphism of one who measures God by human reason: “it is feebleness of the mind, to believe that our finite understandings can comprehend the divine attributes or acts” (ID I: 318–9; see also ID I: 669–70, and Beaude 1980). This however should not be understood as revealing a secret inclination towards fideism: religion teaches truths which surpass reason, “not in destroying it, but rather in perfecting it” (ID I: 680).
Mersenne’s criticisms are based on a careful reading and exposition of the adverse doctrines, to the point that Mersenne has been sometimes taken to task for offering the enemies of religion a much too complacent advertisement. It has been remarked (Carraud 1994: 152) that the discourse of others (le discours d’autrui) holds a distinctive place in Mersenne’s writings: it is neither dismissed as in Descartes, nor deftly re-appropriated as in Leibniz, but rather faithfully produced and reported in order to be discussed on its own level and according to its own merits. This is the case, for example with the cabbalistic “sefirot” and numerological methods which are patiently, almost sympathetically, expounded in the Impiété. The same holds for Giordano Bruno’s doctrine. However heretic the man was, his arguments in favor of the infinity and plurality of the worlds (from his De Infinito) are not simply dismissed or brushed aside. The Christian philosopher reports them quite accurately in the second part of the Impiété des déistes, before answering and criticizing them.
Apart from its polemical intent, Mersenne’s “scientific apologetics” may be seen as articulating a natural theology together with a “sacred physics” or “sacred mathematics”. On the one hand a host of rational arguments—some of them borrowed from the sciences, some from traditional metaphysics—are brought in to prove God’s existence and demonstrate His attributes. This natural theology is where Mersenne articulates his main ideas on metaphysics and we shall come back to it in the next part of this article. On the other hand, science is used as an instrument of exegesis. The Quaestiones in Genesim contains thus numerous scientific excursuses whose aim is either to give a scientific (mainly mathematical) exposition of a biblical content—as when Mersenne “calculates” what should be the size of Noah’s ark, or suggests that our knowledge of architecture should help us to see the excellence of the temple of Solomon—or to illustrate a Catholic mystery (such as the triadic unity of God or the miracle of the Creation) through a mathematical analogy.
This edifying use of mathematics is perhaps the hallmark of Mersenne’s writings. It is still very much present in later publications (such as the Harmonie Universelle). The minim is literally fascinated by the almost magical properties of numbers and geometrical figures, where the most surprising and complicated objects and properties are generated from the simplest principles. This gives him a general analogy for religious truths. There are “thousands of things in the mysteries of faith” that are “incomprehensible to the pagan and to a peripatetic philosopher”, but that may be made understood by a “Christian Euclid” (un Euclide chrétien) : Mathematics makes the relation of the infinite to the finite sensible, showing how an infinite motion can be made in a finite space. It can thus “explain” the union of the two natures in the same divine person. Although the mathematical point is the humblest object, “the minim of geometry” (HU III: Livre de l’Utilité de l’Harmonie, 16), it is in a sense the closest to God itself. Both are simple, without parts. The point engenders the line and together with the line, the surfaces, and with lines and surfaces the bodies. This gives us an insight on how God engenders the son, the son and God together, the holy spirit, and then all together the universe. Unity contains all numbers eminently, as God contains all created acts and all creatures, etc (ibid. 16-17). Mersenne also likes to suggest mathematical analogies illustrating, or symbolizing moral virtues. Thus, as the height of a triangle is measured by a perpendicular line elevated from the basis, the goodness of our actions is measured by the righteousness of our intention (“la droite intention”, VS I: 12). Mixed mathematics, optics, music and mechanics are also mobilized in the moral use of mathematics. For example:
mechanics teaches us to live well, either by imitating heavy bodies which always seek their center in the center of the Earth, just as the spirit of Man must seek his own center in the divine essence which is the source of all our spirits, or by maintaining ourselves in that perpetual moral and moderate balance which consists of rendering all that belongs to Him first of all to God and then to our neighbor. (MC IV: 208–09)
The philosophical value of Mersenne’s apologetics may be differently assessed. Mersenne seemed to pay little attention to contemporary arguments according to which the Bible is not to be taken literally on questions dealing with nature (see, e.g., Galileo’s 1615 Letter to Christina). His exegesis indeed offers a rather rough example of what will be later called “concordism”, the conception that there cannot be any discrepancy between the teachings of the sciences and those of the Bible, taken in the most literal sense. However, the most distinctive aspect of Mersenne’s apologetics, the edifying use of mathematics, although sometimes naïve in its formulations, did have philosophical influence. Pascal, who does not spare his sarcasm on those who think they can “prove God from the course of the moon and the planets” (Pascal 1963: 599, fg. 781), is nevertheless quite faithful to Mersenne’s use of mathematics, when he discusses men’s disproportion and God’s greatness from the mathematical model of the infinite divisibility of space, or from a speculation on the two infinites whose terms are reminiscent of similar passages from the Impiété.
Besides, although Mersenne’s “scientific apologetics” was primarily conceived as a defense of religion against “atheists”, where science is only a tool, it turned out to be also a defense of mathematical sciences against whoever might think that they are vain curiosity and must be either rejected, or at least relativized as inessential knowledge… This is especially manifest in the later works, where Mersenne gave free rein to his passion for mathematical sciences. Whereas natural theology and anti-deistic polemic were no longer dominant themes, he still vindicated the “usefulness” of mathematics, not only for men’s welfare, but for their edifying virtues. In the next decades, one could find similar moves in defense of the “usefulness of natural experimental philosophy” in the works of Robert Boyle.
