Notes to Moral Psychology: Empirical Approaches

1. For overviews of this literature see Tiberius (2015) and Alfano (2016). For useful collections of papers see Sinnott-Armstrong (2008a,b,c, 2014), Doris et al. (2010), Decety & Wheatley (2015), and Voyer & Tarantola (forthcoming).

2. For an overview of this work see the SEP entry on experimental moral philosophy. For some recent papers see Sarkissian & Wright 2014.

3. This scientific analogy is not unique to our exposition. Singer (1974: 517; cf. 493) understands Rawls’ (1971) method of reflective equilibrium as “leading us to think of our particular moral judgments as data against which moral theories are to be tested …” As Singer (1974: 493n3) notes, Rawls (1951) in an early paper made the analogy with scientific theory choice explicit. Though the claim that intuitions are used as evidence in philosophy is widely accepted (Pust 2000; Sosa 2007), it has recently been challenged, most notably by Cappelen (2012) and Deutsch (2015). For a useful overview of this debate, see Nado (2016).

4. For more on the appeal to the intuitions of philosophical “experts” see Deutsch (2015: 134–135), Stich & Tobia (2016: 14–17; 2018).

5. Authors such as Baron (1994) and Sunstein (2005) have argued that the distorting influences of “heuristics and biases” uncovered in the recent psychological literature on reasoning, judgment and decision making are widespread in everyday ethical reflection. For overviews of the relevant psychological literature see Nisbett & Ross (1980), Kahneman et al. (1982), Baron (2001), Gilovich et al. (2002), and Kahneman (2011).

6. Rosati (1995) raises analogous concerns with regard to highly idealized “full information accounts” of the good: the ideal, fully informed agent, is likely to be so psychologically different from the actual, very imperfectly informed, agent that there is little reason to think that the actual agent would be motivated by what motivates the ideal agent.

7. There is a wealth of terminological and doctrinal variation here. For example, Haji uses “authenticity” in the neighborhood where Kane uses “ultimacy”. Very often, these issues are couched in terms of “freedom” instead of (or together with) “responsibility”; indeed, as Kane (2002: 4–5) observes, the issues are frequently not sharply distinguished. Here, we focus entirely on responsibility attribution, and will be silent on the relation (or lack of a relation) between these issues and issues discussed under the heading of “freedom” or “free will”.

8. “Identification” is a troublesome notion, afflicted with more philosophical complexity than can feasibly be operationalized in empirical work. Woolfolk et al. attempted to depict behaviors that could plausibly be construed as manifesting identification, or its lack, without resolving the conceptual issues. For some discussion of the unresolved philosophical difficulties surrounding identification, see Velleman (1992), Bratman (1996), and Watson (1996).

9. The effect appears to be easily replicable. For example, the Woolfolk group (unpublished data) obtained consistent results in variations concerning the positively valenced behavior of kidney donation, and the negatively valenced behavior of an atrocity committed by a soldier under orders.

10. For surveys of the empirical literature, see Doris (2002), Miller (2013, 2014), and Ross and Nisbett (1991).

11. For character skepticism in philosophy, see Doris (1998, 2002, 2005, 2006, 2010, forthcoming) and Doris & Stich (2005). For related positions, see Alfano (2013), Harman (1999, 2000), Machery (2010), Merritt (2000, 2009; Meritt, Doris, & Harman 2010), and Vranas (2005). In psychology, see Mischel (1968) and Ross & Nisbett (1991); a variety of later perspectives are collected in Donnellan et al. (2009).

12. For responses to character skepticism, see Adams (2006), Annas (2005), Appiah (2008: 33–72), Arpaly (2005), Badhwar (2009), Besser-Jones (2008), Flanagan (2009: 54–6), Kamtekar (2004), Knobe & Leiter (2007), Kupperman (2001), Miller (2003), Montmarquet (2003), Prinz (2009); Russell (2009: 227–331), Samuels & Casebeer (2005), Sarkissian (2010), Solomon (2003, 2005), Snow (2010), Sreenivasan (2002), Swanton (2003: 30–1), Upton (2009), and Webber (2006a,b; 2007a,b).

13. For an extensive bibliography, see:

14. A note on terminology. In this essay we will use the terms “egoism” and “altruism” for descriptive views about the nature of human motivation. Other authors prefer to call these views “psychological egoism” and “psychological altruism” to distinguish them from “ethical egoism” and “ethical altruism”, which are prescriptive views about how people should behave.

15. Interpretation of historical texts is, of course, often less than straightforward. While there are passages in the works of each of these philosophers that can be interpreted as advocating psychological egoism, scholars might debate whether these passages reflect the author’s considered option.

16. For more on the history and philosophical implications of the debate, see Broad (1930), MacIntyre (1967), Nagel (1970), Batson (1991: Chs. 1–3), Sober & Wilson (1998: Ch. 9), and Dixon (2008).

