Notes to The Epistemic Condition for Moral Responsibility

1. Although the philosophical orthodoxy is that the control and epistemic conditions are distinct (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 12–3), some philosophers claim that the latter is in fact a component of the former (Mele 2010; Levy 2011: ch. 5; Nelkin & Rickless 2017a). Other philosophers take the more radical line of denying the existence of a distinctive epistemic condition on moral responsibility (Björnsson 2017a; Graham 2017; Holly Smith 2017: 99–102).

2. Zimmerman (1997: 419–20; 2002b: 560–1) denies that the consequences of one’s actions—even those that are actually foreseen—add anything to the agent’s degree of blameworthiness, over and above the degree that accrues to her in virtue of deciding to perform a wrong action (see also Graham 2014). According to Zimmerman, the occurrence of foreseen consequences augments only the scope of the agent’s responsibility, i.e. she’s to blame for more things, but that doesn’t mean that she’s more blameworthy than she would be had those consequences never occurred. See Domsky 2004 (453, n.13) for criticism of the degree/scope distinction.

3. Levy (2014: 33) claims that awareness consists in the relevant information being personally available rather than dispositionally available, where personal availability occurs when the agent is able “to effortlessly and easily” retrieve information she holds dispositionally for its use in reasoning. Since some dispositional information can’t be retrieved effortlessly and easily, not all such information is personally available in Levy’s sense. It’s worth pointing out a significant change in Levy’s position concerning the EC. In Hard Luck (2011: chs. 5 & 6) Levy sides with Zimmerman and Rosen and defends the idea that occurrent and de dicto awareness of wrongdoing is necessary for blameworthiness. However, in Consciousness and Moral Responsibility (2014) he clearly denies the necessity of occurrent beliefs for blameworthiness (2014: 31) and, more importantly, he emphasizes that the content of the requisite awareness involves “consciousness of the facts that give our actions their moral significance” (2014: 14, italics added), which strongly suggests that what matters for responsibility in his revised view is de re, not de dicto, awareness.

4. Philosophers distinguish three main varieties of ignorance: mistaken, suspending, and deep ignorance (Guerrero 2007: 63; van Woudenberg 2009: 375; Peels 2014: 485; Wieland 2017b: 159). Mistaken ignorance occurs when the agent has a mistaken belief about a relevant aspect of her action or circumstances (as in John’s case, who mistakenly believes that the button is a light switch and so mistakenly believes that it’s permissible for him to press it). Suspending ignorance occurs when the agent wonders whether her action has a certain relevant feature which as a matter of fact it does have (e.g., that it might cause harm) but ends up suspending belief on the matter. Finally, deep ignorance occurs when the agent has never even considered whether her action has a relevant feature it in fact has (e.g., the ancient slaveholder who has never considered the possibility that slavery is wrong [Rosen 2003]). Both Guerrero (2007) and Peels (2014) argue that different kinds of ignorance have different exculpatory potentials. For instance, Guerrero claims that if a person wonders whether her action is wrong but fails to make up her mind—thus being in a state of suspending ignorance—and yet performs it, her ignorance, even if blameless, doesn’t provide an excuse if it turns out that the action is in fact wrong or if, for all the agent knew, this could have been the case (Guerrero 2007: 78). By contrast, if the person is mistakenly ignorant of the action’s wrongness and she isn’t blameworthy for her mistaken belief, her ignorance does provide an excuse (2007: 62).

5. It’s important to note that even though John’s ignorance is primarily factual in nature—since it’s rooted in a mistaken factual belief about the button’s function—it ramifies in normative ignorance as well, because, as a consequence of his mistaken factual belief, John is also ignorant of the normative consideration that he shouldn’t press the button or that it’s wrong to press the button. Thus, we can say that John’s normative ignorance is “impure”, given that it’s rooted in factual ignorance. By contrast, the next variant of the example discussed in the text is a case of “pure” normative ignorance, where the agent’s mistaken normative belief isn’t rooted in any factual error. See Wieland (2017b: 150) for the closely related distinction between pure and impure moral ignorance.

6. Levy (2011: ch. 6) pursues this eliminativist project about responsibility to its fullest, since he claims that not even akratic wrongdoers are blameworthy. This is because, on his view, it turns out either that akratic wrongdoers act from ignorance after all or that their actions are subject to responsibility-undermining luck.