3. Metaphysical Issues
3.1 Metaphysics as Rational Theology
In the Quaestiones, Mersenne offered a tripartition of the theoretical sciences: metaphysics considers “trans-natural objects, such as God and the angels, that are actually separated from all matter”; doctrinal sciences—that is mathematics—deals with objects that are “in truth material, but considered abstracted from matter, such as the line and the figure”; natural sciences (physics) considers “material things as such, for example the heavens or the elements”. (QG: col 92–3). In La Vérité (VS I: 50), Mersenne suggested that metaphysics, although an abstract science, like logic and mathematics, is nevertheless closer to physics, in so far as their shared aim is to consider “things as they are in themselves”, and not simply things as they appear to our senses—in this both sciences “are rightly called sapience”. He was later to revise this coupling, suggesting in his Questions inouïes (QI: 54) that metaphysics is closer to mathematics, on account of the fact that, contrary to physics, metaphysics and mathematics both consider immutable and eternal objects, and are the only ones among the sciences capable of being really possessed by men here below.
The definition of metaphysics given in the Quaestiones is strongly reminiscent of Aristotle’s Metaphysics E1—where “prime philosophy” is conceived as strictly concerned with the separated or immaterial substances, thus with the “theological” realm. Jean-Luc Marion (1994) pointed out that although Mersenne, in several places, acknowledges formally another traditional object for metaphysics, that is the “ens quatenus ens” (the abstracted Being as such, whose science applies indifferently to all beings, created or uncreated), he seemed reluctant to give this science (that we now call ontology) any substance. In a striking passage from the Quaestiones, Mersenne said that “Being” is a name that suits God better than any of the creatures:
Among all names “being” is the one that we should ascribe to God, rather than all the other ones naming the perfections of creatures… God could justly say “I am all Being, as I contains all things more perfectly than they can contain themselves”. This is why all creatures could say “my name is non-Being, or non-entity” (Non Esse, seu non Ens), as, according to Plato, truly all things except God have non-being rather than being. (QG: col. 21)
In later works the specificity of ontology was quickly dissolved into logic on the one hand (an abstract science which shares with ontology the same principle of non-contradiction, see VS 52–55) and into rational theology on the other hand, the science of immaterial beings and first causes. This dissolution may be seen as anticipating Descartes’s own reduction of metaphysics to “prime philosophy”, and, according to Marion, this is a very significant (albeit a merely negative one) legacy of Mersenne’s work to the history of metaphysics.
3.2 Proofs of God’s Existence
The bulk of Mersenne’s contribution to rational theology is contained in the 700 or so first columns of his Quaestiones in Genesim, where no less than 35 proofs of God’s existence are reckoned and detailed. The importance of rational demonstration is directly related to the apologetic project: one cannot simply be content with the idea that God is immediately known, as this could not shut the mouths of the atheists. The encyclopedic turn of the recension is obvious, and Mersenne, ready to use all means available to contradict the atheists, was not taken aback by the fact that these proofs belong to various, and sometimes adverse, theological traditions. After summoning the consensus of all creatures, and the consensus of all men, Mersenne resorted to cosmological arguments, arguing, from the contingency of our word, and the contingency of our own finite existence, that “it is necessary that something exists by itself”. Here Mersenne borrowed from Hugues of Saint Victor and Jean Damascene.
He also presented at some length the Anselmian argument, arguing that existence should be attributed to God, on account of the fact that the very idea of God (that even the insane atheist should have in his mind) obliges us to consider that nothing greater can exist, and that existence in re is obviously a greater thing than existence in the mind. Mersenne, who did not mention Aquinas’s criticisms, found the argument “excellent and very pious” (QG: col 37). He also paid much credit to the Augustinian argument from “eternal truths”—Mathematical truths in particular would not be possible without the supposition of an eternal mind in which they reside:
open your mind’s eyes, ô atheist, and see how numerous and strong are the arguments through which arithmetic asks you to embrace the divine unity, without which Arithmetic would not hold, as all material unity or numerical is impossible without the supposition of divine unity. … One objects to the atheist’s geometry, if ever one listens to Plato who recognizes God from this very science, as he said that God never ceases to practice geometry. (QG Praefatio: a2)
It is to be noted that the two a priori arguments (from eternal truths and from the idea of a perfect being) are the only two that are brought in in the Impiété to dispel atheism. In the Quaestiones however more than half of Mersenne’s arguments were a posteriori ones: from the creation ex nihilo, from the beauty of creatures, from the given natural law, from the harmony of the universe… All allowed lengthy scientific excursuses, demonstrating God’s intelligence and providence through whatever the sciences can show of the order of things. Among these arguments, Mersenne paid only lip service to the classical Aristotelian and Thomist “argument from motion”, which states that the world needs an immutable first mover, probably because he is aware that the argument had been used in Paduan Aristotelianism in order to defend the coeternity of the world and its first mover. In the other a posteriori proofs, the regressive move from the creation to the creator was not as likely to subject the creator to the creation.
