Supplement to Moral Sentimentalism

Anti-Rationalist Arguments

Modern sentimentalism first arose at the turn of the 18th century in opposition to rationalist and intuitionist views developed by Thomas Hobbes and Bernard de Mandeville, and Cambridge Platonists such as Ralph Cudworth and Samuel Clarke, respectively. From the first criticisms onwards, sentimentalists emphasized the limits of reason and understanding when it comes to explaining or justifying moral judgments, determining moral truth, and motivating moral action. Contemporary sentimentalists make similar arguments.


The first sentimentalist to make a sustained case against rationalism and intuitionism was Frances Hutcheson. His first target were views that held that what makes some actions right is that they are commanded by some superior who has a power to sanction us so as to make it advantageous for us to obey the laws, and that we approve of actions because they are in our self-interest, either by their very nature or because of the laws of the superior (1725: 86– 87). On this kind of view, practical reason can tell us what’s right or wrong, since it can figure out what’s in our self-interest, which Hutcheson understood in hedonic terms. Hutcheson pointed out four problems with such views. We don’t morally approve of inanimate objects that are sources of pleasure; we don’t equally morally approve of two people who provide us with what’s in our self-interest, if one of them does so out of selfish motives and the other out of sheer benevolence; we don’t morally approve of traitors, whose actions may be very beneficial to us; and finally, we do morally approve of distant or historical benevolent characters, whose actions could in no way serve our self-interest (1725: 89–94). He also observes that the strength of moral approval tracks the benevolent motives of an action, not the good to us (or anyone) that they actually produce – someone with little ability to do good can be highly praiseworthy.

There is a different, theoretical rather than prudential conception of reason, according to which it is “our power of finding out true propositions” (1728: 137). It is the target especially in Illustrations Upon the Moral Sense. Hutcheson distinguishes between “exciting reasons”, qualities that move us to act, and “justifying reasons”, which are considerations that explain why we approve of something (1728: 138). It is important to bear in mind that this distinction does not correspond to the contemporary distinction between motivating reasons (often conceived of as mental states moving us to act) and justifying or normative reasons, considerations that favour acting in some way. When Hutcheson asks about justifying reasons, he asks about what, as a matter of fact, makes us think some action is right or good.

Reason cannot be the source of exciting reasons, since it can only tell us which actions lead to which end. Only subordinate ends can be called reasonable or unreasonable on the basis of whether they are conducive to an ultimate end, but the ultimate ends themselves are beyond reason. Indeed, Hutcheson anticipates rational choice theory, and says that an agent acts “reasonably” when she chooses the action that is most likely to produce the best balance of preference-satisfaction (1728: 143). It is the passions, whether selfish or benevolent, that set these ends. Some may think that the recognition that one action would produce more good than the alternative will by itself provide motivation for a rational agent to choose it, but Hutcheson rejects this. Benevolent desires are needed, as

[w]ithout such Affections this Truth, “that an hundred Felicities is a greater Sum than one Felicity,” will no more excite to study the Happiness of the Hundred, than this Truth, “an hundred Stones are greater than one,” will excite a Man, who has no desire of Heaps, to cast them together. (1728: 142)

Nor will reason by itself explain moral approval. It can tell us that a certain action is fit to achieve an end, but the very worst actions can be reasonable in this sense. Final ends do not either conform or fail to conform to any truths discoverable by reason. Consequently, the source of justifying reasons must lie elsewhere. For Hutcheson, it is moral sense that leads us to approve of benevolent actions (see Section 2.1 of the main entry).


Hume’s more familiar arguments about the limits of reason are clearly inspired by Hutcheson. They can usefully be divided into motivation sceptical and content sceptical arguments (Korsgaard 1986).

Motivational scepticism

According to the Anti-Rationalist Practicality Argument, our moral evaluations influence our actions and reactions to the actions of others, while reason lacks such power. Hume offers several variants of this argument. Here is one:

Since morals … have an influence on the actions and affections, it follows, that they cannot be derived from reason; and that because reason alone … can never have any such influence. (T 457)

Here is one natural reading of this influential argument in contemporary terms:

The Anti-Rationalist Practicality Argument

  1. Moral judgments are intrinsically motivating. (Moral Judgment Internalism)
  2. Reason(ing) alone does not motivate. (Inertia of Reason Thesis)
  3. So, moral judgments cannot be conclusions of reason. (Anti-Rationalism)

The first premise says that moral judgments themselves move us to act. It is now standardly taken as an a priori claim, but for the arch-empiricist Hume, it is probably just an a posteriori observation. He says that “common experience” informs us that

men are often governed by their duties, and are deterred from some actions by the opinion of injustice, and impelled to others by that of obligation. (T 457)

(Note that Hume’s characterization of ‘morals’ sometimes suggests it is moral facts that motivate, and sometimes that it is moral opinions that do.)