17. For some substantive discussion of the question see Stich et al. (2010), Cialdini et al. (1997), and May (2011).

18. For a classic statement of this account of practical reasoning, see Goldman (1970).

19. Giving a more precise account would raise some of the deepest issues in the philosophy of biology (see, for example, Beatty 1992). Fortunately, for our purposes no more precise account is needed.

20. Though most arguments in this area try to show that evolutionary considerations make psychological altruism unlikely, Sober & Wilson (1998: Ch. 10) have offered an evolutionary argument in favor of psychological altruism. For a critique, see Stich (2007); for a response, see Schulz (2011).

21. For useful reviews of the literature see Batson (1991, 1998, 2011, 2012), Piliavin & Charng (1990), and Schroeder et al. (1995). Broadly speaking, this literature is cognitivist in its orientation. There is also some consideration given to the egoism vs. altruism debate in the behaviorist tradition. For an insightful discussion of the relevance of literature in that tradition to the philosophical debate, see Slote (1964).

22. For overviews of Batson’s research, see Batson (1991, 2015); for a systematic critique, see Stich et al. (2010).

23. As Batson (1991: 80) himself remarks, “[T]he old adage, ‘Out of sight, out of mind,’ reminds us that physical escape often permits psychological escape as well”.

24. These examples are suggested in Stich et al. (2010: 153).

25. As with other philosophical isms, the tidy moniker “moral realism”, covers a substantial diversity of opinion. Nevertheless, many moral realists would accept something in the neighborhood of Smith’s characterization of moral objectivity (see Railton 1986a,b; Sayre-McCord 1988a, 2015; Boyd 1988; Sturgeon 1988; Brink 1989; Enoch 2011; Cuneo 2014: Ch. 1).

26. Recently, some moral realists have denied that moral realism is committed to convergence. For example, Shafer-Landau (2003: 228; cf. Moody-Adams 1997: 109; Bloomfield 2001) argues “disagreement poses no threat to realism of any stripe, and so, a fortiori, poses no threat to moral realism in particular”. See Doris & Plakias (2008) for argument to the effect that realists cannot afford to be sanguine about disagreement.

27. See Williams (1985: 136): “In a scientific inquiry there should ideally be convergence on an answer, where the best explanation of the convergence involves the idea that the answer represents how things are; in the area of the ethical, at least at high level of generality, there is no such coherent hope”.

28. It is plausible to suppose that convergence does not require total unanimity. However, this plausible qualification raises hard questions: How much dissent can obtain in ideal conditions before “substantial disagreement” is a more apt characterization than “less-than-unanimous-convergence”? As is usual in philosophy, we can’t be very precise about the percentages, but we suspect that the relevant notion of convergence—always remembering that we are discussing ideal conditions—should be thought to allow only minimal dissent.

29. Brandt is not the only philosopher working in the Anglo-American “analytic” tradition to produce ethnography. Ladd (1957) reports field work with the Navaho; his conclusions (e.g., 1957: 328) about the difficulties posed by disagreement seem somewhat more sanguine than, though perhaps not radically at odds with, Brandt’s.

30. For remarks on situational meaning with affinities to what follows, see Snare (1980: 356–62). Thanks to Walter Sinnott-Armstrong for pointing us to Snare’s valuable discussion.

31. For a more detailed discussion of Moody Adams’ view, see Doris & Plakias (2008).

32. The last clause is important, since realists (e.g., Brink 1989: 200) sometimes argue that apparent moral disagreement may result from cultures applying similar moral values to different economic conditions (e.g., differences in attitudes towards the sick and elderly between poor and rich cultures). But this explanation seems of dubious relevance to the described differences between contemporary northerners and southerners, who are plausibly interpreted as applying different values to similar economic conditions.

33. The legal scholarship that Nisbett & Cohen (1996: 57–78) review makes it clear that southern legislatures are often willing to enact laws reflecting the culture of honor view regarding the circumstances under which violence is justified, which suggests there is at least some support among southerners for the idea that honor values should be universalizable.

34. In addition to the expedients we have considered, realists may plausibly appeal to, inter alia, requirements for internal coherence and the different “levels” of moral thought (theoretical v. popular, abstract v. concrete, general v. particular) at which moral disagreement may or may not be manifested. Brink (1989: 197–210) and Loeb (1998) offer valuable discussions with considerably more detail than we offer here, Brink manifesting realist sympathies and Loeb tending toward anti-realism.

35. We think Nisbett and Cohen will fare pretty well under such scrutiny. See Tetlock’s (1999) favorable review.

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John Doris <>
Stephen Stich <>
Jonathan Phillips <>
Lachlan Walmsley <>

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