Prominent in the Quaestiones and Impiété, rational theology tended to recede in importance in subsequent works. Although in the Quaestiones, Mersenne had hinted at another work (“perfectum opus”) to come, it was never written. After 1624 he became more reluctant to consider proofs of God’s existence, hinting in his correspondence with Ruarus that it might not be possible to give a truly demonstrative one, however sensible and approved by everyone was the truth of God’s existence. His doubts were now on a par with the ones he came to entertain regarding demonstrations in physical matters. In his Questions théologiques, he wrote in a somewhat autobiographical tone, that everyone could see for themselves that:
fresh from the Philosophy and Theology courses, they used to imagine that they could give a reason for everything, whereas 20 or 30 years later they are compelled to confess that they know no reason that satisfies them and is so evident and certain that they cannot doubt it. (QT: 10)
This may shed some light on Mersenne’s role in the writing of the second objections to Descartes’s Meditations, where doubts were cast on the demonstrative character of the Cartesian proofs of God’s existence, and especially on the ontological proof, whose Anselmian version was so much favoured by Mersenne in his younger years. It has been argued (Garber 2001), quite convincingly, that Jean-Baptiste Morin, a member of the Mersenne circle, and the author of a booklet on God’s existence written in a geometrical fashion (Morin 1635) had an important hand in the composition of the second objections and that he was probably the one who suggested the request of presenting the Meditations arguments in a geometrical manner. Mersenne, however would have concurred with the reservations, implicit in this demand, concerning Descartes’s claim to the higher certainty of metaphysical demonstrations over mathematical ones.
Voluntarism was an important feature in Mersenne’s apologetics. Against what appeared to him dangerous necessitarian tendencies in Renaissance naturalist philosophies, he repeatedly advocated God’s essential freedom in regard His creation. God chooses to exert his efficient, transitive causality in whatever way he will. This for instance explains why Mersenne always opposed the idea of an infinite universe. An infinite world, of the kind postulated by Giordano Bruno, would be very close to a necessary emanation of God, but it is neither required of God’s infinite power, nor does it agree with the nature of a created thing :
all that is produced is finite but God’s potentia is without measure. No created object is adequate to it. (QG: col. 435)
Mersenne maintained that God is not constrained by His infinite power. As a free cause, he can chose to create a finite universe:
why would God make a finite world, if He could make an infinite one? The answer is: God did not want to do anything else than what he did—this however will not prevent us from believing He is all powerful, as we distinguish in God the work and the will [le faire et le vouloir]… it is bad reasoning to conclude an infinite effect from an infinite cause when the cause is not acting necessarily but freely. (ID II: 304)
For Mersenne the unique perfect egalitarian emanation of God would be an action ad intra, that is the action through which God contemplates (and loves) Himself in the persons of the trinity. When one comes to causality ad extra, such as creation, one has to distinguish (ID II: 311–2) between divine power and divine will. The first contains and addresses infinite possibilities, the second chooses, from among them, a finite assortment.
Voluntarism concerning the nature and laws of creation may appear as an important common ground that Mersenne shared with orthodox (Thomist) scholasticism, and with Descartes. As Lenoble has shown, its assertion was an essential precondition for the establishment of a mechanical science, unifying the whole of nature under the contingent will of God, his initial decisions regarding the distribution and laws of matter and motion. Mersenne’s voluntarism implies that physics is not about an eternal and immutable object, as God could have ordered the word in various manners and with various laws. This, as we shall see, has important epistemological consequences: God’s freedom means that he is not compelled to create things in the simplest fashion. This is evidenced in the reign of the grace, where one can clearly see that God did not chose the shortest way to dispense his grace, as he could have assured our salvation with a unique act of his will (cf. Questions Inouïes, p. 344–5] But this hold as well for scientific truths, and explains for example why Mersenne never considered as decisive Galilean and Copernican arguments for the motion of the earth taken from the simplicity of natural order. Mersenne’s point was actually quite close to the argument from divine omnipotence that Pope Urban VIII suggested to Galileo in 1623, and that Galileo, somewhat ironically, put in the mouth of Simplicio in the concluding sentences of the 1632 Dialogo: Man cannot presume to know how the world really is, since God could have brought about the same effects in ways unimagined by humans (see Galileo, 1890–1909, VII, 488).
3.4 Mersenne and Descartes on Eternal Truths
Mersenne did not extend his voluntarism to mathematical truths, as Descartes did in a rather unconventional way. The confrontation of Mersenne’s and Descartes’s positions on this theme has been the object of some discussions in the secondary literature—see especially Marion 1980; Dear 1988; Carraud 1994; Fabbri 2008. Descartes first assertions on God’s creation of mathematical truths appeared in a letter to Mersenne of April 15, 1630. Descartes enjoined his correspondent to tell everyone aloud that the mathematical truths that Mersenne called eternal were not independent of God, but “have been created by him and depend on him entirely just as do all the other creatures” (Descartes to Mersenne, April 15, 1630, AT I: 145). God freely established them, and impressed them in the minds of men, as a king would in his kingdom. The statement seems to have surprised Mersenne. The Minim’s own letters are lost, but this can be inferred from the fact that Descartes in May and June 1630, obviously answers repeated requests for clarification:
you ask me in quo genere causae Deus disposuit aeternas veritates [in what kind of cause God has disposed the eternal truths]. I reply to you that it is in eodem genere causae [in the same kind of cause] that he has created everything, that is ut efficients et totalis causa [as efficient and total cause]. (Descartes to Mersenne, May 27 1630, AT I: 151–2).
