Notes to John Stuart Mill

1. There is, however, an additional class of names which Mill claims are non-connotative. Besides singular and general, names also divide, Mill tells us, into concrete and abstract. Concrete names denote objects; abstract names denote attributes. “Old is a name of things; old age is a name of one of their attributes” (System, VII: 29). Many abstract names are themselves connotative. This is merely to say, of course, that the application of an attribute-term can itself be guided by whether that attribute has some further set of attributes. In contrast, there are some primitive abstract names which are not applied because they themselves connote anything further—“whiteness” is an abstract name denoting the phenomenal attribute of our white sensations, but is not applied on the grounds of that attribute possessing some further attributes which guide our application of the term (System, VII: 105–6).

2. Though see Mill’s claim that we have reason to trust our memory, which itself is primitive and cannot be grounded in induction (Examination, IX: 164–6n). If this is so, this may well represent an additional theoretical norm in Mill’s philosophy. The case is ambiguous, however, because often memory is treated by Mill as a species of observation and therefore as self-certifying (see, for instance, System, VIII: 642). Given Mill’s claim—discussed below in section 3.5—that “[a] great part of what seems observation is really inference”, the ambiguity is difficult to resolve. See Miller (2010: 17–8) for useful discussion of the status of memory in Mill’s work.

3. In this sense, Mill follows the Berkeley’s empiricist attempt to account for the truths of geometry without postulating the existence of purely geometric objects. See Brook (1973: 155–170) for useful discussion of Berkeley’s account, and objections to attempts that proceed along these lines.

4. See, however, Scarre (1989: 216–20) for an exploration of the possibility of a Kantian interpretation of Mill’s idealism. See Capaldi (2004: 86–132) for the argument that Mill did push further in the direction of post-Kantian Idealism than is traditionally thought—and Skorupski (2007) for the counterargument that he did not.

5. The debate on whether Mill’s emphasis is on acts or rules is ongoing—see Eggelston (2017) for useful discussion of the recent literature. Brink (2017) points out an important complication in Mill’s account of moral wrong: that instances of blame (and, presumably, attempts to inculcate appropriate blame responses) are themselves acts, subject to moral evaluation.

6. Mill’s account of the Art of Life is based on the general distinction he makes between science and art. The

ideas of science and art … differ from one another as the understanding differs from the will, or as the indicative mood in grammar differs from the imperative. The one deals in facts, the other in precepts. Science is a collection of truths; Art, a body of rules, or directions for conduct. The language of science is, This is, or, This is not; This does, or does not, happen. The language of art is, Do this; Avoid that. Science takes cognisance of a phenomenon, and endeavours to discover its law; art proposes to itself an end, and looks out for means to effect it. (Definition of Political Economy, IV: 312)

Science is marshalled in the attempt to realize the ends set by the various arts:

[t]he art proposes to itself an end to be attained, defines the end, and hands it over to the science. The science receives it, considers it as a phenomenon or effect to be studied, and having investigated its causes and conditions sends it back to art with a theorem of the combinations of circumstances by which it could be produced. (System, VIII: 944)

The distinction is elaborated throughout the System (VIII: 943–52), in which the Art of Life emerges as the most general art, providing the justification for the particular ends of all others arts and structuring their relation. See Macleod (2013).

7. As was noted above (§3.5), Mill holds that the study of history and human nature can reveal “laws of the succession of states of society” (System, VII: 915). Mill’s attempts to understand such laws of history were significantly influenced by the work of Tocqueville—though also by Auguste Comte and François Guizot. See Mueller (1956: 92–133) and Varouxakis (1999).

8. Mill’s view of the eighteenth-century as a fundamentally negative moment was in part influenced by Auguste Comte, though ideas such as this were, he notes, “the general property of Europe, or at least of Germany and France” (Autobiography, I: 173–5). See, for instance, Mill’s description of Hume, Voltaire, and, to some extent, Bentham, as “negative thinkers” (Bentham, X: 80). “To tear away, was indeed all that these philosophers, for the most part, aimed at” (Coleridge, X: 139). Such was the intellectual work necessary during the period—and “mankind have been deeply indebted to them” for performing it (Bentham, X: 79).

Copyright © 2016 by
Christopher Macleod <>

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