7. Many philosophers note an important difference between, on the one hand, acting from or out of ignorance and, on the other, acting in ignorance or while ignorant (Zimmerman 1997: 424; Guerrero 2007: 62–3; Peels 2014: 479). The notion of acting from ignorance conveys the idea that “the ignorance played an important causal or explanatory role in the agent actually performing the act in question” (Guerrero 2007: 63), i.e., the agent performed the action because she was ignorant of relevant considerations, which entails that she wouldn’t have performed it had she known better. By contrast, acting in ignorance or while ignorant conveys the idea that, although the agent was unaware of relevant considerations at the time of action, she would have acted in exactly the same way had she not been unaware of them. The usual assumption is that only actions performed out of ignorance can (with the usual caveat about culpable ignorance) be excused (cf. Rosen 2008: 598n.14).

8. Björnsson (2017b: 154–5) claims that the ancient slaveholder is less blameworthy than a contemporary slaveholder because, given the former’s social context, it was harder for her to display the appropriate level of moral concern (see also Wieland 2017b: 153). So, on his view, evinced quality of will is not all that matters for blameworthiness; also relevant is how difficult it’s for the agent to display the appropriate level of concern. For a thorough discussion of different kinds of difficulty relevant for ascriptions of responsibility, also focused on the case of the ancient slaveholder, see Guerrero 2017.

9. Quite apart from the discussion centered on the regress argument, there is a whole subliterature devoted to the question whether ancient slaveholders and other morally ignorant wrongdoers whose moral ignorance can be explained by their cultural context are blameworthy or not. Three classic pieces on this topic are Wolf 1987, Calhoun 1989, and Moody-Adams 1994. The first two defend the view that such ignorance can be non-culpable and (with some caveats in Calhoun’s case) can exculpate, whereas the third defends the contrary view that moral ignorance is usually “affected” and therefore doesn’t exculpate. For critical discussions of these views, in particular of Moody-Adams’ affected ignorance thesis, see Isaacs 1997, Benson 2001, Levy 2003, Pleasants 2008, Peacock 2011, and Wieland 2017c. See also Fricker 2010 and Mason & Wilson 2017 for a pair of opposing views on the question whether widespread moral ignorance can be blameworthy.

10. FitzPatrick (2008 & 2017) can be classified as a capacitarian because a key element of his view is that culpability for ignorant wrongdoing is partially explained by the fact that the agent should and could have avoided or corrected her ignorance, given her capacities and the opportunities provided by her social context (see sect. 3.2). However, FitzPatrick’s position differs from other capacitarian views in three important ways. First, he accepts thesis i of the regress argument, i.e., that culpability for ignorant wrongdoing always derives from culpability for the underlying ignorance. Second, he claims that culpable ignorance (and thus culpability for ignorant wrongdoing) is ultimately grounded on epistemically vicious conduct. Third, unlike other capacitarians, he thinks that in “forgetting cases” of unwitting wrongdoing (such as the one discussed immediately in the text) agents aren’t blameworthy (FitzPatrick 2017: 38–9).

11. Capacitarians aren’t interested only in forgetting cases; rather, they attempt to explain blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing generally, and the latter can be prompted by a wide array of cognitive failures besides episodes of forgetfulness, such as: failures to notice relevant features of one’s situation, such as a stop sign (Clarke 2017a) or one’s audience discomfort regarding the anecdote one is telling (Sher 2009: 27); failures to foresee the risk of harm one’s action poses to others, as when a bricklayer throws down some materials into the street without even looking (Clarke 2014: 160) or a driver imprudently merges into a busy highway (Sher 2009: 26); failures to keep one’s attention focused on the task at hand, as when a ferry pilot indulges in daydreaming and fails to steer the ferry clear of some rocks (Sher 2009: 26); failures to realize the morally bad implications of one’s behavior, as when a teacher grants too many opportunities to earn extra credit only to students who ask for it (Sher 2009: 28); or even failures to remain awake, as when a soldier on duty falls asleep leaving the compound unguarded (Sher 2009: 26). As Sher (idem) observes, some of these cases—especially those involving failures to foresee the risk of harm—overlap with the moral and legal category of negligence, which means that what philosophers and legal theorists have to say about negligence is directly relevant here. See for example Hart (1961 [2008]), Zimmerman (1986), Sverdlik (1993), Finkelstein (2005), Alexander & Ferzan (2009: ch. 3), King (2009), Raz (2011), Husak (2011), Moore & Hurd (2011), and Clarke (2014: ch. 7). Finally, it’s important to point out that even if some cases of unwitting wrongdoing are partially explicable in terms of character defects (Sher 2009: 90–1; Moore & Hurd 2011: 164–5), they usually have something important in common with forgetting cases, namely that the agents’ culpability can’t be traced back to a knowing failure to discharge some duty, in this case related to improving one’s character (Sher 2009: 38–9; see also Vargas 2005).