You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal—just as free as he was not to create the world. (27 mai 1630, AT I: 152)
Mersenne’s own considerations on the status of eternal truths in God’s intellect explain why he should have had qualms about Descartes’s puzzling doctrine (which might amount here to no less than making mathematical truths somehow contingent, depending on the arbitrary will of God—even though Descartes himself, who often points out the necessity of mathematical truths, never draws such consequence). Mersenne position seems closer to cardinal de Berulle’s, and Augustine’s exemplarism: eternal truths are exemplar ideas present in God’s intellect and illuminating our own. They proceed from God’s nature as His Verb, but they are not similar to creatures, they are not “freely” created.
When Mersenne considers God’s relation to eternal truth he often uses metaphors of light and the emanatist vocabulary of Neo-Platonism—for example in the Traité de l’harmonie Universelle:
I consider, therefore the divine essence as an eternal and infinite sun, which darts an infinity of rays on which depend all our perfections: the goodness of God is one of these rays , whence come our good inclinations, our virtues and our good works, the other is eternal truth, whence proceed all our truths and our sciences. (THU: 59–60, English translation in Dear 1988: 58)
Or in the Questions théologiques:
the sciences are like the rays of divinity, and it is just as blameable to try to know them without God, than try to know the nature of colours, without knowing the nature of light, which gives them being and subsistence. (QT: 202)
The kind of causality implied here is a causality ad intra: eternal truths belong to God’s nature. And in this regard, as they are “formally” in God and so to speak coeternal with Him, they should be considered as uncreated and necessitated, as God himself is not free towards His own nature:
It is patent that God is entirely free in regard everything that are contained only eminently in him, to produce them or not, as He is driven necessarily to whatever he embraces formerly as these things that are God himself are infinite, eternal, independent. (QG: col 436)
The idea that eternal truths exist necessarily in God, and do not depend on God’s causality was not new, and Mersenne here belonged to a rather well established scholastic tradition. An original feature of Mersenne’s position however is that he considered mathematical truths as the very paradigm of eternal truths. As pointed by Dear, this was not a received doctrine. Mathematics used to be considered not really worthy of the dignity of true sciences, on account of the inessential nature of their object and the non-causal character of their demonstrations. Mersenne, in the wake of Biancani (1615) defended the contrary view: mathematics are not only true sciences, but the highest among them, because of their certainty. Besides, their demonstrations are truly causal ones, as Mersenne showed with the example of numbers where unity appears to be the “material cause” and the intellect, conjoining and composing unities, the “efficient” one (cf. VS II: 284). Thus mathematics is able to describe the objects that God’s intellect considered when He created the world, that is the possibilia (Lenoble 1943)—or, better said, mathematics are the sciences of the metaphysically necessary attributes of all things.
One important question that has been debated in the literature is whether Mersenne’s position amounts to the idea that mathematical truths are truly independent of God. The discussion is not merely about the meaning one is willing to give to the word “independent” whether it applies or not to something that is included in God’s nature, but it engages deep issues in the history of metaphysical thought. According to Marion (1980), and Carraud (1994), the very fact that mathematical truths are considered as forming the essence of God’s intellect means that they do not depend anymore on God’s will. Apparently endorsing a doctrine that he found mentioned in Suárez (1597, xxxi.12.40), Mersenne wrote in a much discussed passage of the Quaestiones:
as other authors say, things are possible per se, independently of any cause, in virtue of the necessary connection and non-contradiction of terms. (col. 436)
God would be submitted to mathematical truths just as human intellects are. He would know them as we know them. This would be the sign that the doctrine of univocity entered Mersenne’s thought, perhaps under the influence of Kepler, in an irretrievable fashion. This is also deemed to explain the striking disappearance of rational theology in Mersenne’s writings. Just as metaphysics had been entirely exhausted by natural theology in the first works, rational theology ended up being entirely exhausted by mathematics. The latter are not anymore an analogical resource for theology, but indeed they furnish the only possible non-analogical discourse on God, “the hidden object of all mathematical discourse” (Pessel 1987). As a consequence, Mersenne’s apologetics no longer needs to appeal to rational theology—the mere promotion of mathematical sciences has become the unique, or best, apology of Christian religion.
Peter Dear criticized Marion’s interpretation as implying something that he did not find in Mersenne, namely that mathematical truths exist in a kind of platonic separateness, so that God and men would be in the same relation to them, would see them the same way. This would imply that God is no more the author of them than men, whereas in Dear’s view, Mersenne, always firmly maintained that eternal truths causally depend on God, being true emanations of his nature. Accordingly, Mersenne would not so much insist on independence but rather on co-implication and coeternity. Whereas Descartes used to
see the matter as straight choice between necessary truths holding simply because God knew them (having willed them) or God’s knowing them because they are independently true. (cf. Descartes à Mersenne 6 mai 1630, Descartes AT I: 149, and Dear 1988: 60)
Mersenne, a rather orthodox scholastic on this point, never recognized an alternative: both theses should hold together—eternal truths are true because God knows them, and God knows them because they are true.