For the crucial Inertia of Reason premise, Hume offers two supporting arguments. Reason, for Hume, is the faculty of reasoning or inferring. The Anti-Representationalist Argument says that passions don’t represent how things are, so they can’t be true or stand in logical relations, which means reasoning gets no grip on them (T 458) (see also Section 5.1 of the main entry). The Elimination Argument says that reasoning consists in demonstrating necessary relations between ideas, as in logic or mathematics, or in inferring probable causal relations on the basis of experience. But neither discovering relations between ideas nor discovering that an action would probably produce a certain outcome will by itself move us to act, unless we want the end to be produced. Nor will instrumental reasoning necessarily move us. If we do wish to bring something about, we will probably acquire a desire to take what causal reasoning reveals as a necessary means, but if we don’t, that is not a failure of reason.

Many commentators consequently argue that Hume doesn’t really have a conception of practical reasoning at all. The Elimination Argument has also been accused of being straightforwardly question-begging: after all, Kantian rationalists say that there is a third type of reasoning, namely (non-instrumental) practical reasoning, that does motivate. However, the burden is on the rationalist to come up with an account that displays why their favoured kind of motivating process deserves to be called reasoning, and not something else, and that it delivers determinate conclusions about ends (see below).

How should the conclusion of the Practicality Argument be understood? Some have taken it to establish that moral judgments are not beliefs. But Hume always talks about the inertia of reason, not of belief. As long as there are beliefs that result from something other than reasoning, they might be motivating, and he explicitly says that hedonic beliefs are (T 119–120). But this relation between beliefs and motivation is causal, not rational, so reasoning alone does not motivate. However, this still leaves the conclusion puzzling. Hume has argued that moral judgment (a psychological state) motivates, while reasoning (a psychological process) doesn’t. It doesn’t follow that reasoning alone couldn’t produce a moral judgment, which then (non-rationally) motivates. Hume needs a further, undefended assumption to the effect that non-motivating processes cannot produce motivating states. Perhaps, as Rachel Cohon (2008) has recently argued, he only aims to establish that moral discrimination and reasoning are distinct processes, the former being sentiment-driven and inherently motivating.

Content scepticism

Even if reason could move us to act, it doesn’t follow that it can, as such, either tell us or determine what the right thing to do is. That is a further question. Content sceptics about practical reason believe that reason by itself cannot offer guidance to action, or inform us of what intuitionists call the fitness of an attitude or response. Hume’s argument for content scepticism proceeds by elimination:

  1. “As the operations of human understanding divide themselves into two kinds, the comparing of ideas, and the inferring of matter of fact; were virtue discovered by the understanding; it must be an object of one of these operations, nor is there any third operation of the understanding, which can discover it.” (T 463)
  2. “[So,] [i]f the thought and understanding were alone capable of fixing the boundaries of right and wrong, the character of virtuous and vicious either must lie in some relations of objects, or must be a matter of fact, which is discovered by our reasoning.” (T 463) (from 1)
  3. Virtue does not consist in an a priori discoverable relation between ideas.
  4. Virtue does not consist in a matter of fact that can be inferred.
  5. So, we cannot discover what is right or wrong by reasoning. (from 2, 3, 4)

The most natural reading of the conclusion of Hume’s content sceptical argument is an epistemological one: we cannot discover what is right and wrong by reason. Premises 3 and 4 are conclusions of supplemental metaphysical arguments aiming to show that facts about right and wrong don’t consist in facts that could be discovered by reason, as Hume understands it. In support of Premise 3, he presents a number of cases in which animals, plants, or inanimate objects stand in the same relation to each other as virtuous or vicious people and those affected by their action do, while nevertheless lacking both virtue and vice. This, Hume believes, shows that it’s not merely the fact that people stand in a certain relation to each other that makes an action right or wrong.

It is in the course of Premise 4 that Hume makes some of his best-known claims about reason. He grants that reasoning, presumably together with perception, can discover matters of fact about actions or people’s characters. But virtue and vice are not among these facts:

Take any action allowed to be vicious: Wilful murder, for instance. Examine it in all lights, and see if you can find that matter of fact, or real existence, which you call vice. In which-ever way you take it, you find only certain passions, motives, volitions and thoughts. There is no other matter of fact in the case. The vice entirely escapes you, as long as you consider the object. (T 468)

It is not that Hume denies that motives and thoughts of the agent and the pain and suffering of the victim make an action wrong or agent vicious. But these facts are not identical with wrongness or viciousness. The latter, if it is a fact, is a different kind of fact. It is, at least originally, sentiment that discerns it – although Hume’s arguments leave it open that discovering by reason the tendency of something to give rise to sentiment could be a source of moral knowledge (Sturgeon 2001).

Hume makes his famous complaint about writers who move from is-claims to ought-claims in the context of discussing Premise 4. The problem, he claims, is that “this ought, or ought not, expresses some new relation or affirmation”, which is “entirely different” from other relations and therefore not inferable from them (T 469). Unfortunately, Hume does not clarify what makes the ought-relation different. The best interpretations are probably that it is normative in a different way, or that it, when appreciated, motivates anyone to avoid the vicious action, unlike the wrong-making facts themselves.