12. Murray’s (2017) notion of ‘norms of vigilance’ can be understood as carving up a middle ground between norms of awareness and duties of inquiry, since in his view norms of vigilance issue obligations that make demands “on how much effort one ought to devote to paying attention” (2017: 514). Paying attention is an activity, not merely a state of mind, and yet it isn’t an information-gathering activity of the sort demanded by duties of inquiry.

13. Sher (2009: 142–3) briefly explains how the origination relation can be satisfied in the case of praiseworthy actions performed in ignorance of their rightness. Relying on Arpaly’s (2003: 75–7) analysis of the case of Huckleberry Finn, Sher claims that an agent satisfies the EC for right actions if, despite her unawareness of the action’s rightness, she has made “enough cognitive contact” with the action’s right-making features so as to be able to act on their basis.

14. Clarke’s (2014; 2017a, b) account of blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing has a lot in common with Sher’s. Unlike Sher, however, Clarke thinks that the fact that an agent should and could have known better (thus satisfying the EC), together with the fact that she was able to perform the right action (thus satisfying the freedom or control condition), suffices for explaining direct blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing (Clarke 2014: 167; 2017a: 244; see also Murray 2017: 524). Thus, Clarke dispenses with Sher’s origination requirement (Clarke 2017b: 75). However, this more minimal capacitarian account of blameworthiness for unwitting wrongdoing hasn’t escaped criticism. Talbert (2017a: 58–9) insists that moral blame isn’t appropriate unless the offending agent exhibits ill will; the mere fact that she should and could have known (and done) better isn’t sufficient. He concedes that “while feelings of disappointment and frustration might be appropriate” regarding wrongs unwittingly brought about by agents lacking ill will, “resentment would not be” (2017a: 59). Similarly, Zimmerman (2017: 86–7) objects to the idea of grounding moral culpability “in a non-moral aberration” such as the cognitive failure to recall some relevant consideration, claiming that “[i]f the aberration is not a moral one, then it does not reflect some morally objectionable aspect of [the agent’s] quality of will.” (Clarke briefly addresses the quality-of-will objection to his account in his 2017a: 246 and 2017b: 76–7.) In turn, Levy (2017: 255) takes issue with Clarke’s rendering of both the EC and the freedom condition. Concerning the EC, Levy denies that it’s reasonable to expect unwitting wrongdoers to recall or notice relevant considerations, because the cognitive capacities involved aren’t under their control and so whether they in fact recall or notice involves “a chance occurrence” that can’t ground reasonable expectations. Concerning the freedom condition, Levy claims that since unwitting wrongdoers can’t do the right thing by way of a reasoning procedure (as opposed to a chance occurrence), they aren’t free in omitting to do it (Clarke responds to the latter point in his 2017a: 249–50). Relatedly, Nelkin and Rickless (2015; 2017a: 127–8) observe that in cases of unwitting omissions merely being able (in a general as opposed to a specific sense of ability) to perform the right action doesn’t amount to a robust enough form of control of the sort that could justify blame, for it isn’t clear in what sense “it remains up to me” (Clarke 2014: 115) to do what I unwittingly failed to.

15. In his account of culpability for negligence, Joseph Raz (2011) suggests that what grounds blameworthiness in cases of unwitting wrongdoing is both the fact that we are non-derivatively responsible for conduct that results from “the functioning, successful or failed, of our powers of rational agency” (2011: 268) and also our interest in acknowledging responsibility in these cases, for in doing the latter “we affirm our mastery of these abilities, deny that we are disabled in the relevant regards” (idem). While the first part of Raz’s account resembles the accounts of Sher and Clarke, the second part adds something new. Building on Raz’s suggestion, Murray and Vargas 2018 (Other Internet Resources) argue that responsibility for unwitting omissions can be partially explained by appealing to “the value of self-control.” Roughly, they claim that our various self-conceptions require that we exhibit a certain degree of competence regarding their characteristic activities. When we make mistakes (including unwitting ones) in these domains, a threat to our involved self-conception arises, and a way of defusing this threat is precisely to accept responsibility for disappointing the relevant expectations. By doing so, the agent signals to herself and others that she’s competent and reliable after all, and thus reaffirms her willingness to be assessed in light of the pertinent norms. It remains an interesting open question whether this forward-looking interest agents have in acknowledging responsibility for unwitting wrongdoing provides the needed morally plausibly desert basis for backward-looking blame.

Copyright © 2022 by
Fernando Rudy-Hiller <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free