4. Epistemological Issues
4.1 Against the Skeptics
Mersenne’s attitude towards skepticism was complex, changing over time and somewhat ambivalent. In L’Usage de la raison—a recently rediscovered booklet from 1623, whose authorship does not seem questionable—one finds arguments against the vanity of the sciences that are strongly reminiscent of those expressed around the same time by “Christian skeptics”, such as Montaigne and Charron, or even Cornelius Agrippa, authors whom Mersenne sternly criticized in his next publications. Thus, in the “Dedicatory Epistle to Madame de Vitry”, the Minim suggested that our time is badly employed in studying the sciences, which are plagued with insuperable uncertainty:
whenever we raise our eyes to the sky or incline it to the earth, we must owe that everything is unknown to us… Who can claim to know the number of the skies, their form, their matter, properties and accident? One can even find idle-dreamers Copernicans prepared to deny the motion of the skies… Who can say if Alchemists are right in their promises.
This uncertainty of the “megalocosm” goes together with an equal puzzlement concerning the littlest creature of the micro-world, as recent microscopes have shown to the eye that “it is pure ignorance to say that they are deprived of these several organs that can be seen in larger creatures”. Further, (UR: 37–38) the author condemned Pythagoras, Archimedes, the alchemists, the algebraists, etc. for being so much attached to their inventions that they forget to think of God, and eternal glory…
The change of attitude in the next published works is striking. On the one hand, in the Quaestiones and Impiété, skepticism was presented as a sequel to Calvinism; and the denunciation of human reason found in Charron and Montaigne, far from encouraging faith in the mysteries of Christian religion, was seen as inclining men towards atheism and libertinism. On the other hand, Mersenne was no longer denouncing the sciences indistinctly as vain curiosity, his general attitude towards speculative enquiry was much more positive, especially when one came to the mathematical sciences, whose apologetic virtues he wanted now to reveal. He maintained however that our reason is weak, contradictory, particularly in regard philosophical (i.e., physical) issues:
if our reasons were not deceitful, how would it come that there is not any one question in Philosophy, that does not raise diverse opinions wholly contrary on the same subjects, all of which have their reason and nevertheless there is only one that is true. (ID II: 672)
In La Vérité des sciences contre les sceptiques et les phyrroniens, the tone changed again. Skepticism was no longer condemned as a seed of heterodoxy but only in so far as it discourages men from the practice of mathematical sciences. The skeptical character is obstinate, but he is no atheist nor heretic in the disguise (see Descotes, in VS, Introduction), and in the first part of the book, his arguments against the alchemist’s dogmatism are often endorsed and even reinforced by the Christian philosopher.
Against the epistemological optimism of the alchemist who considers himself to be in possession of the perfect science, the skeptic resorts to the traditional arguments of the academic school, emphasizing that certainty is nowhere to be found, as we have only a very partial and superficial knowledge of things. We perceive only the effects and not the profound nature nor the ultimate causes of things. The true essences evade us. The simplest objects (such as a sheet of paper) cannot be completely known, because of the infinite number of relations in which they are involved with other elements of the universe. It has been shown by G. Paganini that these arguments and examples are almost verbatim borrowed from the “second doubt” of Campanella’s Metaphysica, a manuscript that was into Mersenne’s hands at the time he wrote La Vérité des sciences, but that he did not mention as his source (Paganini 2005 & 2008).
In chapter 11 and 12, the Christian philosopher presents the skeptical arguments in a new and more radical form. He gives an account of the ten skeptical tropes of Aenesideme, as Mersenne could have read them in Sextus Empiricus and Diogène Laertius. These tropes draw on the varieties of animal constitution in regard pleasures and pains, the idiosyncrasy of men, the disagreement of the senses, the varieties of circumstances and dispositions, such as health and disease, sleep and wakefulness, young age and old age. All show that the information of our senses is unreliable, just as the reasons we draw from them.
In answer to these doubts, Mersenne’s Christian philosopher resorts to an eclectic strategy. On the one hand, he adopts the usual Aristotelian standpoint against skepticism regarding the senses: sense perception is trustworthy, provided that its exercise takes place in “normal” and appropriate conditions. Errors occur only when the senses are affected by disease, or presented with objects whose distance, illumination, intensity, etc. exceed the normal range:
All the deceptions of senses that you object are of no use, for they only prove what we concede, namely that each one of our senses, in order to judge its object rightly must have all that its nature and the perfection of its operation require—this granted, it never errs. (VS I: 15)
On the other hand, just as senses are the right judges of their own proper sensible—the eye of color and light, the ear of sound, etc.—human intellect also possesses an internal criterion which allows it to judge its own objects rightly. It has the use of “a spiritual and universal light that it has of its own nature since the commencement of its creation” (VS: 193). Here the inspiration is clearly Augustinian, as it is for Descartes’s parent conception of “lumière naturelle”. The light of the soul does not give men direct access to divine knowledge, knowledge of essences, as that would require an eternal glory and a supernatural light. But it still gives access to a number of evidentia, immediate certainties, whose truth, Mersenne concedes, depends on God’s illumination and God’s veracity. Thus, in every realm of knowledge or human interests, there are truths that are not capable of doubt, such as “the whole is greater than the part”, or “evil should be avoided”.
Another Augustinian aspect of Mersenne’s defense is the idea that doubt itself can be turned into a source of knowledge. For example, although there are differences in apprehension between various men, or between men and beasts, we do have the knowledge of such differences and this is something that cannot be doubted: “at least one knows that the objects of the senses appear differently according to the diverse dispositions of the organs” (VS: 193). Awareness of this sort of facts is what incites men to seek the laws of appearances—for example, the optical and geometrical rules that govern variations in perspective. In other terms, it prompts them to engage into physico-mathematical enquiries.