How might rationalists respond? Much as in the case of the Practicality Argument, it is open to the rationalist to deny Premise 1, and make the case that there are operations of reason that are not reducible to deduction or induction. Perhaps these other ways of reasoning can discover the new kind of relation or affirmation that vice or virtue consists in. Perhaps rightness or wrongness even consists in being unconditionally reason-giving for any rational being, as Kantians would say. Classical sentimentalists, writing before Kant, did not address this type of argument.

Contemporary Anti-Rationalism

As noted above, it is a common complaint against Hume that he works with an unduly narrow conception of practical reason. Those who take this line agree that theoretical or instrumental reason is incapable of telling us or determining the moral truth, or motivating us. But there is more to reason than that. In particular, Kantians believe that pure practical reason can rule out immoral maxims (subjective principles for acting), and can determine the will accordingly. Only then our will is autonomous (self-legislating), since otherwise it must be determined by something outside it, an inclination that we simply find ourselves with.

Contemporary anti-rationalist arguments thus take the form of showing that practical reason as conceived of by Kant and Kantians will not yield the right answers, nor suffice for motivation. The Kantian picture is roughly as follows. Intentional actions proceed from maxims that specify an act and the end or purpose for which it is done. A maxim might be “I will open the door in order to let the air in”. Some maxims are such that not everyone could consistently adopt them. Kantians distinguish two kinds of tests for practical consistency: the contradiction in conception test and the contradiction in the will test.

The Kantian claim, then, is that an action is morally wrong if and only if its maxim cannot be universalized without practical contradiction. This biconditional is an open invitation to provide counterexamples: actions that are not wrong even though their maxims aren’t universalizable, and actions that are wrong, though their maxims are universalizable. If either sort can be found, pure practical reason isn’t a reliable guide in moral thought, and content scepticism is reaffirmed in the face of the Kantian conception of reason. For the first kind of counterexample, suppose (contrary to fact, as it turns out) that credit card companies only make a profit from interest and late fees. Simon Blackburn (1998) considers the following maxim: I will pay my credit card bills at the end of every month in order to avoid paying interest and late fees. There seems to be nothing wrong with such a maxim or resulting action. Yet if everyone acted on it, credit card companies would go out of business (on our assumption), with the result that it would be impossible for anyone to pay their credit card bills.

For the second kind, Jesse Prinz suggests that

If everyone were to kick children whenever they saw children on the street, the practice of child-kicking would not be rendered incoherent. (Prinz 2007: 131)

Prinz doesn’t formulate the maxim behind the action, but the example can be filled in – the maxim might be “I will kick a child whenever I see one in order to relieve my frustration”. There’s no obvious contradiction in willing that everyone kicks a child in order to relieve their frustration.

Sentimentalists think it is no accident that reason is impotent in this respect. Blackburn emphasizes the need to “distinguish defects of input from ones of processing and hence output” (1998: 240). Reason has to do with the former, not the latter:

Reason gives us our representation of the salient features of the situation we are in, and it gives us the ability to make further deductions and inferences about that situation. Reason’s office is to represent the world to us as it is. But then, how we react to that situation, and that includes how we react to it ethically, is another matter. (Blackburn 1998: 240)

On Blackburn’s view, while we may call a knave who lies and deceives when he can get away with it vicious or odious, “it does not add anything except rhetoric also to call him irrational” (Blackburn 1998: 223). A similar point is also made by Bernard Williams. According to Williams (1979), what people have (normative) reason to do is determined by what conclusions could be reached by procedurally sound practical deliberation from their actual set of motives. There are only such internal practical reasons, since putative external reasons could not rationally engage the agent’s motivation and therefore contribute to the right kind of explanation of action. For Williams, it is thus contingent on what people’s actual goals are whether they have reason to comply with morality’s demands. If so, moral rationalism is false. (See the entry on reasons for action: internal vs. external for a detailed discussion.)

Some contemporary sentimentalists also reaffirm motivational scepticism in the face of Kantian accounts. It is a familiar complaint that being irrational, especially in the Kantian sense, need not be something that terribly bothers an agent. As Prinz puts it,

[T]he knave might say, ‘I recognize that it is inconsistent to value myself while treating others poorly, but I simply don’t mind being inconsistent in this respect. After all, by favoring myself I have so much to gain!’ (Prinz 2007: 134)

Part of his point is that avowed inconsistency in one respect need not mean that reason gets no grip at all on a person: immorality doesn’t render one baffling and uninterpretable in the way that openly contradictory factual beliefs or plans might. In a similar vein, Max Hayward denies that putative rational requirements of consistency and even adopting means to our ends derive from reason, but rather “gain whatever authority they have from the role they play in permitting and facilitating interpersonal relationships” (Hayward 2019: 52) – according to him, if I flout such norms, others won’t be able to sympathize with me.

Copyright © 2021 by
Antti Kauppinen <>

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