On a similar line of argument, one could say, following Augustine in De Civitate Dei (1998, chapter XI, 26) that one cannot doubt that one doubts, unless admitting an infinite regress:
I do not believe you doubt that [that we can learn science, with great contentment] because you experience this every day in yourself, and if you doubt it I ask whether you know that you are doubting; if you know it, you must know something, and consequently you do not doubt everything; an if you doubt that you doubted, I shall force you to admit infinite regress, which you say you reject, so that wherever you go, you must confess that there is some truth, and consequently you must say farewell to your Pyrrhonism. (VS I: 204)
In the next decade, reacting to the cogito argument in the Discours de la Méthode, Mersenne pointed out to Descartes how close his use of radical doubt was to that Augustinian argument (see Gouhier 1978).
4.2 Mitigated Skepticism and Probabilism
Richard Popkin has remarked that the great originality of La Vérité des sciences resides not so much in its arguments against the skeptics, as in the fact that this defense of “the truth of the sciences” concedes so much to the skeptical outlook. Most of the skeptical claims that are propounded either by the skeptic or by the Christian philosopher are not really refuted in the book. They are integrated in a novel view of what one should expect of scientific enquiry, its true aims and prospects (Popkin 1956, 2003).
Thus, the Christian philosopher has no qualm with the skeptical rebuttal of the alchemist’s claim to perfect knowledge in natural matters. He freely admits that we cannot know everything, and especially not the causes nor essences of physical things, that men’s capacity is limited by outward appearance and the surface of corporeal things. In the Questions inouïes, Mersenne went as far as to say that we cannot demonstrate the existence of the external world:
And we do not have any demonstration by which we are able to persuade the opinion of those who might maintain that the earth, the water, the stars, and all the bodies which we see are but appearances and “species intentionales”, supposing God might use these species or accidents to make all that we see appear to us. For one is not able to say that one knows a single thing as one should—according to the laws and the notions which Aristotle and other philosophers give of science—if one cannot demonstrate that it is impossible that the reason which one supplies, or the thing which one proposes, be not true. That is enough to persuade those who use reflection that there is nothing certain in physics and that there are so few certain things, that it is difficult to propound any… (QI XVIII: 53, translated in Mace 1970: 24–25)
Mersenne joins the skeptic in his condemnation of the Aristotelian’s far too optimistic view of science. What is denounced is not so much Aristotle’s physical doctrines or methods (the Christian philosopher, for example, does not endorse the skeptical attacks against syllogistic) but rather a mistaken representation of the epistemic aims of physics, which cannot aspire to perfect certainty. Bacon’s experimental method received no more favor in his eyes precisely on this account, as it serves a project that is no less dogmatic (see Buccolini 2013):
although one may anatomize, and dissolve bodies as much as one wishes, whether by fire, by water, or by the force of the mind, one will never arrive at the point of rendering our intellect equal to the nature of things. That is why I believe that Verulam design is impossible. (VS 212)
Mersenne did not think that our inability to understand the ultimate cause and intimate nature of things should be an object of lament. The mere knowledge of effects and appearances might be enough for human needs. For one thing, it has enough pragmatic virtue, as it can serve us as a guide in our actions. Besides, as outwards appearances, crust and superficies may be rigorously described, through measurement and mathematics, the sort of knowledge that can be gained here is as perfect and certain as one could wish—although not of the sort dogmatic physicians and metaphysicians are seeking.
Thus, according to Richard Popkin, Mersenne is not so much refuting skepticism as he is adopting an attenuated form of it. By openly discarding research on the causes and essences of phenomena, reducing the whole of physical science to mathematical knowledge of accidents, the study of external effects, and the establishment of the laws of appearances, he invents a “mitigated skepticism”, that Popkin considers as the first lucid expression of the modern scientific outlook, deemed to become dominant in the following centuries. This outlook conjugates an entire confidence in the virtues of physico-mathematical sciences, with a complete positivism (that is, a deliberate abstention) in regard metaphysical matters.
Recent reappraisals of Mersenne’s epistemological views tend to qualify Popkin’s characterizations. According to Garber (2004), Mersenne’s epistemological frame is old rather than new. The way he envisions the boundaries between disciplines remains Aristotelian, and in particular his conception of the “physico-mathematical” sciences directly comes from the Aristotelian definition of mixed or subaltern mathematics, sciences such as astronomy or optics, only dealing with accident and surface properties of physical things. Far from offering a scientific substitute to Aristotelian physics, these sciences allow one to approach nature in a mathematical way “without having to challenge the full complex of Aristotelianism directly” (2004: 157) in ways that would be perceived as subversive of true religion and social order.
Dear’s study (1988) similarly insists on the deliberately “un-revolutionary” character of Mersenne’s contribution to the “scientific revolution”. Mersenne never chose to range himself against Aristotelianism, never cast himself as an innovator. His agenda is formulated in a preexisting philosophical idiom (the “language of the schools”), and his ideas display a “borrowed coherence” rather than an intrinsic one. Mersenne was not a positivist avant la lettre; he admitted that God knows what man cannot verify, that natural kinds exist in nature, that things do have essential definitions. His “skeptical” approach to physics is not so much a watered-down Pyrrhonism intended to show the inconclusiveness of natural philosophical demonstration, as it is an instrument to recommend mathematical sciences as an anchor of certainty, where ordinary natural philosophy stays in doubt and can only be defended in a probabilistic way. When Mersenne confesses that many questions cannot he determined, he is not proposing to suspend judgment but rather to formulate a probable judgment by choosing the most persuasive opinions. This “probabilism” is, according to Dear, a legacy of humanist and Ciceronian dialectics, and it remained constantly present in Mersenne’s work, even though, on some questions the weight of probabilities has changed. This was particularly the case for the Copernican opinion. Judging it very unlikely in L’Usage de la raison and in the Quaestiones, Mersenne eventually recognized that it was the opinion best suited to the phenomena observed and therefore the most probable. However, God’s freedom being never constrained, Mersenne could accept with relative equanimity the final judgment of the Church. In his Questions théologiques, he was to publish a French translation of the inquisitorial condemnation and of Galileo’s abjuration.
4.3 Mechanism and Experimentalism
According to Lenoble (1943), Mersenne’s mature works, focusing almost exclusively on “physico-mathematical” sciences, witnesses the “birth of mechanism”. However, as the term is not an actor’s category of the 17th century, one should be careful in its use. Formulated in its own terms, Mersenne’s standpoint regarding explanations in physics is that we can only understand what we can do:
we only know the real reasons for things that we can create with our hand and our mind; … and of all the things made by God, we cannot create any, no matter how much subtlety and effort we apply. (NO: 8)
This indicates both the foundations and limits of mechanistic explanations: finding reasons means showing how things can he produced by mechanical actions—actions of the kind we are capable of when applying our bodies to external bodies. On the one hand, however, this mode of genetic explanation can provide only a very superficial clarification of created things, whose construction and complexity are either infinite, or go to details and minutiae that our senses are incapable of perceiving (OC: 89). On the other hand, these explanations cannot bear the character of necessity since they focus on objects that are fundamentally contingent and whose inner machinery could have been constituted differently, had God so wanted:
one knows all but nothing in physics, if one follows the definition of science Aristotle gave; for if it ought to be about eternal and immutable objects, and God can change everything that is in physics, one cannot make a science of it. (QT: 9)
The conjoined effects of Mersenne’s epistemological pessimism and metaphysical voluntarism make his version of “mechanism” very different from the Cartesian, Hobbesian or Gassendist one. He never conceived mechanical explanations as a new science of “causes”, based on the adoption of new principles and elements intended to take the place of Aristotelian substantial forms—such as Descartes’s subtle matter or Gassendi’s atoms. Mechanics, as all other mixed-mathematics, was simply concerned with establishing the laws of phenomena.
This reflection on nature and the limits of mechanistic science was accompanied by truly experimental activity. Mersenne was convinced that mathematical sciences of nature cannot settle for common and vague observation. It urgently required “well-controlled and well-performed experiments” (HU I: 167), facts that were artificially generated and precisely measured. Mersenne was aware that, even when rigorously performed, an experiment is not always enough to establish the law of phenomena: two series of experiments can diverge very little and yet express very different laws. Measurement can only be approximated, and this has a bearing on the certainty of mixed mathematics, which is partially compromised to the extent that it deals with physical objects. Reason must therefore, as far as possible, always accompany and discipline observation, without which one is vulnerable to considerable misunderstandings.
Mersenne made a considerable effort to do and redo experiments that his predecessors (most notably Galileo) had not always had the sense to present precisely. Thus, on the subject of the increase in speed during falling motion on an inclined plane, he conducted a precise campaign of measurements that enabled him to criticize Galileo’s numerical results, and eventually express doubts on the validity of the law itself (Palmerini 2010). As usual, he expressed his reservations concerning our capacity to determine with certainty the causes of gravity: “it is just as difficult to find the real cause as to demonstrate whether the earth is stable or mobile” (Traité des mouvements) and he placed back-to-back the reasons put forward by his contemporaries—positive and real quality, air pressure, magnetic attraction—which could only partially account for the phenomenon in its precise numerical dimensions. As Peter Dear has shown, Mersenne’s approach to the science of motion was inductive in nature, not centered, as it was in Galileo, on the abstract physical process, but rather on “a generalized description of cases, whose details and precise parameters held an importance altogether lacking in Galileo” (Dear 1994).
5. Music and Universal Harmony
Of all the mixed-mathematical disciplines in which Mersenne took an interest, music was undeniably the one to which he devoted the most effort and passion. His 1623 Quaestiones already included a long musicological digression on the therapeutic power attributed to the music of the Hebrews, and generally to the music of the Ancients, whose harmonics he dreamed of restoring. The idea was taken up and developed in the 1627 Traité de l’harmonie universelle, published under the transparent pseudonym of “Sieur de Sermes”. The science of intellectual music and the understanding of the proportions that govern nature, lost through negligence, must be restored and linked to the science of “sensual music”, which addresses our hearing but which, separated from the former, is no longer able to fulfill its true function: elevating the senses above material objects, rather than linking them together. Mersenne’s great work on musical theory, the eight books of Harmonie Universelle, was published from 1636 to 1637. It presents a great many editorial variants, as Mersenne never ceased to work on it, annotating his own copy. The important “Traité de la nature du son”, which constitutes the first part of the work, focuses on the study, undertaken in a mechanistic spirit, of acoustic quantities, their physical nature and their effects on physiology and passions. Mersenne, drawing on Isaac Beeckman, establishes experimentally the laws connecting the vibration, the length and tension of the strings, making an important contribution to acoustic science.
Epistemological, metaphysical and aesthetic aspects are intertwined in Mersenne’s musical agenda. Music was to Mersenne a mixed-mathematical science, just as astronomy, whose primary aim was to “save the phenomena” through more or less plausible hypotheses. The musical phenomena par excellence is “consonance”, that is the fact that certain sounds put together are agreeable to the ear. Recent musical practices, new instruments and polyphonic music had disclosed new modes of consonance that were previously unknown, and Mersenne saw his proper task in an effort to find the best physico-mathematical hypotheses that would be able to account for them, and could be used to invent more “perfect” musical pieces (chants). Seeking such hypotheses, Mersenne relentlessly asked his correspondents how they could account for the fact that certain sounds put together are agreeable and others not. For example, in November 1627, he asked a correspondent in Rome:
If the said Galileus be at Rome or if you should know some other excellent mathematician-musician, I pray you to find out from him why, of all the sounds put together, only those which form the octave, the fifth, the third, and the sixth and their replicas are agreeable to the ear, and which of all the dissonances is the most disagreeable one and why. I have been told that the said Galilei knows this reason. (MC I: 603, translated in Mace 1970: 8)
Mersenne’s own general hypothesis was that consonance was due to the coincidence of the vibrations of the air, which itself depended on certain exact ratios in the mechanical properties of the instrument, e.g., the length, tension and breadth of the strings). However, as consonance was judged by the ear rather than directly by reason, discrepancies were found. For example, experiments showed that the ear hears an octave when the tensions of the strings are in a ratio of 1 to 4.25, whereas the physico-mathematical, Pythagorean, hypothesis prescribed 1 to 4. So here one would have to find ways to correct, or “discipline” experience through reason, in a move that is quite typical of Mersenne’s epistemology (see Dear 1988).
In spite of those discrepancies, Mersenne was truly fascinated by the fact that the human mind, in its musical appreciation, is so to speak attuned to mathematical harmonies. The perception of consonance although mediated (and perhaps distorted) by our feeling, is not mere sensual pleasure, as Descartes, for example, seemed to think. Properly understood, it has a rational dimension, as it discloses to men the “universal harmony”, the underlying mathematical order that is present at every level of reality, and that connects them together. Mersenne could have found in Kepler’s Harmonices mundi the idea of such an archetypal harmony, ordering each level of reality, and innate to the human mind. He did not accept however Kepler’s rather dismissive view of music, which had led him to define harmonics in purely geometrical terms, stripped from whatever is sensorial and “acoustic” in it.
Contrary to what is sometimes held, the seeming adoption of an integral mechanism in the last musical works is no renunciation of the metaphysical consideration in harmonics. According to De Buzon (1994: 127, my translation), the causes and effects of consonance are indeed treated physically, but the pleasure taken to harmonics, “albeit an ordinary experience, is a phenomenon that is entirely theological”. Musical pleasure shows both our destination and our state in this world. It raises us to the contemplation of the divine unity, which is so to speak embodied in musical unison:
consonances depend on the unison as lines on the point, number on unity, and creatures on God. That is why the more they approach it the sweeter they become; because consonances have nothing sweet nor agreeable but that which they borrow from union of their sounds, which is the greater as it approaches unison. (HU II: Livre Premier des consonances, 15, translated in Mace 1970: 13)
But musical pleasure also reveals our imperfect and sensuous nature. Thus, for instance, although “unison” is the simplest and most divine harmony, we tend to prefer in this world other, less perfect consonances and even dissonance.
In considering the general interconnection of sciences, Mersenne granted music an almost architectonic function. All the sciences borrow something from each other. As manifested in the encyclopedic character of the Harmonie Universelle, music was for Mersenne as the connecting principle of the various disciplines, allowing for their exposition. A thorough investigation of musical properties requires forays into theology, moral philosophy (the passions of the soul), optics, arithmetic and geometry, and of course mechanics as sounds are motions of the air, that have to be accounted for in a mechanical way. Conversely, and at a deeper level, music may be seen as a total science, theoretically capable of representing the proportions that exist between all parts of the mechanical universe:
it is also easy to conclude that one can represent everything in the world and, consequently all the sciences, by means of Sound; for, since everything consists in weight, number and measure, and sounds represent these three properties, they can signify anything one wishes, excluding metaphysics. (HU 1: 43)
In particular music may teach men how, through motions, objects communicate their properties to the senses, which themselves are like instruments, more or less well attuned to the external motions of the sensible. Music would then become the general science of the properties of the sensible, a kind of general aesthesis uniting mixed mathematics in one universal science, whose acquisition would make our elevation to the consideration of the first cause easier (QT: 161).
Mersenne’s works and abbreviations
- 1623 [UR], L’Usage de la raison, Paris. Edited by Claudio Buccolini, Paris: Fayar, 1 volume, 2002.
- 1623, L’Analyse de la vie spirituelle, Paris, [lost].
- 1623 [QG], Quaestiones celeberrimae in Genesim, followed with Observationes et emendationes ad Francisci Georgii Veneti problemata, Paris. [available online]
- 1623 [OF], Observationes et emendationes ad Francisci Georgii Veneti Problemata : in hoc opere cabala evertitur, editio vulgata… Paris. [available online]
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Some passages in the biographical parts of this entry are borrowed from Hamou 2008.